Notes to Measurement in Science

1. Lord Kelvin famously stated that “when you can measure what you are speaking about, and express it in numbers, you know something about it; but when you cannot measure it, when you cannot express it in numbers, your knowledge is of a meagre and unsatisfactory kind: it may be the beginning of knowledge, but you have scarcely, in your thoughts, advanced to the stage of science” (Thomson 1889: 73).

2. In what follows I will use the word “object” to refer to a system under measurement. This designation is meant to cover processes and events as well. As will be clarified shortly, what exactly constitutes a system under measurement is a debated topic among measurement theorists.

3. While mathematical measurement theories consider the Celsius zero point to be arbitrary in principle, from a practical perspective the selection of fixed points has involved complex empirical considerations. See Chang 2004: Chapter 1.

4. Kyburg takes “direct” measurement to involve only unaided observation and does not require that such measurements be additive. Hence for Kyburg the ordering of minerals by hardness constitutes direct measurement because the scratch test does not involve the measurement of any other quantity, while the use of an equal-arm balance to measure weight constitutes indirect measurement because it involves measuring the angle of the arms’ deflection. See Kyburg (1984: Ch. 5–6) for discussion.

5. The Mohs scale is based on a scratch test, i.e., on observing which materials can scratch others. Other methods of measuring hardness, like those proposed by Brinell, Vickers and Knoop, allow representing hardness on ratio scales. See Tabor (1970) for discussion.

6. As the same number may represent several objects, e.g., different rods of the same length, RTM focuses on many-to-one rather than one-to-one mappings (cf. Krantz et al. 1971: 8 ff. 1).

7. The Representational Theory of Measurement is closely related to the semantic view of scientific theories, to which Suppes is a key contributor (Suppes 1960, 1962, 1967). According to Suppes’ version of the semantic view, a scientific theory can be thought of as a hierarchy of models. Here the term “model” is borrowed from mathematical logic, and denotes a structure that satisfies certain axioms. RTM analyzes measurement as the construction of morphisms between mathematical and empirical models, and in this respect can be viewed as a successful application of the semantic view of theories (Suppes 1967: 59).

8. Bridgman’s empiricist caution was inspired by the success of Einstein’s special relativity theory, which exposed the naive assumptions behind classical, substantivist conceptions of space and time and replaced them with operational concepts. Bridgman’s operational analysis was intended to “render unnecessary the services of the unborn Einsteins” (1927: 24).

9. Operationalists did not always make explicit their metaphysical and semantic commitments, leaving some room for interpretation. In Bridgman’s case, his initial strong operationalist views were tempered in his later works. See also fn. 10.

10. See also Gillies (1972). Bridgman later revised his account and no longer claimed operationalism was a comprehensive theory of meaning (1938; Chang 2009: section 2.1). For Bridgman’s later views see also his 1945, 1956.

11. For an exception, see Dingle (1950). Recently, Chang (2004: 141–158) has defended a moderate version of operationalism that does not involve the reduction of meaning to operational definition. Instead, Chang recasts operationalism as a theory of the semantic extension of concepts to new domains of application.

12. That some aspects of measurement are conventional is undisputed. Whether we measure temperature on the Celsius or Fahrenheit scales, or whether we use the meter or inch as a unit of length, are choices that ultimately hang on consensus among humans rather than facts about nature. Conventionalism about measurement aims to additionally show that some nontrivial aspects of the application of quantity-concepts, previously not thought to rest on human consensus, are in fact conventional.

13. An important refinement of operationalist and conventionalist traditions is provided by Brian Ellis in his Basic Concepts of Measurement (1966). Instead of defining quantity concepts in terms of particular operations as Bridgman did, Ellis views quantity concepts as “cluster concepts” that may be “identified by any one of a large number of ordering relationships” (1966: 35). Different instruments and procedures may therefore measure the same quantity. What is common to all and only those procedures that measure the same quantity is that they all produce the same linear order among the objects being measured:

If two sets of ordering relationships, logically independent of each other, always generate the same order under the same conditions, then it seems clear that we should suppose that they are ordering relationships for the same quantity. (1966: 34)

14. Despite these objections, it is worth noting that some realists have made partial concessions to moderate conventionalist claims. In particular, both Swoyer (1987: 257–8) and Michell (1994: 398) agree that a multiplicity of relational structures exist on the reals that satisfy the axioms of additivity, and that the choice among them is arbitrary.

15. The realist interpretation invokes Russell’s (1903: Ch. 19) distinction between “absolute” and “relative” theories of magnitude and advocates the absolute conception, as did Russell himself.

16. See also van Fraassen (1980: 58–59).

17. This notion of “model” is developed by Morrison (1999), Morrison and Morgan (1999) and Cartwright (1999), among others.

18. Frigerio et al. (2010) employ a slightly different terminology and divide the second sub-condition into two: (ii) objectivity, i.e., the mutual consistency of measurement outcomes across different environments; and (iii) intersubjectivity, i.e., the mutual consistency of measurement outcomes across different measuring instruments and metrological models. They call setups that satisfy objectivity but not intersubjectivity “pre-measurement” setups (2010: 136). See also Mari (2000).

19. Models are also used to analyze data in economics experiments, and to test the robustness of experimental results across different circumstances and social contexts. Francesco Guala (2008) argues that certain experimental designs, such as the Ultimatum Game, function like standardized measuring instruments in that they allow experimenters to discover inter-cultural variations among subjects’ behaviors. By detecting discrepancies between the predictions of a self-interested rationality model and actual experimental results, investigators are able to elicit phenomena that suggest differences in norms of fairness across different cultures.

20. See also McClimans & Browne (2012) and Angner (2013). For additional challenges to measurement in the social sciences see Chang and Cartwright (2008: 372–5).

21. For the sake of standardization, a quantity concept may be any concept employed in quantitative representation, such as a kind of quantity (e.g., temperature), a relation among quantities (e.g., equality among temperature intervals), a measurement unit, or a measurement scale.

22. Note that standardization by itself does not imply any kind of operationalism or conventionalism. The prescription of a determinate mode of application for a concept is required for its consistent application, regardless of the question whether such prescription determines the meaning of the concept or whether it involves nontrivial choices.

23. Shapere (1982) describes the counting of solar neutrinos as an observation of the center of the sun, because indications from neutrino receptors can be reliably used to infer properties of the sun’s core. This broad construal of the concept of observation is motivated by an analogy between sensory organs and measuring instruments. However, even this broad construal of “observation” assumes a causal connection between the particular objects being observed and the indications being produced, a connection that is not present in the cases Morrison and Parker describe. See Israel-Jost (2011) for a related discussion.

Copyright © 2020 by
Eran Tal <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free