Rosa Luxemburg

First published Wed Apr 13, 2022

Rosa Luxemburg (1871–1919), described by one of her colleagues as the “most brilliant intellect of all the scientific heirs of Marx and Engels” (Fröhlich 1940/2010: 153 citing Franz Mehring in Neue Zeit) is one of the most original and influential thinkers in the history of Marxism. Her life and works stand out for the unique combination of intellectual rigour and political integrity, a rare ability to merge deep theoretical insight with sharp political vision, the development of knowledge which is at the same time militant activism.

Luxemburg is best known for her contributions to some of the most important economic and political debates that have shaped the development of socialist thought: the critique of capitalism and the dynamics of capital accumulation, the development of globalisation and its relation to colonialism and imperialism, the limits of national self-determination, the relationship of revolution to democracy, the challenges of parliamentary reform, the role of strikes and trade unions in political organisation, political parties, the critique of liberal feminism, the analysis of racism in connection to capitalist exploitation. She defended freedom, understood as a form of individual and collective self-rule, which could only be fully realised in a democratic socialist society, and gave her life for the cause. She was uncompromising in both her critique of capitalism and of bureaucratic authoritarian socialism. For this reason, and in part also due to her tragic death, her legacy has been appropriated (and distorted) by both Western Marxists keen to chart an alternative path to state socialism, and socialist states attracted to her theory of capitalist crisis and her radical critique of social-democracy. In the context of an ongoing electoral decline of traditional social-democratic parties, and with the rise of far-right challenges to crisis-ridden liberal political institutions, Luxemburg’s work has enjoyed a significant revival. It remains an important source of critique of the global political economy, one of the most sophisticated attempts to think about democracy and revolution, and an ongoing source of inspiration to reflect on the meaning of socialist emancipation beyond national boundaries.

1. Life

Rosa Luxemburg was born on March 5 1871 in Zamość, a predominantly Jewish centre in south-eastern Poland, then occupied by Tzarist Russia. She was the youngest of five children in a progressive family of assimilated Jews who were timber merchants. Her father, Eliasz (Eduard) Luxemburg, like her elder brothers, was educated in Germany. Her mother, Line, nee Löwenstein, was a well-read and highly articulate woman with a passion for classical literature, especially German and Polish, which she tried to inculcate on her children. Two years after Luxemburg’s birth, in 1873, the family moved to Warsaw. At the age of three, Luxemburg contracted a hip disease which was wrongly treated as tuberculosis, and caused her to walk with a limp for the rest of her life. She was bedbound for a year, a period during which she taught herself to read and write.

At the age of thirteen, Luxemburg joined the girls’ Second High School in Warsaw, one of the country’s elite schools, dominated by the children of Russian officials, where the use of Polish even among students was forbidden and the places for children of Jewish families were extremely limited. Luxemburg rebelled to the oppressive atmosphere in the school, and developed an interest in the activities of the various illegal revolutionary groups agitating against both capitalist oppression and the despotic character of Russian rule. By the time she finished secondary school in 1887, her “rebellious attitude towards authorities” was already mentioned in official school reports and deprived her of the gold medal awarded to the highest performing students (Nettl 1966 [2019: 17]). It is also likely that during this time, she joined what was left of Proletariat, the first Polish socialist party, at that point in disarray after the imprisonment and execution of many of its leaders as a result of the repressive measures taken by Russian authorities following the assassination of Tzar Alexander II in 1881. Faced with imminent arrest herself, she was smuggled out of the country in 1889 and migrated to Zurich. There she enrolled in the faculty of philosophy, switched to law and wrote a doctoral dissertation on “The Industrial Development of Poland”, where she argued that the integration of the Polish economy into the Russian empire meant that the interests of the Polish working class would be held back by championing the cause of national self-determination – a position to which she would remain committed her entire life. In Zurich, Luxemburg also met several other Marxists from Russian and Polish emigres circles, including Leo Jogisches, her partner for many years and co-founder of the Social Democracy of the Kingdom of Poland (SDKP), a Marxist party characterised by its opposition to the call for Polish independence and its staunch commitment to proletarian internationalism.

The Swiss years were characterised by a mix of academic and political work. Luxemburg, just over twenty, was entangled in a fight against the main Polish Socialist Party (PSP) by then fully committed to a mixture of progressive nationalism and Marxism, and for the recognition of the SDKP by the Socialist International. She conducted the struggle both on the political stage and in the main organs of international social democracy such as Vorwärts and Neue Zeit, as well as in the political magazine she and Jogisches edited, Sprawa Robotnica (Workers’ Cause). All this meant that when she moved to Germany in 1898 with the help of a fictitious marriage to the son of one of her friends, a German national, she was already well known to the leadership of the largest social democratic party in the world, the Sozialdemokratische Partei Deutschlands (SPD). She rose quickly through the ranks of the SPD, in no small part due to her sharply critical interventions in the “revisionist” controversy which shook the party to its core in the years of transition from the 19th to the 20th century.

In 1905, the first Russian revolution broke up, the “dress rehearsal” for the subsequent Bolshevik revolution of 1917, in Lenin’s famous sentence. It found the socialist movement deeply divided. In the West, socialist parties made steady electoral gains, and united superficially in recognition of the moral authority of the Second International but were deeply divided in matters of both principle and tactics. In Russia, there was no direct equivalent to the debate on reform versus revolution: socialists worked underground and were divided mainly on questions of membership and party organisation. The 1905 revolution which broke out after decades of impoverishment, a series of defeats by Russia in the Russo-Japanese war, and subjection to authoritarian violence was not so much a single event as the cumulative result of several years of mass strikes, border unrest, and demonstrations which forced Marxists to put the question of party organisation at the centre of their debates. Luxemburg, recently released from a few months in prison in Zwickau on a charge of undermining the authority of the German emperor, followed the events closely. She published several interventions in which she debated with Lenin on the role of the masses and the party in revolutionary circumstances, and tried to persuade her colleagues in the SPD to adopt the mass strike as a political weapon to advance the cause of workers also in Germany. In December 1905 she smuggled herself on a military train to the Russian part of Poland, and tried to reach Warsaw, where martial law coexisted with a general strike, to resume her work of agitation with the Polish working classes. Within a year she was arrested again, first confined to a police prison in the Warsaw town hall then transferred on grounds of ill-health to the Warsaw Citadel. There she spent a few months until her release following both her family’s intercessions and payment of the bail, and her reputation as one of the leading activists of the German SPD. Immediately after her release from prison she went to St Petersburg then Finland, where she met Lenin and wrote one of her most famous pamphlets: “The Mass Strike, the Party and the Trade Unions”, reflecting on the lessons of the 1905 revolution. The story goes that when she proposed these ideas to the SPD Party Congress of Jena in 1905, August Bebel, one of the party founders, joked that – as he listened to a debate with so much blood and revolution – he kept “glancing occasionally at my boots to see if these weren’t in fact already wading in blood” (Nettl 1966 [2019: 310]).

Upon her return to Germany, in 1907, “bloody Rosa” as she became known to the liberal press was engaged as a teacher in the Party School, where she taught “Introduction to Economics” and “Marx’s Capital” to rank and file members of the SPD. Her “Introduction to Economics” based on lecture notes survives only in fragments but “The Accumulation of Capital”, published in 1913, is one of the most important works of theory to have emerged from the Second International. At the same time, her political stance continued to evolve in a direction opposite to the SPD leadership, whose growing reluctance to condemn the imperialist ventures of Kaiser Wilhelm II in Morocco made her vividly aware both of the dangers of stirring nationalist sentiments to increase support for a possible war, and of the evasive attitudes of her colleagues toward rising militarism. She felt increasingly isolated. While the parliamentary party became entangled in debates around taxation and suffrage reform, she wrote to advocate the importance of mass struggles, the agitation for a democratic republic and the conquest of political power by the proletariat. Her proposals were met with hostility even from erstwhile allies like Karl Kautsky, and the main party publications refused to publish her work.

The break came in 1914 when WW1 erupted and the SPD voted in favour of war credits, de facto embracing crude nationalism at the expense of the internationalist promise of concern for the whole working class regardless of national boundaries. Workers once united against capitalists would now kill each other at the border under different flags. Together with Franz Mehring, Klara Zetkin, and Karl Liebknecht, the only SPD deputy in the Reichstag to have opposed war credits until the end, Luxemburg founded the Spartakus group – initially part of the USPD (Unabhängige Sozialdemokratische Partei Deutschlands) the anti-war splinter faction from the SPD – and which was also known as the International group after Die Internationale, the joint publication which agitated for an end to the war and developing working class struggle against capitalism on an international basis. Soon after, Luxemburg was imprisoned, released, and then imprisoned again. Behind bars, she wrote “The Crisis of Social Democracy” better known as the Junius pamphlet or Juniusbrochüre because of the pseudonym Junius under which it appeared. It was the synthesis of a life’s critique of the limits of liberal parliamentarism, the pursuit of compromise for compromise’s sake, and the consequences of a failure to commit to principled internationalism on the side of social democratic parties which were organised on a national basis.

When Luxemburg was released from prison in November 1918, Germany looked very different. The success of the Bolsheviks in Russia in 1917 which led to the peace treaty of Brest-Litovsk between Germany and Russia sparked mutiny at the border and a series of strikes and insurrections among the German workers who demanded a democratic republic. From prison, Luxemburg had greeted the Russian revolution as “an act of world-historical significance whose traces will be not be extinguished for aeons” (cited in Fröhlich 1940 [2010: 239]). But as her verdict makes clear, she was not hopeful that the victory would last, in no small part because she lacked confidence that German social democrats would support their Russian counterparts. While the Spartakus group continued to demand the creation of a socialist republic based on workers’ councils, the SPD greeted the abdication of Kaiser Wilhelm II by installing its leader, Friedrich Ebert as chancellor of the new liberal parliamentarian republic. From Berlin, Rosa Luxemburg and Karl Liebknecht published the first issue of Rote Fahne, the organ of the Spartakusbund, followed in December by the announcement of the programme. The contrast between alternatives could not have been starker: either the “traditional organs of bourgeois class rule, the federal councils, the parliaments, municipal councils etc.” or the proletariat’s own “class organs: Workers’ and Soldiers’ Councils” in which they “occupy all public posts, superintend all public activity, and measure all the needs of the state by their own class interests and socialists tasks” (cited in Fröhlich 1940 [2010: 273]). A couple of weeks later the same programme was presented in the inaugural Congress of the Communist Party of Germany (KPD) where Luxemburg argued in favour of participating in the upcoming January elections to the National Assembly. She was outvoted. In the first days of January 1919, another wave of protests saw hundreds of thousands of workers descend into the streets and occupy train stations and newspapers. The Spartakists urged caution. Despite the anarchy in Berlin, Luxemburg, especially, did not think the German people were ready for a socialist revolution. The Spartakist uprising mobilised the far right, while, Gustav Noske, the social-democratic Interior minister ordered the police to crush the protests. With the help of the Freikorps, the far-right, anti-republican, proto-nazi paramilitary groups, many activists were arrested and murdered. The same fate would soon fall on Karl Liebknecht and Rosa Luxemburg. On the 15th January 1919, they were discovered in their hiding place, arrested, knocked unconscious with rifle buts then shot. Luxemburg’s body was thrown into Berlin’s Landwehr Canal, from where it washed ashore a few months after.

2. Social reform or revolution

Rosa Luxemburg established herself as a major intellectual figure in Marxist circles with her intervention in the revisionist controversy, the theoretical and political debate around the principles and aims of social-democracy that divided the Second International at the turn of the 19th century. The debate was sparked by Eduard Bernstein, Friedrich Engels’s close friend, collaborator and literary executor, as well as a senior figure in the German Social Democratic Party. It unfolded first in a series of articles published between 1896 and 1898 in Die Neue Zeit, then subsequently consolidated in a volume entitled The Preconditions of Socialism (1899). As the Prussian government progressively relaxed the Anti-Socialist laws promoted by the then chancellor Otto von Bismarck, and social democratic ranks continued to swell, Bernstein tried to revisit some of the core theoretical and political commitments of Marxism by offering a new analysis of the transformation of capitalism in the fifty years following the publication of Marx and Engels’s Communist Manifesto. He criticised one of the fundamental pillars of Marxian economics: that the historical tendency of the rate of profit to fall under the twin pressure of technological modernisation and an increasingly exploited labour force rendered inevitable the crisis of the system. This, Bernstein argued, required social-democrats to abandon their revolutionary aims in favour of enacting progressive legislation which sought to represent workers through parliamentary struggle. He insisted that this was no subversion of the teachings of the founding fathers, but rather an effort to liberate Marxism from the dialectical straightjacket in which many socialists of the Second International had subsequently placed it.

The debate centred around the question of whether democracy and capitalism were compatible. The starting point for Bernstein’s critique was the Marxist claim that capitalism was a social system with a tendency to collapse under the pressure of its own contradictions. In the pages of Capital, Marx had written eloquently about how capitalist economies faced the prospect of ever more destructive crises due to the twin pressures of technological modernisation and the tendency of the rate of profits to fall. At the time of Bernstein’s contribution, this methodological commitment to understanding capital as a system with an inherent propensity towards crisis was widely shared among the main theorists of the Second International. To suggest that the argument was false was to strike at the core of Marxist political economy. But what made the attack particularly uncomfortable, and difficult to dismiss, was that Bernstein presented his argument not as a break with Marxist methodological assumptions but as an internal development of its normative and empirical requirements. He began by insisting that dialectics was nothing other than the methodological commitment to match one’s theory to new developments in practice. The history of capitalist development in the 19th century showed not a cumulative series of ever sharper failures but a resilient system with a surprising capacity for adaptation. From an economic perspective there were a number of new developments with which the Marxist analysis had to reckon: the intensification of foreign trade, the expansion of the banking and financial sector, the development of the credit system, and the emergence of cartels and trusts. From a political perspective, the consolidation of middle classes, the rise of property owners, and the expansion of the franchise meant that liberal representation could no longer be identified with the perpetuation of oppression by ruling elites. There was now reasonable hope that the gap between the private and the public sphere, between the ethos of the bourgeois and that of the citoyen could be bridged. On the one hand, the extension of the right to vote to previously disenfranchised categories of people; on the other hand the strengthening of workers’ unions and cooperatives as well as the prospects of electoral successes for mass social-democratic parties across Western Europe made it hard to equate representative democracy with the consolidation of class rule. Citizenship emerged as the new concept through which capital could be put to the service of the democratic state. Representative democracy and political emancipation were part of the same project, a project that social-democrats could develop regardless of “the final goal.”

Rosa Luxemburg was not the only one to protest against Bernstein’s reinterpretation of Marxism. His position was discussed (and rejected) at the Stuttgart Conference of the German Social Democratic party (1898) where more established members of the SPD, including Karl Kautsky and August Bebel, also spoke against his thesis. Luxemburg’s intervention, which appeared partially in article form in Leipziger Volkszeitung, and was subsequently published in 1900 under the title Social Reform or Revolution (second edition 1908) was, however, a point-by-point response. Her critique targeted Bernstein’s arguments as synthesised in the famous (or infamous) dictum: “the final goal is nothing to me, the movement is everything.”

This, Luxemburg explained, was a false dilemma. “Can Social-Democracy be against reforms? Can we contrapose the social revolution, the transformation of the existing order, our final goal, to social reforms? Certainly not.” At the heart of Bernstein’s dilemma, she suggested, was not a tactical choice, a simple discussion about this or that method of struggle; it was the “very existence of the Social Democratic movement” as a distinctive force in the struggle against capitalism (Luxemburg 1900 [RLR: 129]).

But just like Bernstein’s arguments were grounded in apparently Marxist theory so was Luxemburg’s response. She was committed to the idea that socialism is a “historic necessity”, a theory whose desirability is dictated by the correct interpretation of empirical circumstances. “Either revisionism is correct concerning the course of capitalist development, and therefore socialism becomes a utopia”, she wrote, or “socialism is not a utopia; and therefore the theory of the means of adaptation is false” (Luxemburg 1900 [RLR: 134]).

To illustrate the latter, her analysis combined economic and political arguments and focused on the structure of globalization and the role of nation-states in a financialized economic system. The conclusions reached however were opposite to those of Bernstein. While Bernstein had interpreted the development of the credit and debit system as stabilising mechanisms within a capitalist order, for Luxemburg the concentration of economic power by monopoly holders, corporations, banks and other financial institutions were symptoms of vulnerability rather than an asset. In response to Bernstein’s remarks on the role of credit in avoiding capitalist collapse, she emphasized that financial capitalism and the availability of loans aggravates crisis rather than providing a solution to it. Credit, Luxemburg argued, encourages speculation and widens the gap between what might be called the real and the fictitious economy. Indeed, while credit initially stimulates the development of productive forces, it can also lead to errors of calculation and overproduction, therefore ceasing to be helpful in the exchange process at the first symptom of stagnation. Likewise, cartels and trusts, and the other regulatory mechanisms designed to increase coordination among the holders of capital can only succeed by eliminating internal competition in isolated industries, something that cannot be extended to all sectors of production. Moreover, cartels succeed at increasing the rate of profit in internal markets only in virtue of expansion outwards, by selling abroad the products that cannot be absorbed by domestic demand. In other words, Luxemburg explained, these companies are only able to sell abroad, at lower rates of profit, the product that cannot be absorbed by domestic markets. The other face of apparent market stability in Europe is sharpened competition abroad and anarchy on the world market – the opposite of what cartels intended to achieve. When the global market begins to shrink because it has been exhausted by competition between capitalist countries, the capital that has been socialised through organisation reverts to private capital and employers organisations “burst like soap bubbles and give way to free competition in aggravated form” (Luxemburg 1900 [RLR: 137]).

From a political perspective, Luxemburg maintained, work for reforms should not be understood as “a drawn-out revolution,” and revolution should not be understood as “a condensed series of reforms.” Historically, legal reform, she explaned, has served the purpose of consolidating an emerging social class until the balance of political forces is such that the existing juridical relations can be eventually dismantled in favor of new ones. Every legal order, she maintained, emerges out of a social and political revolution: “revolution is the act of political creation while legislation is the political expression of a society that has already come into being” (Luxemburg 1900 [RLR: 156]). This is precisely what the terms “reform” and “revolution” mean: they suggest a radical change in the content of fundamental legal dispositions rather than in the manner of their realization. Legal reform and revolution are not different methods of historical progress that “can be picked out from the counter of history as one picks out hot or cold sausages” (Luxemburg 1900 [RLR: 156]). Those who oppose the method of legal reform to the goal of conquering political power by the workers do not oppose “a more tranquil, calmer and slower method to the same goal”; they choose “a different goal” (Luxemburg 1900 [RLR: 157]). They choose to operate within the legal framework dictated by the old order instead of committing to establish a new one. The political analysis of revisionism produces a similar outcome to its economic analysis: it abandons the commitment to socialism in favour of the preservation of capitalism, and tries to reduce abuses in the system rather than eliminating the system itself. To achieve the more radical outcome, it is essential for the proletariat to have access to political power. The fate of democracy, Luxemburg insisted, is “bound up with the fate of the labour movement”. While the advocacy of reforms via parliamentary and trade union mechanisms would prepare the working classes for the exercise of political power, the fact that these demands were inscribed in a liberal institutional framework made it impossible to overcome capitalism from within. The reformist method ended up pitting socialism against democracy without understanding the nature of legal revolutions. In turning the dispute from one of content of legal dispositions to one of style of execution, it ended up losing sight of both.

3. Critique of political economy

Luxemburg’s political stance is grounded in her analysis of capital as a set of economic, political and social relations with global scope. She developed her contribution to Marxist political economy in The Accumulation of Capital: A Contribution to the Economic Explanation of Imperialism (1913) and in her Introduction to Political Economy published posthumously in 1925 and based on her lectures on the same subject at the SPD party school. Her starting position is that the core of a capitalist economy is the extraction of surplus value and the exploitation of workers as a source of accumulation of profits. As Luxemburg puts it, the distinctive feature of a capitalist system of production consists in the fact that “only those goods are produced which can with certainty be expected to sell, and not merely to sell, but to sell at the customary profit” (Luxemburg 1913 [AK: 35]). To understand how this is possible, she argues, we need to focus on total capital and its continuous transformation from commodity to money and back to commodity again, in a new cycle of spiralling profits (Bellofiore 2009). What is required to maintain the capitalist system, Luxemburg shows, is firstly the ability of capitalists to make profit guaranteed by the reproduction of capitalism as a system; secondly, enough demand to meet the offer of new capitalist commodities brought into the market; and thirdly an incentive to accumulate based on the prospect of new markets to absorb increasing production.

Luxemburg’s study of the dynamic structure of capital accumulation begins with a critique of Volume II of Capital. More specifically, it starts with Marx’s analysis of capitalism as a “closed system” based on a simplified model of relations of production between capitalists and workers, which abstracts from the existence of non-capitalist economies. As Marx had put it in chapter 24 of Capital, “we must treat the whole world of trade as one nation, and assume that capitalist production is established everywhere and has taken possession of every branch of industry” (Marx 1887 [1990: 727]). The problem with this analysis, Luxemburg pointed out, consists in a mistaken understanding of capital accumulation as a mere question of “the sources of money when the real issue is the effective demand, the use made of goods, not the source of money which is paid for them” (Luxemburg 1913 [AK: 128]). The closed-system analysis, she suggested, made it difficult to explain how capital could be reproduced and valorized in a capitalist society based only on the exploitation of workers, and related extraction of surplus value.

To better explain this point it is important to emphasise that one of the core ideas in Marx’s analysis of accumulation was the explanation of the reproduction of capital with reference to the development of technology, competition among capitalists, and their thirst for maximizing profit. Luxemburg found that this analysis did not do justice to the distinctive structural constraints of capital reproduction. In particular, it did not take account of the necessity to access new markets in order to sell consumption goods that impoverished domestic workers could no longer afford. Without the guarantee of an ever-expanding market, in a depressed economy with low demand for consumption goods there would be no possibility of capital reinvestment and no outlet for accumulated capital stocks. More specifically, under conditions of pauperisation, inequality, and ongoing exploitation of workers by capitalists, the workers would not be able to generate the demand necessary to absorb the commodities produced by capitalists. The capitalists’ own patterns of consumption would not help to solve the problem of underconsumption since the capitalist class is driven by the imperative to accumulate capital and reinvest in order to keep up with the pressures of market competition, production, technological modernisation and so on. Given the tension between “the unlimited expansive capacity of the productive forces” and “the limited expansive capacity of social consumption” highlighted in volume 3 of Capital, Marx’s own analysis could not explain how the consumption necessary to increase profits could give rise to an “enlarged” rather than “simple” reproduction of capital. The decisive fact, Luxemburg argued, is that surplus value “cannot be realised by sale either to workers or to capitalists, but only if it is sold to such social organisations or strata whose own mode of production is not capitalistic”.

Luxemburg’s core insight is that the expansion of capital in noncapitalist areas of the world by way of conquest, trade, violence or deception provides the kind of outlet that capital needs in order to be reproduced as a system. Cheap mass-produced goods that struggle to be sold in the markets of developed capitalist states because of low patterns of consumption become available in other areas of the world. They create investment opportunities that displace traditional ways of organizing economic life, and destroy predominantly agricultural forms of production. They also bring in technological innovations and modernizing projects that modify existing relations of authority and reshape forms of class conflict different from the capitalist one. Moreover, thanks to its expansion to non-capitalist areas and the disruption of traditional ways of life, there is also increased migration and the possibility of recruiting cheap labour force caused by the disintegration of primitive forms of production and non-capitalist ways of life. As Luxemburg pointed out, “since capitalist production can develop fully only with complete access to all territories and climes, it can no more confine itself to the natural resources and productive forces of the temperate zone than it can manage with white labour alone. Capital needs other races to exploit territories where the white man cannot work. It must be able to mobilise world labour power without restriction in order to utilise all productive forces of the globe” (Luxemburg 1913 [AK: 343]).

Such an analysis of racism as an integral component of capitalist exploitation helped her see the oppression of non-white peoples as an ongoing feature of the structural replication of the capitalist system. While Marx had examined colonialism, migration and the disruption of non-capitalist economies with reference only to the genesis of capital (the problem of so-called primitive accumulation), Luxemburg criticised him for failing to see how capitalism, also in its “full maturity” depends on non-capitalist strata and social organisations existing side by side. Capital, Luxemburg, argues, constantly “needs the means of production and the labour power of the whole globe for untrammelled accumulation” (Luxemburg 1913 [AK: 346]).

This analysis leads to an understanding of imperialism as the political expression of competition among capitalists for “what remains still open of the non-capitalist environment” (Luxemburg 1913 [AK: 465]). Differently from the expectation of classical economists that the development of commercial relations would bring peace among nations, Luxemburg showed how “the harmony of interests between commercial nations in the East were proclaimed to the sound of gunfire in the Opium Wars” (Luxemburg 1913 [AK: 427]). And while imperial conquest, displacement and war guarantee the direct subjection of whole parts of the world to the political control of more developed capitalist countries, other subtle ways of control – for example, in the form of international loans – create political and economic dependency that places the foreign and economic policy of young capitalist states directly under the influence of their neocolonial masters. International loans, as she explained, help dependent territories acquire the resources needed to modernise and develop their infrastructure while also financing the export of capital from advanced capitalist countries. However, in a financialized economy, with investment comes speculation, and when hopes of increasing rates of profit are disappointed, debt comes to haunt these vulnerable national economies and losses need to be socialized. This triggers a new, even deeper, crisis and the beginning of a new cycle of accumulation accompanied by militarism as a weapon in the competitive struggle among nations (Toporowski 2015).

Luxemburg’s reading of Marx as well as her analysis of the accumulation of capital has attracted several criticisms. It became a matter of controversy already during the Second International when authors such as Bukharin and Lenin, inspired by the Austrian social democratic economist Rudolph Hilferding’s analysis of finance capital, pointed out the flaws in Luxemburg’s reading of Marx, and criticised her for holding a “teleological” view of capitalism in which the whole system is acsribed a purpose much like the component parts of it. This, they further argued, leads to a mistaken view of the accumulation of capital (see for a discussion Brewer 1990: 62–64 and Callinicos 2001: 36–42). As a matter of Marxist exegesis, several scholars have also emphasised, that if one integrates the analysis of Capital with Marx’s other writings on colonialism, it is possible to show how Capital volume 1 already anticipated a number of critiques made by theorists of the Second International and could be productively deployed to generate a critique of imperalism not too dissimilar from Luxemburg’s (Pradella 2013). Moreover, so defenders of Marx point out, Luxemburg’s critique is methodologically flawed. While Marx intended his scheme of reproduction to be an abstract analysis which brackets away from historical constraints to illustrate the inner contraddictions in the continuous search for profit, Luxemburg conflates this philosophical abstraction with a description of historical reality. Finally , several prominent Marxist economists (e.g., Sweezy 1967) criticised her for focusing on the seemingly unorthodox premise that “consumption” rather than the realisation of surplus value is the main concern of a capitalist sytem thus conflating the question of “where does demand come from to to realise surplus value” with the question “where does the money come from to monetise profits” (see Bellofiore 2009 for a discussion and response).

Notwithstanding these criticisms, the originality of Luxemburg’s contribution to an analysis of the role of finance in the accumulation of capital, and her emphasis on the monetary character of the capitalist economy cannot be denied. She was one of the first authors to contribute to what some have called the “critical school of finance” which pioneered an analysis of financial crisis as relatively independent from industrial crisis, anticipating later debates on the relation between the rate of savings and the motivation to invest as discussed in the works of John Maynard Keynes, Michal Kalecki and Hyman Minsky (Robinson 2013). Her remarks on the role of the credit and debit system are crucial to understand the underdevelopment and ongoing reproduction of relations of dependency between core and peripheral capitalist countries. Luxemburg’s analysis of the constant expansion of capital into non-capitalist economies is still crucial to understand contemporary globalisation practices, the interconnectedness between global financial crisis and the pressures of international migration, and to explain how global dispossession and exploitation work together to advance the interests of a global capitalist class.

4. Anti-imperialism and national self-determination

The focus on the development of noncapitalist areas of the world gave Luxemburg a sensitivity to questions of race, ethnicity, and indigenous rights that was uncharacteristic for the Marxism of her time. Up to that point, several Marxists had more or less shared the teleological scheme defended by many Enlightenment philosophers that characterised the process of societal evolution as a transition through different stages of development. Starting with nomadic (hunter-gathering) forms of life, who were then supplanted by pastoral then agricultural relations, these conjectural histories usually culminated with commercial societies, often considered to be a superior form of social organisation. Luxemburg was one of the pioneers of a study of racism and cultural appropriation as distinctive yet integrated components of an analysis of capitalism where exploitation and racial subordination are mutually reinforcing. “The progress of the humanistic era of the Enlightenment”, she remarked sarcastically while commenting on German colonialism at the end of the 18th century, could be seen in how the captain of a ship transporting slaves from Guinea to Guyana in South America, “to alleviate their [the slaves] melancholy and to keep them from dying off, allowed them to dance on the ship’s deck with music and whip cracks every evening, something to which the more brutal Spanish traders had not resorted” (Luxemburg 1910 [CW: 209]).

In the manuscript on the Introduction to the Critique of Political Economy based on her lectures at the SPD school and published postuhumously, Luxemburg examined at length primitive communism in societies as diverse as Germanic tribes, the Inca empire, British India, French Algeria, and Russia. She illustrated how collective forms of land ownership had an extraordinary capacity for tenacity and adaptation to changing historical circumstances, showing enduring resilience towards despotism, foreign rule, outside conquest and exploitation. There was only one contact, Luxemburg pointed out, that those societies could not withstand: “the contact with European civilisation, i.e. with capitalism”. This encounter, she wrote, is “deadly, universally and without exception and it accomplishes what centuries of the most savage Oriental conquerors could not: the dissolution of the whole social structure from the inside, tearing apart all traditional bonds and transforming the society in a short period of time into a shapeless pile of rubble” (Luxemburg 1910 [CW: 227]).

In The Accumulation of Capital, the examples – of British colonialism in India, the Opium Wars, French colonialism in Algeria, the struggle between Black African peoples and Dutch Boers, the exploitation of Native Americans – serve as a reminder of how capitalism develops against a background of coercion and racial abuse. At a time in which the German Social Democratic party celebrated its electoral expansion while hesitating to condemn the contribution of Germany to the scramble for Africa, Luxemburg wrote several articles and pamphlets in which she called attention to the genocide of the Nama and Herero people of Namibia, and criticised the complicity of Kautsky and the SPD leadership in failing to condemn the expansion of the Kaiser’s imperial projects in Morocco for fear of losing parliamentary seats. While remaining committed to the fight against racism in Europe, as her public pronouncements on the Dreyfus affair demonstrate, she continued to see the struggle against exclusion within her own state as inextricably linked to the condemnation of the racial abuse perpetuated by imperialist powers around the world. Black people in Africa “with whose bodies the Europeans play a game of catch, are just as near to me” as the “suffering of the Jews”, she emphasised (Luxemburg 1917 [RLR: 390]).

This attention to the global dynamic of capitalist expansion and the analysis of imperialism as an integral part of the development of capital are important to explain Luxemburg’s distinctive stance on one of the most important questions that concerned the Marxist movement: the desirability of national self-determination. The mutual dependence between economic and political power in the presence of globalization and the continous drive to exploit remote areas of the world made Luxemburg a skeptic of theories of political emancipation through national self-determination. Here she differed from the mainstream Marxist position on national self-determination (including Vladimir Lenin’s) who had argued in favour of national liberation movements when these helped advance socialist goals. For Luxemburg, national liberation movements ended up playing into the hands of domestic liberal ruling elites and weakening the international workers’ movement. Taking as an example a question closer to home – whether Poland ought to gain independence from imperial Russia – she drew on her knowledge and experience to defend strict international proletarianism and suggested that it was against the interests of the Polish working classes to become a self-determining nation. Her argument was that national self-determination cannot serve an emancipatory purpose if it is divorced from the international labour movement. That labour movement however ought to take a transnational form and not limit itself to a formal request for national self-determination since, on the face of capitalist development, the formal defence of sovereignty would simply limit the struggle.

Authors who study Luxemburg’s stance on national self-determination believe that her hostility to it stems from aversion to nationalism. Her argument however was more sophisticated (see Brie and Schütrumpf 2021). Luxemburg was enthusiastic about the unique contribution of national culture through art or literary products to the understanding of the historical and social specificities of different nations, as her commentaries on the work of Polish poet Adam Mickiewicz make clear (see for a discussion Scott 2021). However, her appreciation of such distinctive linguistic and cultural contributions was always distinguished from the issue of nation-state sovereignty – a positiion which put her at odds with mainstream progressive movements in Congress Poland. While the charge of being a “national nihilist” may be exaggerated, it is fair to say that Luxemburg’s prominence in the Polish socialist movement, imprinted on the SDKP a sectarian tendency which many historians have subsequently criticised for undermining the Polish workers’ movement with its distinctive nationalist commitments (Blanc 2017). Luxemburg always maintained that if the political and economic power of the Polish proletariat were so weighty as to make national self-determination a viable alternative, then surely the workers would also have enough power to rebel against capital beyond national boundaries. Given the empirical circumstances of Poland, Luxemburg believed that national self-determination was a dangerous distraction from the imperative to work with the labour movement to fight the Russian empire and turn it into a socialist state. Without socialist governments in Germany, Austria, and Russia, she argued, independence would deepen the exploitation of Polish workers. The demand for national self-determination ran the risk of playing in the hands of liberal ruling elites, distracting Polish workers and turning them from an entity dominated by Russian capital to one dominated by Polish capital. This attitude towards nationalism is also central to understand her stance against the war, leading to her definitive break with German social democracy whom she accused of joining forces with nationalist conservatives to support the war against Russia. As she explained in the 1915 Junius Pamphlet: “So long as capitalist states exist, i.e., so long as imperialistic world policies determine and regulate the inner and outer life of a nation, there can be no ‘national self-determination’ either in war or in peace” (Luxemburg 1915 [RLR: 325]).

5. Political organisation

Luxemburg’s analysis on questions of strategy and political organisation was shaped by her reflections on the development of capitalism, her emphasis on the global character of that development and her conviction that any discussion of the issue of political organisation had to be historically informed and sensitive to the internal dynamic of the political movements of different countries. While historical materialism provided the methodological foundation, Luxemburg’s more specific interventions on the questions of the day (reform vs. revolution, economic vs. political struggle, spontaneous vs. centralised forms of political organisation) were shaped by her analysis of two very different experiences of working class organisation. In Western Europe, the demands of workers were increasingly driven (and constrained) by representation in the institutions of liberal parliamentary democracy, their demands presented in the language of civic rights, their appeals taking the form of a call to collective democratic responsibilty. In Eastern Europe, where the struggle for worker’s rights took place mostly underground, political debate was constantly threatened by censorship, and mass actions were organised in secret and at great risk to activists’ lives. The debate was therefore very different. Luxemburg’s essay on The Mass Strike, the Political Party and the Trade Union synthesises the lessons learned from the Russian revolution of 1905 and reflects on them to better understand working class organisation as a whole.

The focus of the discussion were political and economic strikes as methods in the struggle against capitalism. Such strikes, confined to particular sectors of production or to particular towns, should not be understood in isolation from each other, Luxemburg argued. The mass strike, she suggests, should not be seen as “a crafty method discovered by subtle reasoning for the purpose of making the proletarian struggle more effective but, the method of motion of the proletarian mass, the phenomenal form of the proletarian struggle in the revolution” (Luxemburg 1905 [RLR: 192]). While a strike may begin as a series of demands for, say, reduced working hours or improved pay, those demands for a fairer distribution are inseparable from the question of workers’ access to political power. As Luxemburg puts it, “the economic struggle is the transmitter from one political centre to another; the political struggle is the periodic fertilization of the soil for the economic struggle” (Luxemburg 1905 [RLR: 195]). This interdependence between economic and political struggle also meant that the question of mass strike could not be separated from that of revolution, observed not from the point of view of public order as “street disturbances”, “rioting” and “bloodshed” but as a “thoroughgoing internal reversal of existing class relations” (Luxemburg 1905 [RLR: 195–196]). And yet precisely because the mass strike should not be understood as an isolated measure to be called at will but was inextricably linked to the fate of revolution, the decision to bring it about could not come even from “the highest committee of the strongest Social Democratic party” (Luxemburg 1905 [RLR: 197]). Of course, Luxemburg conceded that initiative, direction, mass education and party discipline had a crucial role to play in revolutionary organisation. But she was convinced that “revolutions do not allow anyone to play schoolmaster with them” because, as she argued, “in every individual act of the struggle so very many important economic, political and social, general and local, material and psychical, factors react upon one another in such a way that no single act can be arranged and resolved as if it were a mathematical problem” (Luxemburg 1905 [RLR: 198]).

This then, is the essence of what has been labelled her theory of the role of “spontaneity” in political organisation, which is not so much a theory as an effort to understand the dynamic of political action grounded in the belief that, in the course of political mobilisation and activity, oppressed groups are themselves able to develop the epistemic insight, political tools and collective motivation required to change the course of history. The lesson for political parties, Luxemburg argued, was not to focus on the “technical side”, with the “mechanisms of the mass strike” but to ensure that “they never fall below the level demanded by the actual relations of forces, but rather rise above it” (Luxemburg 1905 [RLR: 199]). Reforms, she explained, provided crucial learning platforms through which the mass of oppressed people would develop a capacity for autonomous decision-making, and prepare for the conquest of political power. Yet such reforms were trials of freedom, they were not freedom itself.

Luxemburg’s analysis of political organisation has received several critiques from contrasting perspectives. On the one hand, it has been pointed out that while Luxemburg was able to navigate carefully the choice between national parliamentary representation and a revolutionary analysis of class conflict that transcended state boundaries, she opposed the Second International’s naïve faith on national social democracy with a no less naïve belief on the democratising effects of a continuously expanding wave of strikes (Eley 1980: 147). On the other hand, her faith in the spontanous power of the masses has often been interpreted as the unavoidable consequence of a certain degree of “determinism” or “fatalism” embedded in her analysis of the limits of capital accumulation and its emphasis on an inherent tendency towards crisis (see for a discussion of this literature Geras 1976 [2015, ch 1]). However, as Norman Geras has pointed out, while some of the phrasing in her texts resembles standard formulations of the Second International to the extent that the collapse of capitalism was perceived as inherently unavoidable, and while this rhetoric could occasionally serve a psychological motivating role, Luxemburg was far from considering the emergence of socialism a matter of fatal destiny (Geras 1976 [2015]). On the contrary, she made it clear that socialism was not going to fall as “manna from heaven” and that while “we can no more skip a period in our historical development than a man can jump over his shadow, it lies within our power to accelerate or to retard it” (Luxemburg 1915 [RLR: 320–321]). The meaning of Engels’s famous slogan “socialism or barbarism”, on which Luxemburg commented in the Junius Pamphlet was quite the opposite of determinism: the vindication of the conscious agency of the oppressed, the transformation, she argued, of the proletariat from “a powerless victim of history” to “its conscious guide” (Luxemburg 1915 [RLR: 321]).

This belief in the power of the oppressed masses, and the role of spontaneous action in developing revolutionary organisation informed Luxemburg’s response to her colleagues in the German social democratic party and her call to combine parliamentary initiatives with the defence of the mass strike as the focal point of revolutionary organisation. The extent to which these views were reflected in her attitude to the Polish workers movement, with regard to which Luxemburg is sometimes criticised for her rigidity and sectarian stance, is a contested question (Blanc 2017). However, there is no doubt that her political experience with both Polish and German organisations, played an important role in the analysis of the political developments in Russia, from the revolution of 1905 to the Bolshevik conquest of power after October 1917. Initially sceptical of the possibility that a workers’ government in Russia could last for a long time, Luxemburg nevertheless praised the Bolsheviks for the symbolic importance of showing to the world that a revolutionary programme led by the proletariat was worth fighting for despite the constraints imposed by circumstances. She also urged her colleagues in the SPD to abandon their caution and support the Bolsheviks with greater conviction that the oppressed people of Russia would eventually be able to find their orientation despite what many considered to be “unripe circumstances”. As she put it in her essay on the Russian revolution, writen while in prison during World War I but published after her death in 1922, “when the proletariat seizes power, it can never again follow Kautsky’s good advice to dispense with a socialist transformation of a country on the grounds that‘the country is unripe’”. What it needs, she argues, is to “immediately embark on socialist measures in the most energetic, the most unyielding and the most ruthless way; in other words, it must exercise a dictatorship, but a dictatorship of the class, not of a party or of a clique – and dictatorship of the class means: in full view of the broadest public, with the most active, uninhibited participation of the popular masses in an unlimited democracy” (Luxemburg 1922 [RLR: 25, see also 307–308]).

Luxemburg interpreted the demand for a dictatorship of the proletariat in the same way Marx and Engels had done, as a transitional emergency institution required to realise democracy in a society rigged by class struggle (see for a broader discussion of the concept Ypi 2020). She strongly believed that the dictatorship of the proletariat should be brought about by the masses of the oppressed in their effort to liberate themselves, and that it should not be inflicted on them by a small circle of revolutionary elites. This commitment to freedom as reflected in the practical activity of the working class movement rather than a static goal to be approximated with the right tools was also reflected in her criticism of centralized models of political organization, motivating her scepticism towards the idea of a vanguard party championed by Vladimir Lenin. For Lenin, the political vanguard consisted of a selection of the most disciplined, intellectually sophisticated, and motivated revolutionaries whose role was to cultivate “agitation” with the aim of transforming workers’ mobilisation to achieve short-term goals into a wide ranging struggle aiming to secure their access to political power. Only a party guided by a small elite of revolutionaries aware of the twin dangers of both opportunism (too much compromise) and sectarianism (too little compromise), Lenin argued, was capable of giving the working class movement a compass with which to orient itself in the long-term (Lenin 1929 [1987: 95]). As Lenin puts it, the professional revolutionary is not merely a trade union secretary but a “tribune of the people”, able to react to injustice regardless of where it takes place or which group of people it affects so as to “group all these manifestations into a single picture of political violence […] in order to explain to everyone the world-historical significance of the struggle” (Lenin 1929 [1987: 113]).

Luxemburg was one of the first to draw attention to the risks of progressive isolation from the wider movement that this conception of partisanship entailed. Although she applauded the October Revolution of 1917 for showing that the idea of a working class state was no hopeless utopia, she insisted that without connection to and guidance from the masses, the party would soon reach a state of bureaucratic stalemate, separate from the concerns of the rest of society which would endanger the very freedoms that socialists promised to realise. As she memorably put it: “Freedom for supporters of the government only, for members of one part only – no matter how numerous they might be is no freedom at all. Freedom is always freedom for those who think differently” (Luxemburg 1922 [RLR: 305]). This freedom to think differently, she believed could only flourish if it remained connected to democracy understood as rule by the oppressed people, maturing the skills, epistemic insight and views necessary to guide them in circumstances of revolutionary transitions. She believed that political education of the mass of the oppressed, and the ability to develop their views through practice was essential to working class rule. While a liberal democratic order could maintain its stability thanks to the cooperation of an already educated elite, the challenge for a movement of the oppressed was to develop the knowledge necessary to develop a new political order in the course of transforming the old one. This is why, democratic practice and the idea of historical experimentation as a learning process was crucial. Not, as Luxemburg put it, because of any fanaticism about the “concept of ‘justice’ but because all that is instructive, wholesome and purifying in political freedom depends on this essential characteristic”, and “freedom” effectively loses its meaning once it becomes a privilege (Luxemburg 1922 [RLR: 305]). Active participation in public life required guaranteeing general elections, freedom of the press and assembly, and an uncensored exchange of opinions without which public life “gradually falls asleep” and only buraucracy is kept alive.

While remaining sensitive to the historical circumstances that constrained the Bolsheviks (war, the pressure from the outside, the difficulties in the development of the working class movement in Russia, and the infancy of its democratic institutions), Luxemburg was one of the first Marxist theorists to highlight the importance of combining the struggle for socialism with that for democracy, and to warn against the dangers of divorcing the two. The history of socialist states in the 20th century has proved her right. The concentration of power in the hands of a narrow elite of party officials, the lack of transparency and accountability of institutions, their progressive isolation from the demands of the people, ultimately led to their demise. The ongoing importance of Luxemburg’s writings on the Bolshevik revolution lies not so much in her commentary on a historical experiment of which she always doubted the capacity to survive historical constraints. It consists in what they tell us about the ethics of revolution and the difficulties of constructing a movement of the oppressed which must realise freedom in circumstances in which it may lack the historical maturity, material and epistemic means that the maintenance of the status quo makes available.

6. Women’s emancipation

Historically interpreted as a Marxist theorist at best indifferent to the question of women’s emancipation, recent scholarship has been more nuanced in their assessments of Luxemburg’s contribution to feminism (Dunayevskaya 1981; Ettinger 1987; Haug 2007). As with the case of national self-determination, her position on gender issues is more sophisticated than a simplified reading of her texts affords. It is well known that Luxemburg often rejected calls from her colleagues in the Second International to be exclusively involved with what they called the “women question”. However, as many of her articles, political interventions and letters make clear, Luxemburg was a fierce champion of women’s rights and of the contribution that advocacy for women representation made to socialist emancipation more generally. What she did reject is the kind of tokenistic feminism which limited itself to the suffrage campaign and isolated the question of female emancipation from the critique of capitalism. As she put it, bourgeois women “who act like lionessess in the struggle against ‘male prerogatives’ … are nothing but co-consumers of the surplus value their men extort from the proletariat”. These “parasites of the parasites of the social body”, she wrote “are usually even more rabid and cruel in defending their ‘right’ to a parasite’s life than the direct agents of class rule and exploitation” (Luxemburg 1902 [RLR: 240]).

Like her colleagues Clara Zetkin and Alexandra Kollontai who were actively contributing to the development of socialist feminism, Luxemburg also believed that under capitalism women were doubly oppressed: in the family and in the workplace. Like them, she did not think that conflicts over gender could be reduced to the antagonism between men and women but argued that they have deeper roots in in a capitalist system where only paid labour is considered productive. In this she could be seen as an early pioneer of social reproduction theory, offering an analysis of capital accumulation in which the commodification of domestic labour is a crucial step in the progressive expansion of capitalist relations to non-capitalist realms such as the household (Cakardic 2017).

While Luxemburg did not make this argument directly, her defence of women’s rights was coupled with a harsh critique of the capitalist system which viewed domestic labour, i.e. the labour traditionally performed by working women as unproductive, and in which proletarian women lacked even the basic political rights to support their calls to end economic exploitation. This is why, when Belgian social democrats agreed to an alliance with the liberal party which led them to abandon the demand to give votes to women, Luxemburg condemned the agreement in the harshest terms. She insisted that women suffrage would not only improve democratic representation in general but also “clear out the suffocating air of the current, philistine, family life that rubs itself off so unmistakably, even on our Party members, workers and leaders alike” (Luxemburg 1902 [RLR: 236]).

Yet Luxemburg’s arguments in support of women representation were never confined to a demand for abstract legal recognition in liberal parliamentary democracies. She was vividly aware that the few privileges extended to Western feminist campaigners might come at the price of the ongoing exploitation of women in other parts of the world. In an article entitled “Proletarian Women”, she wrote movingly about the struggles of women in German Africa where “the bones of defenseless Herero women are bleaching in the sun” and about “the high cliffs of Putumayo” where “the death cries of martyred Indian women, ignored by the world, fade away in the rubber plantations of the international capitalists” (Luxemburg 1914 [RLR: 245]). In this sense, Luxemburg’s calls to advance women’s struggle, were part of her more general argument that the demand for social rights obtained through parliamentary representation ought to be part of a more radical critique of capitalism where the key is access to political power and a profound transformation of both the economic and the political structures of society. Within existing capitalist institutions, she insisted, there could be no true gender and racial emancipation. The only secure foundation for the rights of women, she argued, was for them to join the social democratic movement where they could affirm their equality through mass orgnisation and protest alongside men, and where they could shake the pillars of the existing legal order before it grants them “the illusion of … rights” (Luxemburg 1914 [RLR: 244]).

7. Influence and legacy

Rosa Luxemburg’s ideas are still relevant today because they belong to a tradition of socialist thinking whose main concern is with freedom, its development in the course of global history, the obstacles to its realisation, and the different types of oppression that capitalist society entrenches, enables or fails to abolish. Luxemburg’s analysis of freedom as a philosophical concept is never explicitly brought out in her writings, but often appears embedded in a notion of historical agency – both individual and collective – which shares the humanism of classical Marxism. Socialism, Luxemburg argued, “is the first popular movement in the world that has set itself a goal and has established in the social life of a human being a conscious thought, a definite plan, the free will of mankind” (Luxemburg 1915 [RLR: 320]).

For her, as for Marx and others before him, human beings have a unique moral authority grounded on freedom which provides the basis for a radical critique of existing capitalist institutions as well as the impetus to struggle for a genuinly free society. Capitalism hinders freedom because it establishes global patterns of domination and oppression which sacrifice the freedom of many to the wellbeing of a few. Crucially for Luxemburg though, freedom is not simply an end-state, a condition to aspire to at the end of a journey of political emancipation; it is also actively practiced when those who suffer from injustice express their will through forms of political activism that play an educating role. In this sense, the process of political emancipation must be self-guided rather than directed by others because the experience accumulated through political practice serves as a learning platform in which collective freedom, before being institutionalised externally through political and legal mechanisms, is appropriated internally and exercised through social activism.

While Luxemburg’s writings are scattered and sometimes difficult to read, this commitment to freedom provides the moral and political compass with the help of which we can understand her contribution to a range of questions: from the limits of liberal parliamentarism to the value of self determination, from the dynamics of global capital accumulation to the persistence of imperialism, from the problem of political organisation to the issue of revolutionary transition. Although like many Marxists of her generation, Luxemburg was less interested in abstract theoretical analysis and more in how to deploy that analysis as a tool for political change, her reflections remain a crucial starting point to develop critical thinking in at least three domains. Firstly, there is the question of how to think about political power in the context of a global capitalist structure facing continuous crisis, and where the burdens of that crisis are distributed disproportionally on oppressed groups of people whose different identities do not neatly overlap with the boundaries between nation states. Luxemburg’s remarks on imperialism and capitalist accumulation offer a productive starting point to think about social justice in a way that is historically nuanced, sensitive to the development of global capitalism and that escapes the methodological nationalist straightjacket that often characterises liberal thinking on unequal development. The second is the question of political organisation, the relevance of education, and the costs of transition from one system of laws to another. Here Luxemburg’s analysis is useful to think about the ethics of revolution and to orient the debate about how to learn from the trials and failures of progressive movements of the past in a way that combines radical commitments with awareness of the necessity of compromise. Finally, her writings are crucial to alert us to different forms of oppression that still afflict our world, and to think about them in an intersectional way that brings together the concerns of gender, race and class. They enable us to articulate a richer analysis of the capitalist system which is genuinely inclusive of the history, theory and practice of oppressed groups of people in different parts of the globe and that tries to unify these concerns instead of isolating them from each other. For all these reasons, and despite the unique, tragic, circumstances in which she lived and died, Rosa Luxemburg is a contemporary rather than a martyr.


Primary Literature: Works by Rosa Luxemburg

Translations and Collections

The main sources for Luxemburg's work are as follows, where the abbreviations used for citations in the text are in bold:

1913, Die Akkumulation des Kapitals, Berlin: Paul Singer; translated as The Accumulation of Capital, Agnes Schwarzschild (trans.), London: Routledge, 2003 [1951].
The Complete Works, Peter Hudis (ed.), London: Verso, 2013.
The Rosa Luxemburg Reader, Peter Hudis and Kevin Anderson (eds.), New York: Monthly Review Press, 2004.

Individual Original Works

  • 1900, “Social Reform or Revolution” [“Sozialreform oder Revolution?”], Dick Howard (trans.), in [RLR], pp. 128–167.
  • 1902, “Women's Suffrage and Class Struggle” [“Frauenwahlrecht und Klassenkampf”], Rosmarie Waldrop (trans.), in [RLR], pp. 237–242.
  • 1905, “ The Mass Strike, the Political Party and the Trade Union” [“Massenstreik, Partei und Gewerkschaften”], Patrick Lavan (trans.), in [RLR], pp. 168–199.
  • 1925, “Introduction to Political Economy” [“Einführung in die Nationalökonomie”], David Fernbach (trans.), in [CW], pp. 89–300.
  • 1914, “The Proletarian Woman” [“Die Proletarierin”], Ashley Passmore and Kevin B. Anderson (trans.), in [RLR], pp. 242–245.
  • 1915, “The ‘Junius’ Pamphlet: The Crisis of German Social Democracy” [“Die Krise der Sozialdemokratie: Die ‘Junius’ Broschüre”], Dave Hollis (trans.), in [RLR], pp. 312–341.
  • 1922, “The Russian Revolution” [“Zur russischen Revolution”], Bertram Wolfe (trans.), in [RLR], pp. 281–311. Excerpt included on p. 25 of [RLR] Introduction, pp. 7–30, by Peter Hudis and Kevin B. Anderson.

Secondary Literature

  • Bellofiore, R. (ed.), 2009, Rosa Luxemburg and the Critique of Political Economy, London: Routledge.
  • Blanc, Eric, 2017, “The Rosa Luxemburg Myth: A Critique of Luxemburg’s Politics in Poland (1893–1919).” Historical Materialism, 25(4): 3–36.
  • Brewer, Anthony, 1990, Marxist Theories of Imperialism : A Critical Survey, 2nd edition, London: Routledge.
  • Brie, Michael, and Jörn Schütrumpf, 2021, Rosa Luxemburg : A Revolutionary Marxist at the Limits of Marxism, Basingstoke: Palgrave.
  • Čakardić, Ankica, 2017, “From Theory of Accumulation to Social-Reproduction Theory”, Historical Materialism, 25(4): 37–64.
  • Callinicos, Alex, 2009, Imperialism and Global Political Economy, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Dunayevskaya, Raya, 1981, Rosa Luxemburg, Women's Liberation, and Marx's Philosophy of Revolution, Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • Eley, Geoff, 1980, “The Legacy of Rosa Luxemburg”, Critique, 12(1): 139–49.
  • Ettinger, Elzbieta, 1987, Rosa Luxemburg : A Life, London: Harrap.
  • Frölich, Paul, 1940 [2010], Rosa Luxemburg: Her Life and Work, Edward Fitzgerald (trans.), London: Victor Gollanz; reprinted.
  • Geras, Norman, 1976 [2015], The Legacy of Rosa Luxemburg, London: Verso.
  • Haug, Frigga, 2007, Rosa Luxemburg Und Die Kunst Der Politik, Hamburg: Argument.
  • Holmstrom, Nancy, 2017, “Luxemburg: A Legacy for Feminists?”, Socialist Register, 12(1): 187–90.
  • Lenin, V. I., 1929 [1987], ‘What is to be Done?’, in Essential Works of Lenin, Henry M. Christman (ed.), New York: Dover.
  • Marx, Karl, 1887 [1990], Capital: A Critique of Political Economy (Volume 1), London: Penguin.
  • Nettl, Joachim P., 1966 [2019], Rosa Luxemburg, London: Verso.
  • Pradella, Lucia, 2013, “Imperialism and Capitalist Development in Marx’s Capital”, Historical Materialism, 21(2): 117–47.
  • Scott, Helen, 2021, “Rosa Luxemburg and Postcolonial Criticism: A Reconsideration”, Spectre Journal, April 5, 2021 [Scott 2021 available online].
  • Sweezy, Paul M., 1967, “Rosa Luxemburg's The Accumulation of Capital”, Science & Society, 31(4): 474–85.
  • Toporowski, Jan, 2009, “Rosa Luxemburg and Finance”, in R. Bellofiore (ed.), Rosa Luxemburg and the Critique of Political Economy, Abington: Routledge, 81–91.
  • Ypi, Lea, 202, “Democratic Dictatorship: Political Legitimacy in Marxist Perspective”, European Journal of Philosophy, 28(2): 277–91.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2022 by
Lea Ypi <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free