Infinitary Logic

First published Sun Jan 23, 2000; substantive revision Wed Sep 6, 2023

Traditionally, expressions in formal systems have been regarded as signifying finite inscriptions which are—at least in principle—capable of actually being written out in primitive notation. However, the fact that (first-order) formulas may be identified with natural numbers (via “Gödel numbering”) and hence with finite sets makes it no longer necessary to regard formulas as inscriptions, and suggests the possibility of fashioning “languages” some of whose formulas would be naturally identified as infinite sets. A “language” of this kind is called an infinitary language: in this article I discuss those infinitary languages which can be obtained in a straightforward manner from first-order languages by allowing conjunctions, disjunctions and, possibly, quantifier sequences, to be of infinite length. In the course of the discussion it will be seen that, while the expressive power of such languages far exceeds that of their finitary (first-order) counterparts, very few of them possess the “attractive” features (e.g., compactness and completeness) of the latter. Accordingly, the infinitary languages that do in fact possess these features merit special attention.

In §1 the basic syntax and semantics of infinitary languages are laid down; their expressive power is then displayed by means of examples. §2 is devoted to those infinitary languages which permit only finite quantifier sequences: these languages turn out to be relatively well-behaved. §3 is devoted to a discussion of the compactness problem for infinitary languages and its connection with purely set-theoretical questions concerning “large” cardinal numbers. In §4 an argument is sketched which shows that most “infinite quantifier” languages have a second-order nature and are, ipso facto, highly incomplete. §5 provides a brief account of a certain special class of sublanguages of infinitary languages for which a satisfactory generalization of the compactness theorem can be proved. This section includes a subsection on the definition of admissible sets. Historical and bibliographical remarks are provided in §6.

1. Definition and Basic Properties of Infinitary Languages

Given a pair κ, λ of infinite cardinals such that λ ≤ κ, we define a class of infinitary languages in each of which we may form conjunctions and disjunctions of sets of formulas of cardinality < κ, and quantifications over sequences of variables of length < λ.

Let L — the (finitary) base language — be an arbitrary but fixed first-order language with any number of extralogical symbols. The infinitary language L(κ,λ) has the following basic symbols:

  • All symbols of L
  • A set Var of individual variables, where the cardinality of Var (written: |Var|) is κ
  • A logical operator (infinitary conjunction)

The class of preformulas of L(κ,λ) is defined recursively as follows:

  • Each formula of L is a preformula;
  • if φ and ψ are preformulas, so are φ∧ψ and ¬φ;
  • if Φ is a set of preformulas such that |Φ| < κ, then Φ is a preformula;
  • if φ is a preformula and XVar is such that |X| < λ, then ∃Xφ is a preformula;
  • all preformulas are defined by the above clauses.

If Φ is a set of preformulas indexed by a set I, say Φ = {φi : iI}, then we agree to write Φ for:

iI φ

or, if I is the set of natural numbers, we write Φ for:

φ0 ∧ φ1 ∧ …

If X is a set of individual variables indexed by an ordinal α, say X = {xξ : ξ < α}, we agree to write (∃xξ)ξ<αφ for ∃Xφ.

The logical operators ∨, →, ↔ are defined in the customary manner. We also introduce the operators (infinitary disjunction) and ∀ (universal quantification) by

Φ =df ¬{ ¬φ : φ ∈ Φ}

∀Xφ =df ¬∃X¬φ,

and employ similar conventions as for , ∃ .

Thus L(κ,λ) is the infinitary language obtained from L by permitting conjunctions and disjunctions of length < κ and quantifications[1] of length < λ. Languages L(κ,ω) are called finite-quantifier languages, the rest infinite-quantifier languages. Observe that L(ω,ω) is just L itself.

Notice the following anomaly which can arise in an infinitary language but not in a finitary one. In the language L1,ω), which allows countably infinite conjunctions but only finite quantifications, there are preformulas with so many free variables that they cannot be “closed” into sentences of L1,ω) by prefixing quantifiers. Such is the case, for example, for the L1,ω)-preformula

x0 < x1  ∧  x1 < x2  ∧  …  ∧  xn < xn+1 …,

where L contains the binary relation symbol <. For this reason we make the following

Definition. A formula of L(κ,λ) is a preformula which contains < λ free variables. The set of all formulas of L(κ,λ) will be denoted by Form(L(κ,λ)) or simply Form(κ,λ) and the set of all sentences by Sent(L(κ,λ)) or simply Sent(κ,λ).

In this connection, observe that, in general, nothing would be gained by considering “languages” L(κ,λ) with λ > κ. For example, in the “language” L(ω,ω1), formulas will have only finitely many free variables, while there will be a host of “useless” quantifiers able to bind infinitely many free variables.[2]

Having defined the syntax of L(κ,λ), we next sketch its semantics. Since the extralogical symbols of L(κ,λ) are just those of L, and it is these symbols which determine the form of the structures in which a given first-order language is to be interpreted, it is natural to define an L(κ,λ)-structure to be simply an L-structure. The notion of a formula of L(κ,λ) being satisfied in an L-structure A (by a sequence of elements from the domain of A) is defined in the same inductive manner as for formulas of L except that we must add two extra clauses corresponding to the clauses for Φ and ∃Xφ in the definition of preformula. In these two cases we naturally define:

Φ is satisfied in A (by a given sequence)  ⇔  for all φ ∈ Φ, φ is satisfied in A (by the sequence);

Xφ is satisfied in A  ⇔  there is a sequence of elements from the domain of A in bijective correspondence with X which satisfies φ in A.

These informal definitions need to be tightened up in a rigorous development, but their meaning should be clear to the reader. Now the usual notions of truth, validity, satisfiability, and model for formulas and sentences of L(κ,λ) become available. In particular, if A is an L-structure and σ ∈ Sent(κ,λ), we shall write A ⊨ σ for A is a model of σ, and ⊨ σ for σ is valid, that is, for all A, A ⊨ σ. If Δ ⊆ Sent(κ,λ), we shall write Δ ⊨ σ for σ is a logical consequence of Δ, that is, each model of Δ is a model of σ.

We now give some examples intended to display the expressive power of the infinitary languages L(κ,λ) with κ ≥ ω1. In each case it is well-known that the notion in question cannot be expressed in any first-order language.

Characterization of the standard model of arithmetic in L1,ω). Here the standard model of arithmetic is the structure N = ⟨N, +, ·, s, 0⟩, where N is the set of natural numbers, +, ·, and 0 have their usual meanings, and s is the successor operation. Let L be the first-order language appropriate for N. Then the class of L-structures isomorphic to N coincides with the class of models of the conjunction of the following L1,ω) sentences (where 0 is a name of 0):

m∈ω n∈ω sm0 + sn0 = sm+n0

m∈ω n∈ω sm0 · sn0 = sm·n0

m∈ω n∈ω−{m} sm0sn0

xm∈ω x = sm0

The terms snx are defined recursively by

s0x = x
sn+1x = s(snx)

Characterization of the class of all finite sets in L1,ω). Here the base language has no extralogical symbols. The class of all finite sets then coincides with the class of models of the L1,ω)-sentence

n∈ωv0 … ∃vnx(x = v0 ∨ … ∨ x = vn).

Truth definition in L1,ω) for a countable base language L. Let L be a countable first-order language (for example, the language of arithmetic or set theory) which contains a name n for each natural number n, and let σ0, σ1, … be an enumeration of its sentences. Then the L1,ω)-formula

Tr(x)  =df  n∈ω (x = n ∧ σn)

is a truth predicate for L inasmuch as the sentence

Tr(n) ↔ σn

is valid for each n.

Characterization of well-orderings in L11). The base language L here includes a binary predicate symbol ≤. Let σ1 be the usual L-sentence characterizing linear orderings. Then the class of L-structures in which the interpretation of ≤ is a well-ordering coincides with the class of models of the L11) sentence σ = σ1 ∧ σ2, where

σ2 =df (∀vn)n∈ωx [n∈ω (x = vn) ∧ n∈ω (xvn)].

Notice that the sentence σ2 contains an infinite quantifier: it expresses the essentially second-order assertion that every countable subset has a least member. It can in fact be shown that the presence of this infinite quantifier is essential: the class of well-ordered structures cannot be characterized in any finite-quantifier language. This example indicates that infinite-quantifier languages such as L11) behave rather like second-order languages; we shall see that they share the latters' defects (incompleteness) as well as some of their advantages (strong expressive power).

Many extensions of first-order languages can be translated into infinitary languages. For example, consider the generalized quantifier language L(Q0) obtained from L by adding a new quantifier symbol Q0 and interpreting Q0xφ(x) as there exist infinitely many x such that φ(x). It is easily seen that the sentence Q0xφ(x) has the same models as the L1,ω)-sentence

¬n∈ωv0…∃vn x[φ(x) → (x = v0 ∨ … ∨ x = vn)].

Thus L(Q0) is, in a natural sense, translatable into L1,ω). Another language translatable into L1,ω) in this sense is the weak second-order language obtained by adding a countable set of monadic predicate variables to L which are then interpreted as ranging over all finite sets of individuals.

Languages with arbitrarily long conjunctions, disjunctions and (possibly) quantifications may also be introduced. For a fixed infinite cardinal λ, the language L(∞,λ) is defined by specifying its class of formulas, Form(∞,λ), to be the union, over all κ ≥ λ, of the sets Form(κ,λ). Thus L(∞,λ) allows arbitrarily long conjunctions and disjunctions, in the sense that if Φ is an arbitrary subset of Form(∞,λ), then both Φ and Φ are members of Form(∞,λ). But L(∞,λ) admits only quantifications of length < λ: all its formulas have < λ free variables. The language L(∞,∞) is defined in turn by specifying its class of formulas, Form(∞,∞), to be the union, over all infinite cardinals λ, of the classes Form(∞,λ). So L(∞,∞) allows arbitrarily long quantifications in addition to arbitrarily long conjunctions and disjunctions. Note that Form(∞,λ) and Form(∞,∞) are proper classes in the sense of Gödel-Bernays set theory. Satisfaction of formulas of L(∞,λ) and L(∞,∞) in a structure may be defined by an obvious extension of the corresponding notion for L(κ,λ).

2. Finite-Quantifier Languages

We have remarked that infinite-quantifier languages such as L11) resemble second-order languages inasmuch as they allow quantification over infinite sets of individuals. The fact that this is not permitted in finite-quantifier languages suggests that these may be in certain respects closer to their first-order counterparts than might be evident at first sight. We shall see that this is indeed the case, notably in the case of L1,ω).

The language L1,ω) occupies a special place among infinitary languages because—like first-order languages—it admits an effective deductive apparatus. In fact, let us add to the usual first-order axioms and rules of inference the new axiom scheme

Φ → φ

for any countable set Φ ⊆ Form1,ω) and any φ ∈ Φ, together with the new rule of inference

φ0, φ1, …, φn, …
n∈ω φn

and allow deductions to be of countable length. Writing ⊢* for deducibility in this sense, we then have the

L1,ω)-Completeness Theorem. For any σ ∈ Sent1,ω), ⊨ σ  ⇔  ⊢*σ

As an immediate corollary we infer that this deductive apparatus is adequate for deductions from countable sets of premises in L1,ω). That is, with the obvious extension of notation, we have, for any countable set Δ ⊆ Sent1,ω)

(2.1) Δ ⊨ σ  ⇔  Δ⊢*σ

This completeness theorem can be proved by modifying the usual Henkin completeness proof for first-order logic, or by employing Boolean-algebraic methods. Similar arguments, applied to suitable further augmentations of the axioms and rules of inference, yield analogous completeness theorems for many other finite-quantifier languages.

If just deductions of countable length are admitted, then no deductive apparatus for L1,ω) can be set up which is adequate for deductions from arbitrary sets of premises, that is, for which (2.1) would hold for every set Δ ⊆ Sent1,ω), regardless of cardinality. This follows from the simple observation that there is a first-order language L and an uncountable set Γ of L1,ω)-sentences such that Γ has no model but every countable subset of Γ does. To see this, let L be the language of arithmetic augmented by ω1 new constant symbols {cξ : ξ < ω1} and let Γ be the set of L1,ω)-sentences {σ} ∪ {cξcη : ξ ≠ η}, where σ is the L1,ω)-sentence characterizing the standard model of arithmetic. This example also shows that the compactness theorem fails for L1,ω) and so also for any L(κ,λ) with κ ≥ ω1.

Another result which holds in the first-order case but fails for L(κ,ω) with κ ≥ ω1 (and also for L11), although this is more difficult to prove) is the prenex normal form theorem. A sentence is prenex if all its quantifiers appear at the front; we give an example of an L1,ω)-sentence which is not equivalent to a conjunction of prenex sentences. Let L be the first-order language without extralogical symbols and let σ be the L1,ω)-sentence which characterizes the class of finite sets. Suppose that σ were equivalent to a conjunction

iI σi

of prenex L1,ω)-sentences σi. Then each σi is of the form

Q1x1Qnxn φi(x1,…, xn),

where each Qk is ∀ or ∃ and φi is a (possibly infinitary) conjunction or disjunction of formulas of the form xk = xl or xkxl. Since each σi is a sentence, there are only finitely many variables in each φi, and it is easy to see that each φi is then equivalent to a first-order formula. Accordingly each σi may be taken to be a first-order sentence. Since σ is assumed to be equivalent to the conjunction of the σi, it follows that σ and the set Δ = {σi : iI} have the same models. But obviously σ, and hence also Δ, have models of all finite cardinalities; the compactness theorem for sets of first-order sentences now implies that Δ, and hence also σ, has an infinite model, contradicting the definition of σ.

Turning to the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, we find that the downward version has adequate generalizations to L1,ω) (and, indeed, to all infinitary languages). In fact, one can show in much the same way as for sets of first-order sentences that if Δ ⊆ Sent1,ω) has an infinite model of cardinality ≥ |Δ|, it has a model of cardinality the larger of ℵ0, |Δ|. In particular, any L1,ω)-sentence with an infinite model has a countable model.

On the other hand, the upward Löwenheim-Skolem theorem in its usual form fails for all infinitary languages. For example, the L1,ω)-sentence characterizing the standard model of arithmetic has a model of cardinality ℵ0 but no models of any other cardinality. However, all is not lost here, as we shall see.

We define the Hanf number h(L) of a language L to be the least cardinal κ such that, if an L-sentence has a model of cardinality κ, it has models of arbitrarily large cardinality. The existence of h(L) is readily established. For each L-sentence σ not possessing models of arbitrarily large cardinality let κ(σ) be the least cardinal κ such that σ does not have a model of cardinality κ. If λ is the supremum of all the κ(σ), then, if a sentence of L has a model of cardinality λ, it has models of arbitrarily large cardinality.

Define the cardinals μ(α) recursively by

μ(0) = 0
μ(α+1) = 2μ(α)
μ(λ) = α<λ μ(α), for limit λ.

Then it can be shown that

h(L1,ω)) = μ(ω1),

similar results holding for other finite-quantifier languages. The values of the Hanf numbers of infinite-quantifier languages such as L11) are sensitive to the presence or otherwise of large cardinals, but must in any case greatly exceed that of L1,ω).

A result for L which generalizes to L1,ω) but to no other infinitary language is the

Craig Interpolation Theorem: If σ,τ ∈ Sent1,ω) are such that ⊨ σ → τ, then there is θ ∈ Sent1,ω) such that ⊨ σ → θ and ⊨ θ → τ, and each extralogical symbol occurring in θ occurs in both σ and τ.

The proof is a reasonably straightforward extension of the first-order case.

Finally, we mention one further result which generalizes nicely to L1,ω) but to no other infinitary language. It is well known that, if A is any finite L-structure with only finitely many relations, there is an L-sentence σ characterizing A up to isomorphism. For L1,ω) we have the following generalization known as

Scott's Isomorphism Theorem. If A is a countable L-structure with only countably many relations, then there is an L1,ω)-sentence whose class of countable models coincides with the class of L-structures isomorphic with A.

The restriction to countable structures is essential because countability cannot in general be expressed by an L1,ω)-sentence.

The language L(∞,ω) may also be counted as a finite-quantifier language. The concept of equivalence of structures with respect to this language is of especial significance: we call two (similar) structures A and B (∞,ω)-equivalent, written A∞ω B, if the same sentences of L(∞,ω) hold in both A and B. This relation can, first of all, be characterized in terms of the notion of partial isomorphism. A partial isomorphism between A and B is a nonempty family P of maps such that:

  • For each pP, dom(p) is a substructure of A, ran(p) is a substructure of B, and p is an isomorphism of its domain onto its range; and
  • If pP, aA, bB, then there exist r, sP both extending p such that a ∈ dom(r), b ∈ ran(s) (“back and forth” property).

If a partial isomorphism exists between A and B, we say that A and B are partially isomorphic and write A p B. We then have

Karp's Partial Isomorphism Theorem.
For any similar structures A, B, A∞ω BA p B.

There is also a version of Scott's isomorphism theorem for L(∞,ω), namely,

(2.2) Given any structure A, there is an L(∞,ω)-sentence σ such that, for all structures B, A p BB ⊨ σ.

Partial isomorphism and (∞,ω)-equivalence are related to the notion of Boolean isomorphism. To define this we need to introduce the idea of a Boolean-valued model of set theory. Given a complete Boolean algebra B, the universe V(B) of B-valued sets, also known as the B-extension of the universe V of sets, is obtained by first defining, recursively on α,

Vα(B) = {x: x is a function ∧ range(x) ⊆ B ∧ ∃ξ<α[domain(x) ⊆ Vξ(B)]}

and then setting

V(B) = {x: ∃α(xVα(B))}.

Members of V(B) are called B-valued sets. It is now easily seen that a B-valued set is precisely a B-valued function with domain a set of B-valued sets. Now let L be the first-order language of set theory and let L(B) be the language obtained by adding to L a name for each element of V(B) (we shall use the same symbol for the element and its name). One can now construct a mapping [·](B) of the (sentences of the) language L(B) into B: for each sentence σ of L(B), the element [σ](B) of B is the “Boolean truth value” of σ in V(B). This mapping [·](B) is defined so as to send all the theorems of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory to the top element 1 of B, i.e., to “truth”; accordingly, V(B) may be thought of as a Boolean-valued model of set theory. In general, if [σ](B) = 1, we say that σ is valid in V(B), and write V(B) ⊨ σ.

Now each xV has a canonical representative x in V(B), satisfying

x = y iff V(B)x = y
xy iff V(B)xy

We say that two similar structures A, B are Boolean isomorphic, written A b B, if, for some complete Boolean algebra B, we have V(B)A B, that is, if there is a Boolean extension of the universe of sets in which the canonical representatives of A and B are isomorphic with Boolean value 1. It can then be shown that:

(2.3) A∞ω BA b B.

This result can be strengthened through category-theoretic formulation. For this we require the concept of a(n) (elementary) topos. To introduce this concept, we start with the familiary category of Set of sets and mappings. Set has the following key properties:

  1. There is a “terminal” object 1 such that, for any object X, there is a unique map X → 1 (for 1 we may take any one-element set, in particular, {0}).
  2. Any pair of objects X,Y has a Cartesian product X × Y.
  3. for any pair of objects one can form the “exponential” object YX of all maps from XY.
  4. There is a “truth-value” object Ω such that for each object X there is a natural correspondence between subobjects (subsets) of X and maps X → Ω. (For Ω we may take the set 2 = {0,1}; maps X → Ω are then characteristic functions on X.)

All four of these conditions can be formulated in category-theoretic language — a category satisfying them is called a topos. The category Set is a topos; so also are (i) the category Set(B) of Boolean-valued sets and mappings in any Boolean extension V(B) of the universe of sets; (ii) the category of sheaves of sets on a topological space; (iii) the category of all diagrams of maps of sets

X0X1X2 → …

The objects of each of these categories may be regarded as sets which are varying in some manner: in case (i) over a Boolean algebra; in case (ii) over a topological space; in case (iii) over (discrete) time. A topos may be conceived, then, as a universe of “variable” sets. The familiar category Set is the special limiting case of a topos in which the “variation” of the objects has been reduced to zero.

Just as in set theory, “logical operators” can be defined on the truth-value object in any topos. These are maps ¬: Ω → Ω; ∧, ∨, ⇒: Ω × Ω → Ω corresponding to the logical operations of negation, conjunction, disjunction and implication. With these operations, Ω becomes a Heyting algebra, thus embodying in general the laws not of classical but of intutionistic logic. In this sense intuitionistic logic is “internalized” in a topos: intuitionistic logic is the logic of variable sets. (Of course, classical logic is internalized in certain toposes, for instance Set and Set(B) for any complete Boolean algebra B.)

Any topos may be conceived as possible “universe of discourse” in which mathematical assertions may be interpreted and mathematical constructions may be performed. Mathematical assertions are rendered interpretable in a topos E by expression within E's internal language — a type-theoretic version of the usual language of set theory. In a manner analogous to Boolean-valued validity, one can introduce an appropriate notion of validity in E of a sentence σ of its internal language. Again, we write E ⊨ σ for “σ is valid in E”.

A topos E is said to be full if, for any set I, the I-fold copower[3]I1 of its terminal object exists in E. ∐I1 may be thought of as the canonical representative in E of the set I; accordingly, we write it simply as I. (In V(B) this coincides with I as previously defined.) All the toposes mentioned above are full.

Now let E be a full topos. If A = (A, R, …) is a structure, write A for (A, R, …). Two structures A and B are said to be topos isomorphic, written A t B, if, for some topos E defined over the category of sets, we have EA B. In other words two structures are topos isomorphic if their canonical representatives are isomorphic in the internal language of some topos. It can then be shown that

(2.4) A∞ω BA t B.

Accordingly (∞,ω)-equivalence may be regarded as isomorphism in the extremely general context of universes of “variable” sets. In this respect (∞,ω)-equivalence is an “invariant” notion of isomorphism.

3. The Compactness Property

As we have seen, the compactness theorem in its usual form fails for all infinitary languages. Nevertheless, it is of some interest to determine whether infinitary languages satisfy some suitably modified version of the theorem. This so-called compactness problem turns out to have a natural connection with purely set-theoretic questions involving “large” cardinal numbers.

We construct the following definition. Let κ be an infinite cardinal. A language L is said to be κ-compact (resp. weakly κ-compact) if whenever Δ is a set of L-sentences (resp. a set of L-sentences of cardinality ≤ κ) and each subset of Δ of cardinality < κ has a model, so does Δ. Notice that the usual compactness theorem for L is precisely the assertion that L is ω-compact. One reason for according significance to the κ-compactness property is the following. Call L κ-complete (resp. weakly κ-complete) if there is a deductive system P for L with deductions of length < κ such that, if Δ is a P-consistent[4] set of L-sentences (resp. such that |Δ| ≤ κ), then Δ has a model. Observe that such a P will be adequate for deductions from arbitrary sets of premises (of cardinality ≤ κ) in the sense of §2. It is easily seen that if L is κ-complete or weakly κ-complete, then L is κ-compact or weakly κ-compact. Thus, if we can show that a given language is not (weakly) κ-compact, then there can be no deductive system for it with deductions of length < κ adequate for deductions from arbitrary sets of premises (of cardinality ≤ κ).

It turns out, in fact, that most languages L(κ,λ) fail to be even weakly κ-compact, and, for those that are, κ must be an exceedingly large cardinal. We shall need some definitions.

An infinite cardinal κ is said to be weakly inaccessible if

(a) λ < κ → λ+ < κ, (where λ+ denotes the cardinal successor of λ), and

(b) | I | < κ and λi < κ (for all iI) ⇒ ∑iI λi < κ.

If in addition

(c) λ < κ ⇒ 2λ < κ,

then κ is said to be (strongly)inaccessible. Since ℵ0 is inaccessible, it is normal practice to confine attention to those inaccessible, or weakly inaccessible, cardinals that exceed ℵ0. Accordingly, inaccessible or weakly inaccessible cardinals will always be taken to be uncountable. It is clear that such cardinals—if they exist—must be extremely large; and indeed the Gödel incompleteness theorem implies that the existence of even weakly inaccessible cardinals cannot be proved from the usual axioms of set theory.

Let us call a cardinal κ compact (resp. weakly compact) if the language L(κ,κ) is κ-compact (resp. weakly κ-compact). Then we have the following results:

(3.1) ℵ0 is compact. This is, of course, just a succinct way of expressing the compactness theorem for first-order languages.

(3.2) κ is weakly compactL(κ,ω) is weakly κ-compact ⇒ κ is weakly inaccessible. Accordingly, it is consistent (with the usual axioms of set theory) to assume that no language L(κ,ω) with κ ≥ ω1 is weakly κ-compact, or, a fortiori, weakly κ-complete.

(3.3) Suppose κ is inaccessible. Then κ is weakly compact  ⇔  L(κ,ω) is weakly κ-compact. Also, Also κ is weakly compact ⇒ there is a set of κ inaccessibles before κ. Thus a weakly compact inaccessible cardinal is exceedingly large; in particular it cannot be the first, second, …, nth, … inaccessible.

(3.4) κ is compact ⇒ κ is inaccessible. (But, by the result immediately above, the converse fails.)

Let Constr stand for Gödel's axiom of constructibility; recall that Constr is consistent with the usual axioms of set theory.

(3.5) If Constr holds, then there are no compact cardinals.

(3.6) Assume Constr and let κ be inaccessible. Then κ is weakly compactL1,ω) is weakly κ-compact for all L.

(3.7) If Constr holds, then there are no cardinals κ for which L1,ω) is compact. Accordingly, it is consistent with the usual axioms of set theory to suppose that there is no cardinal κ such that all languages L1,ω) are κ-complete. This result is to be contrasted with the fact that all first-order languages are ω-complete.

The import of these results is that the compactness theorem fails very badly for most languages L(κ,λ) with κ ≥ ω1.

Some historical remarks are in order here. In the 1930s mathematicians investigated various versions of the so-called measure problem for sets, a problem which arose in connection with the theory of Lebesgue measure on the continuum. In particular, the following very simple notion of measure was formulated. If X is a set, a (countably additive two-valued nontrivial) measure on X is a map μ on the power set PX to the set {0, 1} satisfying:

(a) μ(X) = 1,

(b) μ({x}) = μ(∅) = 0 for all xX, and

(c) if A is any countable family of mutually disjoint subsets of X, then μ(∪A) = ∑{μ(Y) : YA}.

Obviously, whether a given set supports such a measure depends only on its cardinality, so it is natural to define a cardinal κ to be measurable if all sets of cardinality κ support a measure of this sort. It was quickly realized that a measurable cardinal must be inaccessible, but the falsity of the converse was not established until the 1960s when Tarski showed that measurable cardinals are weakly compact and his student Hanf showed that the first, second, etc. inaccessibles are not weakly compact (cf. (3.3)). Although the conclusion that measurable cardinals must be monstrously large is now normally proved without making the detour through weak compactness and infinitary languages, the fact remains that these ideas were used to establish the result in the first instance.

4. Incompleteness of Infinite-Quantifier Languages

Probably the most important result about first-order languages is the Gödel completeness theorem which of course says that the set of all valid formulas of any first-order language L can be generated from a simple set of axioms by means of a few straightforward rules of inference. A major consequence of this theorem is that, if the formulas of L are coded as natural numbers in some constructive way, then the set of (codes of) valid sentences is recursively enumerable. Thus, the completeness of a first-order language implies that the set of its valid sentences is definable in a particularly simple way. It would accordingly seem reasonable, given an arbitrary language L, to turn this implication around and suggest that, if the set of valid L-sentences is not definable in some simple fashion, then no meaningful completeness result can be established for L, or, as we shall say, that L is incomplete. In this section we are going to employ this suggestion in sketching a proof that “most” infinite quantifier languages are incomplete in this sense.

Let us first introduce the formal notion of definability as follows. If L is a language, A an L-structure, and X a subset of the domain A of A, we say that X is definable in A by a formula φ(x, y1,…,yn) of L if there is a sequence a1,…,an of elements of A such that X is the subset of all elements xA for which φ(x, a1,…,an) holds in A.

Now write Val(L) for the set of all the valid L-sentences, i.e., those that hold in every L-structure. In order to assign a meaning to the statement “Val(L) is definable”, we have to specify

  1. a structure C(L)—the coding structure for L;
  2. a particular one-one map—the coding map—of the set of formulas of L into the domain of C(L).

Then, if we identify Val(L) with its image in C(L) under the coding map, we shall interpret the statement “Val(L) is definable” as the statement “Val(L), regarded as a subset of the domain of C(L), is definable in C(L) by a formula of L.”

For example, when L is the first-order language L of arithmetic, Gödel originally used as coding structure the standard model of arithmetic ℕ and as coding map the well-known function obtained from the prime factorization theorem for natural numbers. The recursive enumerability of Val(L) then means simply that the set of codes (“Gödel numbers”) of members of Val(L) is definable in ℕ by an L-formula of the form ∃yφ(x, y), where φ(x, y) is a recursive formula.

Another, equivalent, coding structure for the first-order language of arithmetic is the structure[5]H(ω), ∈ ⨡ H(ω)⟩ of hereditarily finite sets, where a set x is hereditarily finite if x, its members, its members of members, etc., are all finite. This coding structure takes account of the fact that first-order formulas are naturally regarded as finite sets.

Turning now to the case in which L is an infinitary language L(κ,λ), what would be a suitable coding structure in this case? We remarked at the beginning that infinitary languages were suggested by the possibility of thinking of formulas as set-theoretical objects, so let us try to obtain our coding structure by thinking about what kind of set-theoretical objects we should take infinitary formulas to be. Given the fact that, for each φ∈Form(κ,λ), φ and its subformulas, subsubformulas, etc., are all of length < κ,[6] a moment's reflection reveals that formulas of L(κ,λ) “correspond” to sets x hereditarily of cardinality < κ in the sense that x, its members, its members of members, etc., are all of cardinality < κ. The collection of all such sets is written H(κ). H(ω) is the collection of hereditarily finite sets introduced above, and H1) that of all hereditarily countable sets.

For simplicity let us suppose that the only extralogical symbol of the base language L is the binary predicate symbol (the discussion is easily extended to the case in which L contains additional extralogical symbols). Guided by the remarks above, as coding structure for L(κ,λ) we take the structure,

H(κ) =dfH(κ), ∈ ⨡ H(κ)⟩.

Now we can define the coding map of Form(κ,λ) into H(κ). First, to each basic symbol s of L(κ,λ) we assign a code object sH(κ) as follows. Let {vξ: ξ < κ} be an enumeration of the individual variables of L(κ,λ).

Symbol Code Object Notation
¬ 1 ¬
= 6 =
vξ ⟨0,ξ⟩ vξ

Then, to each φ ∈ Form(κ,λ) we assign the code object φ recursively as follows:

vξ = vη  =df  ⟨vξ, =, vη⟩,

vξ vη  =df  ⟨vξ, , vη⟩;

for φ, ψ ∈ Form(κ,λ),

φ ∧ ψ  =df  ⟨φ, , ψ

¬φ  =df  ⟨¬, φ

Xφ  =df  ⟨, {x: xX}, φ⟩;

and finally if Φ ⊆ Form(κ,λ) with |Φ| < κ,

Φ  =df  ⟨, {φ: φ ∈ Φ}⟩.

The map φ ↦ φ from Form(κ,λ) into H(κ) is easily seen to be one-one and is the required coding map. Accordingly, we agree to identify Val(L(κ,λ)) with its image in H(κ) under this coding map.

When is Val(L(κ,λ)) a definable subset of H(κ)? In order to answer this question we require the following definitions.

An L-formula is called a Δ0-formula if it is equivalent to a formula in which all quantifiers are of the form ∀xy or ∃xy (i.e., ∀x(xy → …) or ∃x(xy ∧ …)). An L-formula is a Σ1-formula if it is equivalent to one which can be built up from atomic formulas and their negations using only the logical operators ∧, ∨, ∀xy, ∃x. A subset X of a set A is said to be Δ0 (resp. Σ1) on A if it is definable in the structure ⟨A, ∈ ⨡ A⟩ by a Δ0- (resp. Σ1-) formula of L.

For example, if we identify the set of natural numbers with the set H(ω) of hereditarily finite sets in the usual way, then for each XH(ω) we have:

X is Δ0 on H(ω) ⇔ X is recursive

X is Σ1 on H(ω) ⇔ X is recursively enumerable.

Thus the notions of Δ0- and Σ1-set may be regarded as generalizations of the notions of recursive and recursively enumerable set, respectively.

The completeness theorem for L implies that Val(L) — regarded as a subset of H(ω) — is recursively enumerable, and hence Σ1 on H(ω). Similarly, the completeness theorem for L1,ω) (see §2) implies that Val(L1,ω)) — regarded as a subset of H1) — is Σ1 on H1). However, this pleasant state of affairs collapses completely as soon as L11) is reached. For one can prove

Scott's Undefinability Theorem for L11). Val(L11)) is not definable in H1) even by an L11)-formula; hence a fortiori Val(L11)) is not Σ1 on H1).

This theorem is proved in much the same way as the well-known result that the set of (codes of) valid sentences of the second-order language of arithemetic L2 is not second-order definable in its coding structure ℕ. To get this latter result, one first observes that ℕ is characterized by a single L2-sentence, and then shows that, if the result were false, then “truth in ℕ” for L2-sentences would be definable by an L2-formula, thereby violating Tarski's theorem on the undefinability of truth.

Accordingly, to prove Scott's undefinability theorem along the above lines, one needs to establish:

(4.1) Characterizability of the coding structure H1) in L11): there is an L11)-sentence τ0 such that, for all L-structures A, A ⊨ τ0  ⇔  A H1).

(4.2) Undefinability of truth for L11)-sentences in the coding structure: there is no L11)-formula φ(v0) such that, for all L1, ω1)-sentences σ, H1) ⊨ σ↔φ(σ).

(4.3) There is a term t(v0, v1) of L11) such that, for each pair of sentences σ, τ of L11), H1)  ⊨  [t(σ,τ) = σ → τ].

(4.1) is proved by analyzing the set-theoretic definition of H1) and showing that it can be “internally” formulated in L11). (4.2) is established in much the same way as Tarski's theorem on the undefinability of truth for first- or second-order languages. (4.3) is obtained by formalizing the definition of the coding map σ ↦ σ in L11).

Armed with these facts, we can obtain Scott's undefinability theorem in the following way. Suppose it were false; then there would be an L11)-formula θ(v0) such that, for all L11)-sentences σ,

(4.4) H1) ⊨ θ(σ)  iff   σ ∈ Val(L11)).

Let τ0 be the sentence given in (4.1). Then we have, for all L11)-sentences σ,

H1) ⊨ σ   iff   (τ0 → σ) ∈ Val(L11)),

so that, by (4.4),

H1) ⊨ σ   iff   H1) ⊨ θ(τ0 → σ).

If t is the term given in (4.3), it would follow that

H1) ⊨ σ↔θ(t(τ0, σ)).

Now write φ(v0) for the L11)-formula θ(t(τ0, σ)). Then

H1) ⊨ σ↔φ(σ),

contradicting (4.2), and completing the proof.

Thus Val(L11)) is not definable even by an L11)-formula, so a fortiori L11) is incomplete. Similar arguments show that Scott's undefinability theorem continues to hold when ω1 is replaced by any successor cardinal κ+; accordingly the languages L++) are all incomplete.[7]

5. Sublanguages of L1,ω) and the Barwise Compactness Theorem

Given what we now know about infinitary languages, it would seem that L1,ω) is the only one to be reasonably well behaved. On the other hand, the failure of the compactness theorem to generalize to L1,ω) in any useful fashion is a severe drawback as far as applications are concerned. Let us attempt to analyze this failure in more detail.

Recall from §4 that we may code the formulas of a first-order language L as hereditarily finite sets, i.e., as members of H(ω). In that case each finite set of (codes of) L-sentences is also a member of H(ω), and it follows that the compactness theorem for L can be stated in the form:

(5.1) If Δ ⊆ Sent(L) is such that each subset Δ0 ⊆ Δ, Δ0H(ω) has a model, so does Δ.

Now it is well-known that (5.1) is an immediate consequence of the generalized completeness theorem for L, which, stated in a form similar to that of (5.1), becomes the assertion:

(5.2) If Δ ⊆ Sent(L) and σ ∈ Sent(L) satisfy Δ ⊨ σ, then there is a deduction D of σ from Δ such that DH(ω).[8]

In §2 we remarked that the compactness theorem for L1,ω) fails very strongly; in fact, we constructed a set Γ ⊆ Sent1,ω) such that

(5.3) Each countable subset of Γ has a model but Γ does not.

Recall also that we introduced the notion of deduction in L1,ω); since such deductions are of countable length it quickly follows from (5.3) that

(5.4) There is a sentence[9]σ ∈ Sent1,ω) such that Γ ⊨ σ, but there is no deduction of σ in L1,ω) from Γ.

Now the formulas of L1, ω) can be coded as members of H1), and it is clear that H1) is closed under the formation of countable subsets and sequences. Accordingly (5.3) and (5.4) may be written:

(5.3 bis) Each Γ0 ⊆ Γ such that Γ0H1) has a model, but Γ does not;

(5.4 bis) There is a sentence σ ∈ Sent1,ω) such that Γ ⊨ σ, but there is no deduction DH1) of σ from Γ.

It follows that (5.1) and (5.2) fail when “L” is replaced by “L1,ω)” and “H(ω)” by “H1)”. Moreover, it can be shown that the set Γ ⊆ Sent1,ω) in (5.3 bis) and (5.4 bis) may be taken to be Σ1 on H1). Thus the compactness and generalized completeness theorems fail even for Σ1-sets of L1, ω)-sentences.

We see from (5.4 bis) that the reason why the generalized completeness theorem fails for Σ1-sets in L1,ω) is that, roughly speaking, H1) is not “closed” under the formation of deductions from Σ1-sets of sentences in H1). So in order to remedy this it would seem natural to replace H1) by sets A which are, in some sense, closed under the formation of such deductions, and then to consider just those formulas whose codes are in A.

We now give a sketch of how this can be done.

First, we identify the symbols and formulas of L1,ω) with their codes in H1), as in §4. For each countable transitive[10] set A, let

LA = Form(L1,ω)) ∩ A.

We say that LA is a sublanguage of L1,ω) if the following conditions are satisfied:

  1. LLA
  2. if φ, ψ ∈ LA, then φ ∧ ψ ∈ LA and ¬φ ∈ LA
  3. if φ ∈ LA and xA, then ∃xφ ∈ LA
  4. if φ(x) ∈ LA and yA, then φ(y) ∈ LA
  5. if φ ∈ LA, every subformula of φ is in LA
  6. if Φ ⊆ LA and Φ ∈ A, then Φ ∈ LA.

The notion of deduction in LA is defined in the customary way; if Δ is a set of sentences of LA and φ ∈ LA, then a deduction of φ from Δ in LA is a deduction of φ from Δ in L1, ω) every formula of which is in LA. We say that φ is deducible from Δ in LA if there is a deduction D of φ from Δ in LA; under these conditions we write Δ ⊢A φ. In general, D will not be a member of A; in order to ensure that such a deduction can be found in A it will be necessary to impose further conditions on A.

Let A be a countable transitive set such that LA is a sublanguage of L1, ω) and let Δ be a set of sentences of LA. We say that A (or, by abuse of terminology, LA) is Δ-closed if, for any formula φ of LA such that Δ ⊢A φ, there is a deduction D of φ from Δ such that DA. It can be shown that the only countable language which is Δ-closed for arbitrary Δ is the first-order language L, i.e., when A = H(ω). However J. Barwise discovered that there are countable sets AH1) whose corresponding languages LA differ from L and yet are Δ-closed for all Σ1-sets of sentences Δ. Such sets A are called admissible sets; roughly speaking, they are extensions of the hereditarily finite sets in which recursion theory—and hence proof theory—are still possible (for the full definition, see Section 5.1 below).

From Barwise's result one obtains immediately the

Barwise Compactness Theorem. Let A be a countable admissible set and let Δ be a set of sentences of LA which is Σ1 on A. If each Δ′ ⊆ Δ such that Δ′ ∈ A has a model, then so does Δ.

The presence of “Σ1” here indicates that this theorem is a generalization of the compactness theorem for recursively enumerable sets of sentences.

Another version of the Barwise compactness theorem, useful for constructing models of set theory, is the following. Let ZFC be the usual set of axioms for Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, including the axiom of choice. Then we have:

5.5 Theorem. Let A be a countable transitive set such that A = ⟨A, ∈ ⨡ Ais a model of ZFC. If Δ is a set of sentences of LA which is definable in A by a formula of the language of set theory and if each Δ′ ⊆ Δ such that Δ′ ∈ A has a model, so does Δ.

To conclude, we give a simple application of this theorem. Let A = ⟨A, ∈ ⨡ A⟩ be a model of ZFC. A model B = ⟨B, E⟩ of ZFC is said to be a proper end-extension of A if (i) AB, (ii) AB, (iii) aA, bB, bEabA. Thus a proper end-extension of a model of ZFC is a proper extension in which no “new” element comes “before” any “old” element. As our application of 5.5 we prove

5.6 Theorem. Each countable transitive model of ZFC has a proper end-extension.

Proof. Let A = ⟨A, ∈ ⨡ A⟩ be a transitive model of ZFC and let L be the first-order language of set theory augmented by a name a for each aA, and an additional constant c. Let Δ be the set of LA-sentences comprising:

  • all axioms of ZFC;
  • ca, for each aA;
  • x(x aba x = b), for each aA;
  • a b, for each abA.

It is easily shown that Δ is a subset of A which is definable in A by a formula of the language of set theory. Also, each subset Δ′ ⊆ Δ such that Δ′ ∈ A has a model. For the set C of all aA for which a occurs in Δ′ belongs to A — since Δ′ does — and so, if we interpret c as any member of the (necessarily nonempty) set A − C, then A is a model of Δ′. Accordingly, (5.5) implies that Δ has a model ⟨B, E⟩. If we interpret each constant a as the element aA, then ⟨B, E⟩ is a proper end-extension of A. The proof is complete.

The reader will quickly see that the first-order compactness theorem will not yield this result.

5.1 Definition of the Concept of Admissible Set

A nonempty transitive set A is said to be admissible when the following conditions are satisfied:

  1. if a, bA, then {a, b} ∈ A and ∪AA;
  2. if aA and XA is Δ0 on A, then XaA;
  3. if aA, XA is Δ0 on A, and ∀xay(<x,y> ∈ X), then, for some bA, ∀xayb(<x,y> ∈ X).

Condition (ii) — the Δ0-separation scheme — is a restricted version of Zermelo's axiom of separation. Condition (iii) — a similarly weakened version of the axiom of replacement — may be called the Δ0-replacement scheme.

It is quite easy to see that if A is a transitive set such that <A, ∈ | A> is a model of ZFC, then A is admissible. More generally, the result continues to hold when the power set axiom is omitted from ZFC, so that both H(ω) and H1) are admissible. However, since the latter is uncountable, the Barwise compactness theorem fails to apply to it.

6. Historical and Bibliographical Remarks

§§1 and 2. Infinitary propositional and predicate languages seem to have made their first explicit appearance in print with the papers of Scott and Tarski [1958] and Tarski [1958]. The completeness theorem for L1,ω), as well as for other infinitary languages, was proved by Karp [1964]. The Hanf number calculations for L1,ω) were first performed by Morley [1965]. The nondefinability of well-orderings in finite-quantifier languages was proved by Karp [1965] and Lopez-Escobar [1966]. The interpolation theorem for L1,ω) was proved by Lopez-Escobar [1965] and Scott's isomorphism theorem for L1,ω) by Scott [1965]. Negri [2021] extends the idea of geometric logic originating in topos theory to L1,ω).

Karp's partial isomorphism theorem was first proved in Karp [1965]; see also Barwise [1973]. Result (2.2) appears in Chang [1968], result (2.3) in Ellentuck [1976] and result (2.4) in Bell [1981].

§3. Results (3.2) and (3.3) are due to Hanf [1964], with some refinements by Lopez-Escobar [1966] and Dickmann [1975], while (3.4) was proved by Tarski. Result (3.5) is due to Scott [1961], (3.6) to Bell [1970] and [1972]; and (3.7) to Bell [1974]. Measurable cardinals were first considered by Ulam [1930] and Tarski [1939]. The fact that measurable cardinals are weakly compact was noted in Tarski [1962].

§4. Concerning the undefinability theorem for L11). Carol Karp remarks (1964, 166), “At the International Congress of Logic, Methodology and the Philosophy of Science at Stanford University in 1960, Dana Scott circulated an outline of a proof of the impossibility of a complete definable formal system for (γ+, γ+) languages with a single two-place predicate symbol in addition to the equality symbol.” Scott never published his result, and a fully detailed proof first appeared in Karp [1964]. The approach to the theorem adopted here is based on the account given in Dickmann [1975].

§5. The original motivation for the results presented in this section came from Kreisel; in his [1965] he pointed out that there were no compelling grounds for choosing infinitary formulas solely on the grounds of “length”, and proposed instead that definability or “closure” criteria be employed. Kreisel's suggestion was taken up with great success by Barwise [1967], where his compactness theorem was proved. The notion of admissible set is due to Platek [1966]. Theorem (5.6) is taken from Keisler [1974].

For further reading on the subject of infinitary languages, see Aczel [1973], Dickmann [1975], Karp [1964], Keisler [1974], and Makkai [1977]. A useful account of the connection between infinitary languages and large cardinals can be found in Chapter 10 of Drake [1974].


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