Moses ben Maimon [known to English speaking audiences as Maimonides and Hebrew speaking as Rambam] (1138–1204) is the greatest Jewish philosopher of the medieval period and is still widely read today. The Mishneh Torah, his 14-volume compendium of Jewish law, established him as the leading rabbinic authority of his time and quite possibly of all time. His philosophic masterpiece, the Guide of the Perplexed, is a sustained treatment of Jewish thought and practice that seeks to resolve the conflict between religious knowledge and secular. Although heavily influenced by the Neo-Platonized Aristotelianism that had taken root in Islamic circles, it departs from prevailing modes of Aristotelian thought by emphasizing the limits of human knowledge and the questionable foundations of significant parts of astronomy and metaphysics. Maimonides also achieved fame as a physician and wrote medical treatises on a number of diseases and their cures. Succeeding generations of philosophers wrote extensive commentaries on his works, which influenced thinkers as diverse as Aquinas, Spinoza, Leibniz, and Newton.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Fundamental Orientation
- 3. Demythologized Religion
- 4. God and the Via Negativa
- 5. Creation
- 6. Practical Philosophy
- 7. Esotericism
- 8. Conclusion
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1. Life and Works
Maimonides was born to a distinguished family in Cordova, Spain in 1138. At that point, Cordova was under Muslim rule and stood as one of the great intellectual centers of the world. In addition to Maimonides, it was the birthplace of Averroes. But events took a turn for the worse when the Almohads invaded in 1148 and offered all non-Muslims the choice of conversion, exile, or death. Maimonides’ family was forced to leave Cordova and travel through southern Spain and arrived in Fez, Morocco in 1160. His first philosophic work of note was the Treatise on the Art of Logic. Around this time, he began work on his first religious masterpiece, the Commentary on the Mishnah, which was finished in 1168. It is noteworthy for the emphasis Maimonides places on Oral Torah, by which he means the details, specifications, and interpretations derived from the Written Torah, which was revealed to Moses at Sinai.
It is also noteworthy for Maimonides’ commentary on Chapter 10 of the Mishnaic tractate Sanhedrin. While discussing the claim that all Israel has a share in the world to come, Maimonides lists 13 principles that he considers binding on every Jew: the existence of God, the absolute unity of God, the incorporeality of God, the eternity of God, that God alone is to be worshipped, that God communicates to prophets, that Moses is the greatest prophet, that the Torah was given by God, that the Torah is immutable, that there is divine providence, that there is divine punishment and reward, that there will be a Messiah, that the dead will be resurrected. This was the first attempt to introduce articles of faith to Judaism and set off a controversy that persists to this day (Kellner 1986, 1999).
Maimonides arrived in Egypt in 1166 and eventually settled in Fustat, a section of Cairo. With the publication of the Mishneh Torah, he established himself as a thinker for the ages. Not only does this work systematize all the commandments of the Torah, it tries to show that every part of Jewish law serves a rational purpose and nothing is given for the sake of mere obedience.
Of particular note are Book One (The Book of Knowledge), which sets forth the philosophic foundations of Jewish belief, a theory of moral traits or dispositions, the need to study the Torah, the laws concerning idolatry, and the importance of repentance. Also of note is Book Fourteen (Judges), which ends by arguing that a Messiah will come, restore sovereignty to Israel, establish peace with the other nations, and lead the world in the study of science and philosophy. By contrast, the Messiah will not make people rich, introduce changes in the Torah, or be required to perform miracles.
The Guide of the Perplexed was completed in 1190 and contains Maimonides’ most extensive philosophic discussions. Ostensibly a letter written to an advanced student who cannot decide whether to follow philosophy or the teachings of his religion, it is in reality much more: a commentary on biblical terms that appear to ascribe corporeal qualities to God, an uncompromising defense of negative theology, an extended critique of the kalam, a systematic treatment of creation, prophecy, and providence, and a theory of jurisprudence.
According to Maimonides, all of Jewish law aims at two things: the improvement of the body and the improvement of the soul. The former is in every case a means to the latter. The soul is improved by acquiring correct opinions and eventually knowledge on everything humans are capable of knowing. The more knowledge the soul acquires, the more it is able to fulfill the commandment (Deuteronomy 6:5) to love God. The biggest stumbling block to love of God is the belief that the only way to remain true to the Bible is to interpret it literally. The result of literal interpretation is a material conception of God, which, in Maimonides’ opinion, amounts to idolatry.
The Guide has long been considered a controversial work and in some rabbinic circles was originally banned. By rejecting literal interpretation, it raises the question of whether Maimonides’ reading of the Torah corresponds to what the prophets understood or represents a philosophic reconstruction that owes more to Aristotle and Alfarabi than it does to Moses. It also raises the question of whether the real meaning of the Torah is too controversial to be taught to the average worshipper and should be restricted to the educated few; in short the question of esotericism.
Maimonides’ last two works of note are the Treatise on Resurrection, published in 1191, and the Letter on Astrology, published in 1195. The former was written in answer to the charge that while he may profess belief in bodily resurrection, Maimonides did not really hold it. The charge is not without merit given that Maimonides’ conception of the afterlife is purely intellectual and that his naturalism makes him suspicious of miracles. He defends himself by saying that the important issue is not whether and how resurrection will occur but whether it is possible for it to occur. As for the latter, once one accepts belief in creation, the possibility of bodily resurrection follows immediately. The Letter on Astrology was written at a time when many people believed that the heavenly bodies exert influence over human events. Nevertheless, he argues that there is no scientific basis for this belief and that it should be abandoned even if support for it can be found in the sacred literature.
Facing ever-growing demands on his time, Maimonides worked himself into a state of exhaustion and died in Fostat in 1204. An old saying has it that from Moses to Moses, there was none like Moses.
2. Fundamental Orientation
Maimonides presents a challenge to the modern reader because his view of truth is totally unhistorical. We saw that he was guided by the need to systematize. Given 613 original commandments, he argues that all are means to the fulfillment of the first two, which he interprets as belief in the existence of God and rejection of idolatry. Together these commandments make up what we call monotheism. From Maimonides’ perspective, however, there is more to monotheism than belief in a single deity. To satisfy the first two commandments, one must believe in a timeless, changeless, immaterial deity who is one in every respect and unlike anything in the created order. A person who fails to recognize such a deity is accorded the status of an idolater no matter how many other commandments she may fulfill or how fervently she may fulfill them. Simply put, to worship God under a false description is not to worship God at all. Not only is this true at present, as Maimonides sees it, it has been true since God first spoke to Adam.
Early in the Guide (1.2), Maimonides argues that Adam is depicted as having the most perfect metaphysical knowledge a human being can achieve prior to his expulsion from the Garden of Eden. By necessity this would have to include belief in a timeless, changeless, immaterial deity. Even if the biblical text makes no mention of Adam’s theology, Maimonides thinks (MT 14 Kings and Wars, 9.1) it would be impossible for someone to be this close to God and harbor a fundamental misunderstanding. Unfortunately Adam’s knowledge was lost during the time of Enosh and had to be rediscovered by Abraham (MT 1, Idolatry, 1.1–2; GP 3.29). Again Maimonides thinks he is justified in saying that Abraham discovered proofs for the existence of a God who is neither a body nor a force in a body even though the Bible is silent on such matters. These proofs were supposedly passed down to Isaac and Jacob but lost during the Egyptian captivity when the Israelites adopted the pagan beliefs of their captors.
When Moses arose to lead the people out of captivity, he faced a serious problem. If all he did were to offer philosophic proofs again, the people would forget them just as they had forgotten before. So instead of offering proofs alone, he offered the blueprint for a social order that would help the people remember their history and the principles on which it is founded. That is why in addition to the first two commandments, there are 611 others designed to create an environment in which people will have the time, health, and mental facility needed to grasp the truth of monotheism (GP 3.27–28).
Judaism then is based on a particular philosophy. Maimonides (GP 1.71) takes this to mean that before Plato and Aristotle introduced science and philosophy to the Greeks, the patriarchs introduced it to Israel. To someone who asks why we have no explicit record of their philosophy, Maimonides answers that any record of such teaching was destroyed when Israel went into exile and suffered persecution. So despite the appearance of a split between Jerusalem and Athens, Maimonides thinks there is only one tradition worth preserving: that which affirms the truth.
He makes this point in the Introduction to the Guide when he says that what Jewish tradition taught under the guise of ma’aseh bereishit (the account of the beginning) is what Greeks thinkers taught as physics, while what Jewish tradition taught under the guise of ma’aseh merkavah (the account of [Ezekiel’s] chariot) is what Greek thinkers taught under the guise of metaphysics. In short, Jewish tradition has always been philosophical. The problem is that these subjects are too difficult for the average worshipper to grasp and must be expressed as parables or metaphors that the educated few will interpret at one level and the average worshipper at another (Stern 2013).
Looking at his own situation, Maimonides concludes that the tradition of learning that began in Israel has been lost once again. People pray to a material God and justify their actions on the basis of literal interpretation. Someone was needed to reverse this situation and reintroduce Jews to the teachings of their own tradition. Strictly speaking, such truths are Jewish only in the sense that Jews were the first to discover them. From an ethnic standpoint, they are no more Jewish than the Pythagorean theorem is Greek.
All this goes to show that Maimonides did not conceive of progress as we do. Although he regarded mastery of science and philosophy as essential parts of human perfection, he did not view them as cumulative. Rather than take us into new territory, his goal was to reacquaint us with the territory that Moses and the patriarchs had already staked out. The important truths do not change. Human progress is measured by the degree to which they are identified and understood. That is why the primary function of the Messiah will be to teach these truths and help create conditions in which more people are able to reflect on them.
3. Demythologized Religion
It is clear that the religion Maimonides envisions is not the normal kind. He recognizes that when one is first exposed to Bible stories and the ritual of daily prayer, one may need anthropomorphic descriptions of God and promises of material reward. As he points out time and again, the Torah speaks in the language of ordinary people. If it did not, its appeal would be greatly reduced. But, Maimonides continues, the purpose of the religion is to get one to the point where these things cease to matter and are eventually overcome.
To take a few examples, the Bible often suggests that a prophet, or in one case the elders of Israel, saw God (e.g., Exodus 24:10, Numbers 12:8, Isaiah 6:1–3, Ezekiel 1:26–29). Maimonides counters (GP 1.4) by saying that the kind of seeing involved is intellectual rather than visual — as when one sees her way to the solution of a geometry problem. By the same token, when God is described as near or close, the Bible is not talking about physical location but intellectual apprehension — as when scientists say they are close to finding a cure for a disease (GP 1.18). The many places where the Bible says that God spoke to a prophet do not indicate that God has vocal cords that produce sound but that the prophet came to understand what God wants (GP 1.65). In a more complicated way, Jacob’s dream refers to the hierarchical structure of the physical world and represents the path the philosopher follows from knowledge of the sublunar realm to knowledge of the spheres and awareness of the existence of God (GP 1.15).
Again one is inclined to ask: Is this the religion of the prophets or a philosophically sanitized religion concocted by a medieval thinker under the sway of Aristotle? Maimonides would reply that there is no difference. The highest human achievement is the perfection of the intellect (GP 3.27), which is impossible without the pursuit of truth. As a sacred document, the Bible is a source of truth. While the truths contained in the Bible may not always be apparent, we know in principle that they are there if one wishes to dig deeply enough. It follows that if one’s interpretation ascribes to the Bible a doctrine that is demonstrably false, such as the claim that God is corporeal, the interpretation is incorrect no matter how simple or straightforward it may seem. Should human knowledge advance and come up with demonstrations it previously lacked, we would have no choice but to return to the Bible and alter our interpretation to take account of them (GP 2.24). Anything else would be intellectually dishonest.
Where does this take us? In the Parable of the Palace (GP 3.51), Maimonides describes the person who enters the inner habitation of the King as:
He … who has achieved demonstration, to the extent that it is possible, of everything that may be demonstrated; and who has ascertained in divine matters, to the extent that that is possible, everything that may be ascertained; and who has come close to certainty in those matters in which one can only come close to it …
This is not just an intellectual achievement but a spiritual one as well. In Maimonides’ opinion, it is the goal to which all of the commandments of the Torah point. There is an obvious sense of satisfaction that goes with this, but it has nothing to do with satisfaction material needs or “ecstasy” as normally understood.
4. God and the Via Negativa
Maimonides offers several proofs for the existence of God, all of which are versions of the cosmological argument (GP 2.1). Rather than begin with a definition of God and try to show that God’s essence implies existence, he begins with a description of the world as we know it and tries to show that it implies the existence of God. According to one such argument, we assume that the heavenly bodies are engaged in eternal motion. We then recognize that it is impossible for there to be an infinite body or an infinite number of finite bodies. So every corporeal thing is finite. If it is finite, it can only contain a finite amount of power. If it can only contain a finite amount of power, it can only explain motion over a finite period of time. Because the heavenly bodies are always moving, the only thing that can explain that motion is an infinite power. Because an infinite power cannot be contained in a finite thing, it cannot be corporeal. If it is not corporeal, it is not subject to division or change. Seeing that its power is infinite, it cannot derive that power from something else. Thus the only way to explain the motion of the heavenly bodies is to posit the existence of a being that is neither a body nor a force in a body.
Although Maimonides thinks this argument gives us sufficient grounds for saying that God is, he does not think it provides any grounds for saying what God is. To see why not, we have to recognize that God is not one in a way comparable to anything else: one person, one number, one idea. According to Guide 1.51:
There is no oneness at all except in believing that there is one simple essence in which there is no complexity or multiplicity of notions, but one notion only; so that from whatever angle you regard it and from whatever point of view you consider it, you will find that it is one, not divided in any way and by any cause into two notions …
If Maimonides is right, there can be no plurality of faculties, moral dispositions, or essential attributes in God. Even to say that God is all-knowing, all-powerful, and all-good is to introduce plurality, if one means thereby that these qualities are separate attributes. The same is true if we say that God is a composite of matter and form, genus and specific difference, or essence and accident. All introduce plurality where none can be tolerated.
Aside from religious considerations, plurality is objectionable because it compromises logical priority. If God were a composite of F and G, some reason would have to be found for what brought them together and keeps them together. In short, if God were a composite, there would have to be a cause prior to God, which is absurd (GP 2. Intro., premise 21). For the same reason, God cannot be subsumed under a wider concept as man is subsumed under animal (GP 1.52). Once God fell under a genus, there would be something prior to or more inclusive than God, either of which is absurd. Without a genus or a minimal form of composition, there is no possibility of defining God and thus no possibility of saying what God is. Even superlatives are of no help. To say that God is the wisest or most powerful thing in the universe is still to subsume God under a wider description.
Worse, to say that God is the wisest or most powerful thing is to imply that God’s wisdom or power bears some likeness to ours. This Maimonides firmly denies (GP 1.56–57). The power manifested by a body is finite and can be measured in foot/pounds. No matter how powerful it is, we can easily imagine something whose power is greater. What is more, if we are talking about the power of a body, it always makes sense to ask from what it derives its power or how its power is related to something else, e.g. its goodness. None of this is true of God. Maimonides therefore concludes (GP 1.56) that it is not true to say that God’s power is greater than ours, that God’s life is more permanent than ours, than God’s knowledge is broader than ours, or that God’s will is more universal than ours, if that means that God can be put on the same scale as something else, that God is a bigger, stronger, better version of something in the created order.
Does that mean that statements like “God lives” or “God is powerful” are nonsense? The answer is yes if one insists on interpreting them as normal subject/predicate propositions. But they can be understood if one analyzes them as disguised negations. Thus “God is powerful” should be taken as “God is not lacking in power.” Maimonides’ appeal to negation (GP 1.58) is often misunderstood because in normal speech a double negative usually indicates a positive. If I say that this dog is not lacking in the power of sight, you would be justified in concluding that it can see for the simple reason that sight is a power normally associated with dogs. What Maimonides has in mind is a more extreme form of negation. Thus “God is powerful” means “God does not lack power or possess it in a way that makes it comparable to other things.” Can God do something like move a book off a shelf? Yes, to the extent that God does not lack power but no to the extent that God does not have to move muscles, summon energy, or receive a supply of food or fuel. The power to create the whole universe is so far beyond that needed to move a book that any comparison cannot help but mislead.
From an epistemological standpoint, a statement like “God is powerful” is objectionable in so far as it implies that we have insight into the essence of God. The advantage of the negative formulation is that it implies nothing of the sort. To say that God does not lack power or possess it in a way comparable to other things is to say that God’s power is beyond our comprehension. And similarly for God’s life, wisdom, unity, or will. Thus most of the terms we use to describe God are completely equivocal as between God and us. There is then no reason to think that every time we praise God, we are identifying a separate part of the divine persona and comparing it to something else.
As severe as Maimonides’ position is, even this is not enough. Although negation is preferable to affirmation, even negation is objectionable to the degree that it introduces complexity: God is neither this nor that. What then? Maimonides’ reply (GP 1.58) is that ultimately any kind of verbal expression fails us. Rather than provide a precise metaphysical account of the nature of God, the purpose of theological discourse is heuristic: to “conduct the mind toward the utmost reach that man may attain in the apprehension of Him.” Theological language is important to the degree that it eliminates error and sets us along the path of recognizing God’s transcendence. Unless one could speak about God, she could easily fall into the trap of thinking that God is corporeal. But in the end, the only thing it reveals is that God is beyond the reach of any subject/predicate proposition. Thus GP 1.59:
Know that when you make an affirmation ascribing another thing to Him, you become more remote from Him in two respects: one of them is that everything You affirm is a perfection only with reference to us, And the other is that He does not possess a thing other than His essence …
Citing Psalm 65, Maimonides concludes that the highest form of praise we can give God is silence.
Maimonides knows (GP 3.32) that a religion based entirely on silent reflection would never succeed, and insists that daily prayer is mandatory (MT 2, Prayer, 1.1). His point is that the qualities mentioned in prayer are either negations or descriptions of the effects of divine activity; in no case do they provide knowledge of God’s essence. To illustrate this point, he asks us to consider the effect of fire on various things that could be put before it. It would soften wax, harden clay, blacken sugar, and whiten other things. This does not mean that fire is soft, hard, black, and white simultaneously but that it has these effects on various things.
Applying this analogy to God, we can say that God is merciful to the extent that the order of nature (what God created) exhibits merciful characteristics and angry to the extent that it is harsh toward things that do not take proper care of themselves. The point is not that God possesses emotions similar to ours but that the effects of God’s actions resemble the effects of ours. Maimonides refers to these qualities as attributes of action and identifies them with the goodness God revealed to Moses at Exodus 33. In that passage, God refuses to let Moses see the divine face (which Maimonides identifies with essence) but allows him to see God’s backside (which Maimonides identifies with the consequences or effects that flow from God). We can therefore praise God as long as we realize that all such praise is indirect and leaves God’s essence undescribed and unknowable.
Throughout the Guide, Maimonides considers four accounts of creation: that of the kalam, Moses, Plato, and Aristotle. He rejects the kalam account (GP 1.71–73) according which one demonstrates that the universe must have been created and then reasons that if it was created, it must have a creator. Like Thomas Aquinas, Maimonides believes it is impossible to show by logical considerations alone either that the universe was created or that it is eternal. Though Maimonides says he believes in creation, he admits one can do no more than tip the scales in this direction. As of Guide 2.13, he limits his discussion to the theories of Moses, Plato, and Aristotle.
Unfortunately Maimonides’ characterizations of these alternatives are neither precise nor historically accurate (Seeskin 2005). Suffice it to say that his treatment of them is mainly thematic. Briefly stated, they are:
|Moses:||the world was created de novo and entirely ex nihilo.|
|Plato:||the world was created de novo from a preexisting material substrate.|
|Aristotle:||the world is eternal and its existence is best understood as eternal information of matter.|
Based on his explicit remarks, Maimonides prefers the theory of Moses but allows one to hold that of Plato as a reasonable alternative. But there has always been a school of thought that maintains that he is secretly committed to the view of Aristotle (Harvey 1981). My own position is with those who argue that Maimonides’ explicit remarks are an accurate account of his view and that all the arguments he offers point in that direction (Davidson 1979, Feldman 1990, Hyman 1988, Wolfson 1973).
The historical Aristotle did argue that the world is eternal and that whatever is eternal is necessary [On Generation and Corruption 338a1–4, Physics 203b 29, Metaphysics 1050b8–15]. His medieval followers took this to mean that while the world is ontologically dependent on God, there is no moment when it first comes to be and therefore does not owe its existence to a decision to create. As we might say, it exists not because of anything God does but simply because of what God is. Because God’s nature does not change, according to this position, neither does the existence or fundamental structure of the world. The most important consequence of this view is that God does not exercise free choice, which is to say that according to the Aristotelian alternative, the world is governed by necessity.
The standard arguments in favor of this position take one of two approaches: either they show that there is something inherent in the nature of the world that makes creation impossible or that there is something inherent in the nature of God that does. An example of the former is that change always proceeds from something to something else, as when a chicken springs from an egg or an acorn develops into a full grown oak tree. If this is true, it is impossible for something to come to be from nothing (ex nihilo). An example of the latter is that if God is perfect, it makes no sense to suppose that God could ever do anything new such as bring the world into being.
Maimonides’ answer to the first argument (GP 2.17) is that given the world as we know it, change does proceed from one thing to something else. But why should we assume the creation of the world has to follow the same pattern? An account of creation is a theory of origin, how a thing comes to be initially. By contrast, an account of change is a theory of development or alteration, how one existing thing emerges into another. For all we know, the origin of a thing may be completely different from its development later on. Thus it is presumptuous to suppose that we can extrapolate from our experience of the world as it is at present to the moment of its creation. It follows that the first argument against creation is not decisive, which means that creation remains a possibility.
Maimonides’ answer to the second argument (GP 2.18) is that in a perfect being, willing something new need not imply change. If I will today to take a trip tomorrow and events intercede to spoil my plans, I may have to change my mind, but to suppose that something analogous happens to God is absurd. Assume I will today to do something tomorrow independent of external circumstances — to think about the numerical characteristics of pi. And assume that when tomorrow comes, I do exactly as planned. While I would be undertaking something new, to the degree that I had intended to do it all along, it would be misleading to say that I underwent a change. Certainly I did not undergo a change of mind.
Maimonides takes this to mean that it is possible for a being not affected by external circumstances to will something new as long as it is part of his original intention. This is sometimes expressed by saying that changing one’s will is not the same as willing change. So once again, the argument against creation is not decisive.
Maimonides is aware that all his arguments establish is the possibility of creation, not its actuality. To go further, and argue for the actuality of creation, he returns to the claim that everything that is eternal is necessary. If it could be shown that there are features of the world that are not necessary, it would follow that the world must have been created. Here Maimonides challenges Aristotle and his followers on the issue of astronomy.
Medieval Aristotelians believed as follows. God thinks and manifests self-awareness. Because God is one and simple, what emerges from God must be one and simple as well. In this way, God generates the first heavenly intelligence. According to Alfarabi, because the first intelligence is aware of two things — itself and God — it is capable of generating two things: the second heavenly intelligence and the outermost sphere of the universe. By contrast, Avicenna held that because the first intelligence is aware of God and duality in itself, it generates three things. The difference need not concern us here. The important point is that God’s production of the outermost sphere is indirect; the immediate cause is the activity of the first intelligence. The process continues until we get the ten intelligences and nine primary spheres that make up the standard picture of medieval cosmology.
Maimonides criticizes this account in two ways. First if the originator of a causal sequence is one and simple, there is no way for complexity to arise, and everything else in the sequence should be one and simple as well (GP 2.22). Even if the sequence contains thousands of members, there is no way to account for the complexity of a celestial sphere, which is a composite of matter and form. When we get to the inner spheres, we have to account for even more because not only is there the sphere itself but the stars or planets attached to it. They too are composites of matter and form. How can we have such complexity if we start with something that is radically one?
Second, there are features of the heavenly bodies that defy scientific explanation and thus appear to be contingent in the sense that they were chosen rather than necessitated (GP 2.19–24). If the outer spheres impart motion to the inner ones, we would expect spherical motion to slow as we move closer to the earth. But this is hardly the case. As Maimonides points out (GP 2.19):
We see that in case of some spheres, the swifter of motion is above the slower; that in the case of others, the slower of motion is above the swifter; and that, again in another case, the motions of the spheres are of equal velocity though one be above the other. There are also other very grave matters if regarded from the point of view these things are as they are in virtue of necessity.
If there is no explanation for why the spheres behave in this fashion, or why some stars and planets emit more light than others, or why some regions of the heavens are relatively crowded while others are empty, there is no reason to think the phenomena in question are what they are by virtue of necessity. If there is no necessity, there are no grounds for eternity. The alternative is to say that God created the world as a result of a free choice and fashioned it in a particular way.
Maimonides recognizes (GP 2.24) that his argument does not constitute a demonstration. Just because science cannot explain something now, it does not follow that it will never be able to explain it. As he himself admits, science can and does make progress. But in the case of the heavenly bodies, he thought progress very unlikely. Because they too far away to make close observations, and too high in rank, we can only rely on inferences based on accidental qualities size, speed, and direction. As long as this is true, we will never know their essential natures and will never be able to support claims of necessity. As long as this is true, creation, though not demonstrated, will always be preferable to eternity.
Maimonides (GP 2.25) also offers a practical reason for believing in creation: How can a God without free will issue commandments? Beyond this there is a textual reason: belief in creation does less violence to scripture than belief in eternity. He concludes that the theory of Moses offers the best alternative, while that of Plato, which retains the idea of creation de novo, is acceptable. Though some people fault Maimonides for not coming up with a stronger argument on behalf of Moses, he would reply by saying that given the limits of our knowledge, this is the strongest argument we can expect. Although Maimonides is often seen as part of the Aristotelian tradition, and often expresses praise for Aristotle, his account of creation indicate that he is willing to depart from Aristotle when he thinks the arguments lead in that direction.
6. Practical Philosophy
We have already seen that for Maimonides the highest perfection is intellectual and consists in ascertaining in divine matters everything that can be ascertained. Proper behavior, whether for the individual or the community, is a means to this end (GP 3.27). On a political level, this means that the state must do more than protect life and property; it must see to it that all its citizens are educated in religious matters and that a small number achieve mastery (GP 2.40). On a personal level, it means that morality is not an end in itself but a way of controlling the passions and creating an atmosphere in which science and philosophy can flourish (GP 3.8). While intellectual perfection is oriented to truth and falsity and aims at demonstration, moral perfection is oriented to good and bad and rests on commonly accepted opinions.
Accordingly Adam was blessed with perfect metaphysical knowledge in the Garden of Eden but still did not know that it is wrong not to cover one’s genitals. Although this knowledge cannot be known with scientific precision, it does not follow that it is arbitrary. On the contrary, it is among the most basic customs one can imagine. Maimonides expresses this point (GP 2.40) by saying that revealed law “although it is not natural, enters into what is natural.” I take this to mean that unlike scientific truth, law presupposes a social context and a sense of shame. In Maimonides’ opinion, it still needs to be studied in detail. Thus the quote continues: “It is a part of the wisdom of the deity with regard to the permanence of this species.”
Maimonides’ practical philosophy begins with Eight Chapters, an introduction to his commentary on the tractate Pirkei Avot and part of his Commentary on the Mishnah. In concert with Plato and Aristotle, he holds that like the body, the soul can be diseased or healthy. Just as those with sick bodies seek a physician, those with sick souls need to seek the wise rulers, who are physicians of the soul. Not surprisingly major portions of his work attempt to show that Jewish law is based on a thorough understanding of the soul and the conditions needed for its perfection. Chief among them is the attainment of a mean between extremes. In Eight Chapters 3, he writes: “The virtues are states of the soul and settled dispositions in the mean between two bad states, one of which is excessive, the other deficient.” Later, in the first book of the Mishneh Torah (1, Character Traits, 1.4), he follows up by saying: “The right way is the mean in every one of a person’s character traits.”
Like Aristotle, Maimonides recognizes there will be variations from one person to another and that sometimes a person may have to overshoot the mean for therapeutic reasons (Eight Chapters 4 and MT 1, Character Traits, 2.2). Also like Aristotle, he stresses that virtue is a habit that can only be developed by practice. A wise ruler will therefore prescribe actions and moral habits that must be repeated until they are no longer burdensome and become part of a person’s character. If a person develops the wrong habits and goes to excess, the ruler “must follow the same course in treating it as in the medical treatment of bodies,” which is to reestablish equilibrium (“Eight Chapters” 4).
Maimonides claims his theory is sound in its own right and can be distilled from the sayings of the prophets and sages. He offers Psalm 19:8 (“The law of the Lord is perfect, restoring the soul; the testimony of the Lord is sure, making wise the simple”) as evidence that the Bible recognizes the idea of psychic health and disease. He also connects adherence to the mean with the doctrine of imitatio Dei (imitation of God), by arguing that (GP 2.28): “The works of the deity are most perfect, and with regard to them there is no possibility of an excess or a deficiency.” As God governs nature, so Maimonides thinks, the wise ruler will attempt to govern society.
It is true, as Maimonides says many times, that Jewish law does not ask people to live as hermits, starve themselves, beat themselves, or jeopardize their health. Though it allows for a category of extremists in the laws dealing with the Nazirite, Maimonides is right to say that it treats the Nazirite with suspicion (“Eight Chapters” 4). The qualities that really matter are good judgment, kindness, and compassion — all things Maimonides explains by going back to the doctrine of the mean. People are asked to give to charity, honor their parents, refrain from certain sexual relations, not hate or take vengeance, and not eat certain foods in order establish a moderate disposition. By the same token, the holidays are arranged so that some involve rejoicing while others involve moderate forms of self-denial. In no case does the law require anything for the sake of obedience alone.
Maimonides points out there are cases where the analogy between body and soul breaks down, in particular the fact that legal reasoning is different from medical reasoning. The physician does not treat the concept humanity but the particular person who comes to her. But this is not true of the law, which, in Maimonides’ opinion (GP 3.34), treats the general case and pays no attention to rarities. That is why the law is not dependent on time and place but tries to establish a standard that is absolute and universal. To take a modern example, the law prescribes a limit to the amount of alcohol a person can have in his blood and still be able to drive. Undoubtedly there are variations among individuals that allow one person with a certain amount of alcohol to be much more alert than another. But it is not the purpose of the law to take these differences into account. All it can do is set a norm and enforce it equally.
Still anyone familiar with Maimonides will see that acceptance of the mean is hard to reconcile with other aspects of his thought. When he describes God as governor of the universe balancing justice with mercy, the doctrine of the mean makes good sense; when he describes God as lacking emotion and incomparable to anything in the created order, it does not. Similarly, when he describes prophets as law-givers, the mean is an appropriate standard; when he describes them as people who begrudge the time they spend with others and prefer to contemplate God alone in silent meditation (GP 3.51), it fails.
Much has been written on which of these approaches represents Maimonides’ real view (Fox 1990, Davidson 1987, Schwarzschild 1990). Fortunately we do not have to survey all of this literature because the problem arises in the space of a few paragraphs in MT 1, Character Traits, 1.4–6. Unlike “Eight Chapters,” where the only justification for overshooting the mean is therapeutic, this passage recognizes that there are times when deviation from the mean represents a higher standard. As Maimonides puts it, a person whose character traits are balanced can be called wise (hakham), while a person who goes beyond the mean when circumstances warrant is known as pious (hasid):
Whoever moves away from a haughty heart to the opposite extreme so that he is exceedingly lowly in spirit is called pious; this is the measure of piety. If someone moves only to the mean and is humble, he is called wise; this is the measure of wisdom. The same applies to all the rest of the character traits. The pious of old used to direct their character traits from the middle way toward one of the two extremes; some character traits toward the last extreme, and some toward the first extreme. This is the meaning of “inside the line of the law” [i.e. going beyond the letter of the law].
Piety then involves going beyond the mean to a higher standard. In this connection Maimonides cites Numbers 12:3, which does not say that Moses was meek but that he was very meek.
Similar remarks apply to Maimonides’ analysis of anger. For Aristotle [Nicomachean Ethics 1125b31–1126a8] a person should be praised for being angry with the right people in the right way and at the right time. A person who allows himself to be abused by insults without getting angry lacks feeling and behaves in a manner that is slavish. Virtue is worthy of honor. Just as it is wrong to ask for too much, it is equally wrong to ask for too little.
With respect to anger, Maimonides disagrees, claiming (MT 1, Character Traits, 2.3) it is “an extremely bad character trait” and that “it is proper for someone to move away from it to the other extreme and to teach himself not to be angry, even over something it is proper to be angry about” (Frank 1990). For Aristotle meekness indicates a loss of self-esteem; for Maimonides it is not a virtue but virtue par excellence. By ascribing it to Moses, he implies that it represents the highest level a person can achieve.
A similar sentiment is expressed earlier in the Mishneh Torah (1, Basic Principles, 4. 12), when Maimonides discusses the need to study physics and metaphysics. He concludes with praise for those who are lowly of spirit:
When a man reflects on these things, studies all these created beings, from the angels and spheres down to human beings and so on, and realizes the divine wisdom manifested in them all, his love for God will increase, his soul will thirst, his very flesh will yearn to love God. He will be filled with fear and trembling, as he becomes conscious of his lowly condition, poverty, and insignificance, and compares himself with any of the great and holy bodies; still more when he compares himself with any one of the pure forms that are incorporeal and have never had association with any corporeal substance. He will then realize that he is a vessel full of shame, dishonor, and reproach, empty and deficient.
It is not that Maimonides has abandoned the idea that nature avoids excess or deficiency but that he seems to be saying the highest level of human excellence sometimes requires an extreme. Thus Moses went without water for forty days and nights when he was alone on the mountain and attained such a high level of concentration that in Maimonides opinion “all the gross faculties in the body ceased to function.” Seen in this light, the highest goal is not practical wisdom in the Aristotelian sense but humility, awe, and shame in the presence of God.
In other places, Maimonides argues that our goal should not be to moderate emotion but to rise above it. We saw that God is not subject to emotion. Maimonides takes this to mean that the ideal state is one in which a person acts in a completely dispassionate way deciding cases on their merit without recourse to feeling. While such a person must still make the appropriate judgment, there will be no character trait or disposition from which it springs. According to Guide 1.54:
It behooves the governor of a city, if he is a prophet, to acquire similarity to these attributes [jealousy, hatred, or anger], so that these actions may proceed from him according to a determined measure and according to the deserts of the people who are affected by them and not merely because of his following a passion. He should not let loose the reins of anger nor let passion gain mastery over him, for all passions are evil; but, on the contrary, he should guard against them as far as this lies within the capacity of man. Sometimes, with regard to some people, he should be merciful and gracious, not out of mere compassion and pity, but in accordance with what is fitting.
In the treatise on Character Traits, he admits that there may be times when it is necessary for a person to show anger, but insists that inwardly she should remain completely tranquil.
What happened to balance and the idea of mental health? The answer is that while they are still valuable, they are not ends in themselves. Throughout his rabbinic and philosophic works, Maimonides insists (MT 1, Character Traits, 3.1) that it is impossible to love God and achieve the highest levels of concentration if one is sick, undisciplined, or living in fear of bodily harm. But in the end, moral perfection is only a necessary condition for intellectual perfection.
Like Plato, Maimonides believes in the therapeutic effects of philosophy. In the last chapter of the Guide (3.54), he claims that philosophy teaches that most of the things to which people direct their lives are “nothing but an effort with a view to something purely imaginary, to a thing that has no permanence.” Just as Job came to see that the things he once valued are unimportant, philosophy teaches us to give up our obsession with money, garments, and land and focus attention on the eternal.
In the end, the relation between moral and intellectual virtue is more complicated than Maimonides first presents. It is not just that the former is a means to the latter but that after the latter is achieved, after one comes to see that earthly goods are fleeting and ultimately unsatisfying, his behavior will undergo a transformation: rather than aim for a moderate amount of earthly goods, he will forgo them and spend as much time as possible in a state of awe and reverence, where the distinction between moral and intellectual perfection may even break down.
Since the publication of the Guide, scholars have struggled with a thorny issue: whether to take Maimonides’ words at face value or whether to take them as hints or clues pointing to a hidden or deeper meaning (Ravitzky 1981, 1990, 2005; Strauss 1952). By rejecting literal interpretation and playing down the importance of miracles, he knew he was taking a controversial stand. As he notes in the Introduction to the Guide, Jewish law prohibits one from discussing esoteric matters like the Account of the Beginning or the Account of the Chariot in public. The idea is that these matters should only be discussed with an advanced student capable of finding the truth on her own. In Maimonides’ view, both the Bible and the rabbinic commentaries that grew up around it are esoteric in the sense that the real meaning is often different from the surface or apparent meaning. The reason for this is that the people who read them have different levels of comprehension. But Maimonides goes further, saying that in some cases it is necessary for an author to contradict himself.
Of the seven reasons for using contradictions, Maimonides says he will avail himself of two. The first is relatively unproblematic: sometimes it is necessary for a teacher to say one thing to reach a student’s level of understanding and say something else when the student becomes more advanced. The second is more troublesome: on very obscure matters, it is necessary to launch a discussion that proceeds according to one assumption and later launch one that proceeds according to another. He then adds: “In such cases the vulgar must in no way be aware of the contradiction; the author accordingly uses some device to conceal it by all means.”
This raises several questions. (1) Does Maimonides employ contradictions of the troublesome variety? (2) If so, where? (3) Of two contradictory discussions, which represents his view? In the twentieth century, Leo Strauss argued that contradictions are central to understanding the Guide and that the more evidence Maimonides presents for a particular view, the less likely it is that he held it (Strauss 1952). There is general agreement that Maimonides’ writing is esoteric to the degree that he addresses difficult topics and does not put everything he has to say on a particular topic in any one place. The question is whether his esotericism goes deeper than this. We saw for example that he criticizes Aristotle’s on the eternity of the world. Does this mean that he believed in creation or that if you strip away the surface meaning, he is really committed to eternity? As often happens, one question leads to another: Do we settle the matter by examining the strength of his arguments or by looking for hidden clues? Of late the esotericist reading appears to be losing favor (Davidson 2005, Ivry 1991, Manekin 2005, Ravitzky 2005, Seeskin 2000).
How one assesses Maimonides’ philosophy depends on one’s own philosophic view. For a traditional theist like Aquinas, he is right to say that there are issues, e.g. creation, that cannot be resolved by demonstration and to insist that all attempts to anthropomorphize God are misguided. The problem is that in rejecting anthropomorphism, he may have gone too far. If God bears no likeness to the created order, and if terms like wise, powerful, or lives are completely ambiguous when applied to God and us, the conception of divinity we are left with is too thin for the average worshipper to appreciate.
For a naturalist like Spinoza, Maimonides is too willing to dismiss science and take refuge in traditional concepts like creation and divine volition. Granted that medieval astronomy did not have a good explanation of planetary motion; with the advent of the scientific revolution, it found one – at least in Spinoza’s opinion. If Maimonides were to remain true to his word and accept the strongest argument wherever it leads, as far as Spinoza’s is concerned, he would have to embrace the new science, the eternity of the world, and the necessity of every event that takes place in it. In order to do this, he would have to abandon the idea that the Bible is a source of philosophic and scientific truth and look to it only for the light it sheds on how to live. Needless to say, this would be a disaster for Maimonides.
Even if Maimonides were to make this move and read the Bible for its ethical content, problems would remain. Maimonides is an elitist. Closeness to God is measured by how much knowledge one acquires. The result is that people whose situations prevent them from pursuing advanced studies cannot be close to God or love God. Whether it is right or wrong, this view offends modern sensibilities, which are much more democratic.
Finally for an atheist, Maimonides’ philosophy shows us what happens if you remove all anthropomorphic content from your conception of God: you remove all content of any kind. In the end, you are left with a God whose essence is unknowable and indescribable. Of what possible value is such a conception either to philosophy or religion?
At his trial for impiety in 399 B.C., Socrates was asked how it is that the wisest person in Athens claims to be ignorant of the knowledge he seeks. His answer (Apology 23a-b) is that he is wise because unlike others, he recognizes that when measured against divine wisdom, human wisdom is of little or no value. Although it is doubtful that he read Socrates’ words, there is little question that this is the insight Maimonides is trying to preserve. That person is wisest who recoils in awe and humility in the face of something infinitely greater than he or she can fathom. This insight explains why, despite his best efforts, Maimonides was unable to find airtight demonstrations for many of his insights about God, creation, and revelation and is often content just to tip the scales in one direction or present an honest assessment of the problem. In a recent work, Alfred Ivry (2016, 4) contends that Maimonides himself is one of the perplexed for whom the Guide was written.
Viewed in a sympathetic light, Maimonides’ elitism stems from the recognition that few people will be satisfied with this. Although not everyone in the history of philosophy would agree, there is no question that Maimonides’ view has a long history and remains a powerful alternative.
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Other Internet Resources
- Maimonides/Rambam, article by Joseph Telushkin, in Jewish Virtual Library, sponsored by The American-Israeli Cooperative Enterprise
- Maimonides: The 13 Principles and the Resurrection of the Dead, in Internet Medieval Source Book, maintained by Paul Halsall (Fordham University).
- Maimonides Resources, maintained by Columbia University Libraries.