Notes to Medieval Political Philosophy

1. There is no true consensus on what period of time medieval philosophy spans. See the entry on medieval philosophy (§1). In some recent accounts, traditionally medieval figures such as Augustine and Boethius have come to be counted as authors of late antiquity. See the articles of Catapano, Magee, and Gersh in Gerson 2010. One recent solution has been to refer to the Long Middle Ages, which stresses continuity over discrete periodization, and which extends between about 200 and 1700; for this, see Marenbon 2012: 6–7 or his inaugural lecture (2011). This article cleaves to a more traditional chronological span; and, furthermore, Augustine remains an important source and touchstone for medieval political thought.

2. This article thus prescinds from surveying developments in medieval Islamic and Jewish political thought (but see Parens and Macfarland 2011 for translations of some texts in those traditions). The other crucial lacuna is a sustained examination of medieval jurists, who furnished and discussed many fundamental ideas of both then and today. Valuable recent overviews are Pennington 2007 and Ryan 2015. Lee 2016: ch. 1–3 foregrounds the medieval civilian contributions to the notions of sovereignty and constitutionalism; see also Canning 2011: ch. 5.

3. A university was a guild (i.e., trade association) of masters or students in a town. The university was not itself a teaching institution: teaching was done in the masters’ schools (or later in colleges). Schools of higher education had existed among the Greeks, Jews and Muslims, but a trade association of teachers or scholars was a new idea. Like the ancient schools, the medieval schools taught by means of text books: Aristotle in the Arts faculty, Averroes and Avicenna in medicine, the Bible and the Sentences of Peter Lombard in theology, Justinian in the schools of civil law, and Gratian’s Decretum and other collections in canon law. These text books were prescribed by the university, which set standards for the schools that belonged to it.

4. See the Latin text of the Vulgate. The standard English translation of the Vulgate is Challoner’s eighteenth century revision of the Douai-Rheims version (Other Internet Resources, Bible for both). On the history of this translation see the Wikipedia article on the Douai bible listed under “Other Internet Resources”. My references will be to the Vulgate and translation will be Douai. (The language of the Douai translation is old fashioned, but it is the English translation closest to the medieval understanding of the Vulgate text.) The divisions and names of the parts of the medieval bible were not altogether the same as those of the King James version. The medieval “canon” of scripture, i.e., the list of books recognised as belonging to the bible differed somewhat from the canon recognised by Protestants, notably by its inclusion of Machabees. In this entry, we refer to 1 and 2 Samuel, which precede 1 and 2 Kings, rather than 1 to 4 Kings.

5. The theory of “passive obedience” is the theory that if a ruler gives a command contrary to God’s commands, one may obey it passively rather than actively, i.e., not actively carry out the command, but not resist the punishment the ruler then inflicts. An outgrowth of the teachings of Martin Luther, Huldriech Zwingli (1484–1531) and John Calvin (1509–64), such a doctrine was common in the seventeenth century among Protestants and was also held by some Catholics, e.g., Bossuet. See now Oakley 2015: 107–27; also the essays of Oakley and Somerville in Burns and Goldie 1991.

6. For debate on the kingship of Christ between Pope John XXII and Ockham, see William of Ockham, Letter: 72ff.

7. See the New Advent (Catholic Encyclopedia) article “Fathers of the Church”. For English translations online see The Fathers of the Church. See also the entries on Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite.

8. Although better editions of individual authors and texts often exist and continue to appear, no other series is as comprehensive as J.P. Migne’s Patrologiae cursus completus (221 volumes for the Series latina, and 161 volumes for the Series graeca); see Other Internet Resources.

9. The age of innocence ended before Adam and Eve had children, whereas the Golden Age lasted through a number of generations. In medieval writers the two ideas were sometimes combined: after the Fall, human beings lived for a while in a social but unpolitical state (though it was hardly a Golden Age) but gradually developed institutions appropriate to the fallen state.

10. Augustine [413–26] 1955: v, n.2. A few commentaries were made (see Smalley 1960: 58, 61f., 88–101, 121–32), but not many, since The City of God was never a set text. For links to translations of Augustine's writings, see the Other Internet Resources in the entry on Augustine; as always with scans of older documents, one must be on the lookout for the occasional scanning error.

11. To sample The City of God, read Book XIX. See Markus 1970, especially ch. 3; and the entry on Augustine (History and Political Philosophy), in this Encyclopedia.

12. The reader should be warned that the reference to the different levels of virtue, peace, etc., does not necessarily represent the communis opinio. Usually when Augustine says that something is not “true” something, he is taken to mean that it is not that at all. However, such a position implies that Augustine’s thinking was full of inconsistencies. For example, Carlyle and Carlyle (1903: vol. 1, 166–7) says that Augustine’s definition of commonwealth makes justice irrelevant to the existence of a commonwealth, and remarks (169) that among the Fathers this view was unique to Augustine. Yet (as Carlyle and Carlyle 1903, vol. 1, 167, acknowledge) Augustine says that apart from justice a kingdom is only robbery on a large scale. On this interpretation, justice is not irrelevant: anything that can be called a commonwealth must exhibit justice in some degree. See City of God II.21.

13. Arquillière 1955. The conception has been severely criticised: see de Lubac 1984: 255–308. More recently, Saak 2006: 262–3, has suggested the term might best be applied to the political thought of members of the Order of Hermits of St Augustine (e.g., see the entry on Giles of Rome).

14. Many of Augustine's letters cited below are translated by Atkins and Dodaro in Augustine: Political Writings (2001).

15. On warfare see Contra Faustum XXII.74–80, letters to Boniface (417: Letter 189.4), Marcellinus (c. 411/2: Letter 138.2); these letters and other texts are translated by Atkins and Dodaro (Augustine: Political Writings: 30–31, 214–26). Causa 23 of Gratian’s Decretum (Friedberg 1879: vol. 1, col. 889ff.) includes many excerpts from Augustine, and is the source of much medieval thinking about warfare. Russell 1975: 16ff. is the classic exposition; see also his updated overview in Russell 2010. Greenwood 2014 discusses how Augustine fits into the interrelationship of Roman and canon law on the topic of war.

16. On the views of Augustine and other Fathers on toleration and coercion see Lecler 1960: 32–64. On Augustine in particular see Brown 1964 and Markus 1970: ch. 6.

17. Bayle [1686] 2005, part III, quotes Augustine’s justification for coercing heretics and subjects his reasoning to devastating criticism. On the coercion of heretics, see also the letters to Boniface (c. 417: Letter 185; also in Augustine: Political Writings: 173–203) and (Letter 93), and Donatus (c. 411/4: Letter 173; also in Augustine: Political Writings: 152–8). See also Brown 1964.

18. On the political thought of this period see Carlyle and Carlyle 1903, vol. 1, 195ff. In addition to the relevant chapters in Burns 1988, Nelson 1986, and Canning 1996: 47ff., see Oakley 2010: 143ff.

19. The modern edition of Jonas’ De institutione regia was edited by Alain Dubreucq in 1995. For a list of other mirrors from around this time, see Noble 2015: 298.

20. Nelson 1988: 228–9; also Nelson 1986: 59–60, 107–111. On the later development of ideas of consent see Tierney 1982: 39–42. In successive volumes, Oakley 2012: 138ff. and 2015: 172ff., has followed the growing strands of consent-based political thought through to the end of the middle ages.

21. Translations of Justinian's corpus are listed in the bibliography below. Note that the recent (2016) translation of the Codex is based on the annotated translation made by Fred Blume (and now available on the University of Wyoming’s College of Law George William Hopper Law Library website). Blume’s annotated translations of the Novels may also be found there. Generally, these translations should be used in favour of S.P. Scott’s translation; however, it should be noted that Scott relied on a version of the Corpus iuris civilis that is closer in organization to the medieval “vulgate” version. One important consequence of this is that Scott’s translation of the Code includes the authenticae (i.e., excerpts from related but subsequent novellae constitutiones, or Novels, which copyists inserted between constitutions of the Code so as to provide the law “as amended”). For some discussion of the importance of the authenticae, see Pennington 2011.

22. The study of Gratian and the Decretum have both advanced much in recent years (see Pennington 2014), and it is widely known how seminal an influence Gratian had on the political thought of subsequent lawyers and theologians. However, concentrated studies of Gratian’s political thought are rare; Chodorow 1972 is an attempt, not altogether successful, to delineate the political thought of the Decretum. Currently, only parts of the Decretum are available in English: Gratian [c. 1140] 1993 (distinctions 1–20) and 2016 (the so-called Treatise on Penance: C. 33 q. 3). A translation of the entire Decretum along with its Ordinary Gloss is due to appear (hopefully soon) from the press of the Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies. See also the items listed under “Other Internet Resources”, which includes some of the pre-Gratian materials.

23. Historiography on the “origin” of subjective natural rights remains unsettled. Historians are inclined to champion the era with which they are most familiar. For a classical origin, see Miller 1995; proponents of an early modern origin are too numerous to list, but Strauss 1953 remains a classic example. Medievalists, however, are mainly inclined to accept Tierney 1997, who looks to the canonists of the twelfth century (e.g., Rufinus) as early proponents of a form of natural rights. Among medieval political philosophers (as opposed to jurists), William of Ockham is the best known, but historians have championed others as well, including Thomas Aquinas (see the entry on Thomas Aquinas: moral and political philosophy), and Marsilius of Padua. Less familiar names who deserve greater attention include: Henry of Ghent, Peter Olivi, Godfrey of Fontaines.

24. “According to natural law all persons were born free…. slavery itself was unknown; but after slavery was admitted by the Law of Nations…” (Digest 1.1.4). According to Isidore, in Gratian, D. 1, c. 7 (trans. Thompson and Gordley 1993: 6), natural law includes “the one liberty of all”.

25. According to Institutes 2.1.11–12, property originates by natural law, with which the law of nations is synonymous:

Of some things we obtain dominium [lordship] by natural law, which, as we have said, is called the law of nations… For whatever belonged before to no one is granted by natural reason to the one who takes possession.

But according to other texts, the distinction of lordship was established by the law of nations in a sense not synonymous with natural law (e.g., Digest 1.1.5).

26. Lambertini 2014b shows how medieval authors did not agree about the origins of coercive power: some held the potential (at least) existed in the state of nature, while others held it emerged only after the Fall.

27. Natural law includes “the common possession of all” (D. 1, c. 7, Friedberg 1879: vol. 1, col. 2). “Superfluous” property must as a matter of justice be made available to the poor, especially in time of need. See Tierney 1959: 28–39; Roumy 2006 traces the evolution of the related doctrine that “necessity has no law”.

28. Digest 1.4.1:

What pleases the ruler has the force of law, since by the lex regia, which was made concerning the emperor’s rule, the people conferred on him all of its power to rule.

This makes the ruler’s will decisive, but note that his authority rests on a popular decision. (There was some debate among lawyers as to whether the people could reclaim their authority. See Gierke 1900: 43–6, 150–3; Carlyle and Carlyle 1909: vol. 2, 60–7; 1928: vol. 5, 49; 1936: vol. 6, 13–19.) According to Digest 1.3.31, “The ruler is not bound by the law”. (This text is the origin of the term “absolutism”.) Another text, often referred to in the middle ages by the incipit “Digna vox”, suggested that the emperor should obey his own laws (Codex 1.14.4):

It is a saying worthy of the majesty of a ruler for the ruler to profess that he is bound by the laws, since our authority depends on the authority of law. Indeed it is better for the empire for the rulership to submit to the laws.

For developments among the jurists, see Pennington 1993a: 78, and Lee 2016: chapters 1 and 2.

29. “Two there are, august emperor, by which this world is chiefly ruled, the sacred authority of the priesthood and the royal power. Of these the responsibility of the priests is more weighty, in so far as they will answer for the kings of men themselves at the divine judgment… [I]n the order of religion… you ought to submit yourselves [to priests] rather than rule… [T]he bishops themselves… obey your law so far as the sphere of public order is concerned” (D. 96 c. 10; translated Tierney 1980: 13–14).

30. C. 11 q. 1, c. 29 and c. 30 (Friedberg 1879: vol. 1, col. 634). These texts are inauthentic, being drawn from the Pseudo-Isidorean collection. This “Isidore” is not to be confused with Isidore of Seville, whom Gratian often quotes. Gratian’s borrowings from Pseudo-Isidore are marked in Friedberg’s edition by references to Hinschius’s edition of Pseudo-Isidore (e.g., see Friedberg 1879: vol. 1, col. 342, note 221). The Pseudo-Isidorian collection, made in the mid-ninth century, contained much authentic material but with an admixture of forgery. Its purpose, apparently, was to strengthen the position of the French bishops, in part by enhancing the power of the pope (far off in Rome!)—by reserving certain powers to the pope, Isidore sought to protect the bishops against persons closer at hand. Some of the falsifications included in the Pseudo-Isidorian collection had been produced earlier, e.g., the “Donation of Constantine” (see English translation and the New Advent article listed under “Other Internet Resources”) and the “Recognitions of Clement”. See, above all, the Projekt Pseudoisidore, listed under “Other Internet Resources”; more general information is available from the Wikipedia article on Pseudo-Isidore and New Advent articles on the False Decretals (ibid.).

31. On corporative thought see Michaud-Quantin 1970 and Quillet 1988; general comments in Tierney 1982: 80ff.

32. Classic articles are Post 1946 and Congar 1958. For the role the maxim played in medieval constitutionalist thought, see now Oakley 2012: ch. 6, which references other important literature. Condorelli 2013 surveys use of the maxim across medieval jurists and philosophers such as Ockham.

33. See Moulin 1958. For Ockham’s discussion of this idea see William of Ockham, Letter: 175–6. For an entertaining account of an election campaign in a monastery, with references to different modes of decision making, see Jocelin of Brakelond's Chronicle of the Abbey of St. Edmund (Other Internet Resources).

34. “As a sick man should not find fault with the medical treatment because one thing is prescribed to-day and another to-morrow and what was at first required is afterwards forbidden, since the method of cure depends on this; so the human race, sick and sore as it is from Adam to the end of the world, as long as the corrupted body weighs down the mind, should not find fault with the divine prescriptions, if sometimes the same observances are enjoined, and sometimes an old observance is exchanged for one of a different kind”; Contra Faustum, XXXII.14. See also his De vera religione, XVII.34.

35. “It must be said that by natural law all things were common and there was one liberty of all. This was before sin; after sin some things were proper to some; and both of these are by natural law” (Alexander of Hales [c. 1240] 1948: vol. 4, 348. Cf. 352).

36. According to Bonaventure some things are dictates of nature simply, valid for every state of human existence (e.g., that God is to be honoured), others are dictates of nature as it was first instituted, valid for the state of innocence (e.g., that all things should be common), and others are dictates of nature in its fallen state (e.g., that property rights should be respected); Bonaventure [d. 1274]: 2 Sent., dist. 44, a. 2, q. 2, ad 4. See Quinn 1973.

38. Thomas Aquinas’s commentary is incomplete (it ends at III.6). Peter of Auvergne completed the work. For Peter of Auvergne, see now the essays of Lambertini and Toste in Flüeler, Lanza, and Toste 2015. The same volume contains a census of Peter’s works by Lanza and Toste (for his writings connected to the Politics, see 459ff.), though the bibliographical sections of the website on Peter they maintain may soon be the better choice. Lanza 2015: 256n2, has announced a critical edition of Peter’s Scriptum super III–VIII libros Politicorum, which should supersede Grech 1967. Peter also wrote a commentary in question form. For translations from both commentaries see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall 2001: 216ff., and Parens and Macfarland 2011: 289ff.

39. A “political animal” means an animal whose nature is to live in a polis or city, not isolated or in small groups. Civilisation is the natural state not in the sense that it is the original state, but in the sense that the natural goal of human development is life in cities:

If the earlier forms of society are natural, so is the state, for it is the end of them, and the nature of a thing is its end. For what each thing is when fully developed, we call its nature… Hence it is evident that the state is a creation of nature, and that man is by nature a political animal. (Politics I.2, 1252 b30–1253 a3)

In this translation (by Jowett) “state” corresponds to the Greek polis, which in the Latin translation is civitas, in English “city”. On the vocabulary see Luscombe 1992. Recently, Toste 2014 has shown how medieval philosophers, when commenting on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Politics, questioned the ways in which this impulse should be considered natural.

40. Politics I.5 and 6 could be taken as a dialectical exploration of the question of the justice of slavery, but from other places in the Politics it is clear that Aristotle himself believed that some human beings were marked by nature to be slaves: “Slaves and brute animals… cannot [form a state], for they have no share in happiness or in a life of free choice” (III.9, 1280 a32–4). According to Duns Scotus (d. 1308) slavery in the sense of harsh subjection to another can be justified only as punishment. “Natural” slavery, which Scotus describes as “civil and political subjection”, ought to benefit the slave; such slaves do have free will and a possibility of virtue. See Flüeler 1993: 75–81.

41. Politics III.7. The classification came from Plato (Statesman, 302c–303b), and Aristotle goes on to undermine or qualify it in many ways.

42. Politics III.16, Rhetoric I.1 1354 a30-b15. Plato had argued that it is best if the ruler has true knowledge and is not bound by law, but if rulers without knowledge should rule in accordance with laws made by legislators with true knowledge; Plato, Statesman 294–301.

43. Thomas Aquinas, De regno 1.7. This work, which Aquinas left unfinished, has been translated into English many times. James Blythe has provided the best translation along with a valuable introduction (On the Government of Rulers, 1997). On the complicated history of the De regno and the continuation by Tolomeo Fiadoni (better known as Ptolemy of Lucca), see Blythe 2009a: 157ff.

44. Aristotle, Metaphysics, III.1, 995 a23–b5: “For those who wish to get clear of difficulties it is advantageous to discuss the difficulties well; for… it is not possible to untie a knot of which one does not know… Hence one should have surveyed all the difficulties beforehand… Further, he who has heard all the contending arguments, as if they were the parties to a case, must be in a better position to judge”.

45. The contribution of the jurists of the ius commune to medieval political thought cannot be pursued here, though it should be noted that they played no less important a role than the theologians and philosophers. See Pennington 2007: 165ff, for the developments from Innocent III onwards, and Black 2009: ch. 1, who provides a brief overview of the idea of fullness of power in the middle ages through the fifteenth century.

46. Congar 1961 remains fundamental. William of Saint-Amour (d. 1272) was a central critic of the idea that the pope could authorize mendicants to preach over and against objections from the diocesan bishop; see his De periculis novissimorum temporum (On the Dangers of the Last Days) [1256], ch. 2. See also the translation available on Robinson's website, listed under Other Internet Resources.

47. Many authors necessarily touched on these issues. For self-contained examples available in English, see Marsilius of Padua [c. 1324–6] 1993 and Tolomeo Fiadoni (Ptolemy of Lucca), A Treatise on the Origin, Translation, and State of the Roman Empire (available here or see link to Robinson's translations under Other Internet Resources). Another key document in this debate is the apocryphal “Donation of Constantine” (see §6 and note 30 above).

48. However, medieval authors would have known of the Republic indirectly through Calcidius’ translation of the Timaeus (which extends to section 53c). See Calcidius, On Plato's Timaeus.

49. A convenient collection of Aquinas’ political texts are collected in Thomas Aquinas: Political Writings; where possible, references are to this edition. Many of Aquinas’ writings (in Latin) are now available online. Many of the works are also available in English translation. Alfred Freddoso has undertaken to retranslate the entire Summa theologiae, which he updates regularly on his website; however, as his translation is available only as a series of PDFs updated in an ad hoc fashion, for reasons of stability, we rely on the older translation available at the New Advent website.

50. Natural law is mentioned in Romans 2:14–15:

For when the Gentiles, who have not the law, do by nature those things that are of the law; these having not the law are a law to themselves: Who shew the work of the law written in their hearts, their conscience bearing witness to them, and their thoughts between themselves accusing, or also defending one another.

The contrast between nature and convention goes back to the sophists. It would have been known to medieval readers also from Aristotle, Politics, I.6, 1255 a5.

51. This theory is a species of what Sidgwick called “intuitionism” (Sidgwick 1907: Book 1, chapter 8, esp. 101).

52. Cf. Augustine, On the Free Choice of the Will 1.5.11: “For a law that is not just does not seem to me to be a law”. See Finnis 1998: 266ff.

53. See Rivière 1926 and Dupuy 1655. Many texts of this period now exist in modern editions or recent translations; aside from the more well-known Giles of Rome and John of Paris, see Dyson 1999a, 1999b; James of Viterbo [1302] 2009; Augustine of Ancona (excerpts in McGrade, Kilcullen, and Kempshall 2001: 418ff.). For Henry of Cremona, see Scholz 1903: 459–71.

54. This article focuses on aspects of his De ecclesiastica potestate. For more on Giles’s philosophy and political philosophy, including his influential book on the education of a prince, see the entry on Giles of Rome (§6). Translations of portions of this text can be found in Lewis 1954: vol. 1, 65ff.; McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall 2001: 200ff.; and Nederman and Forhan 1993: 150ff. Although the De ecclesiastica potestate has attracted more scholarly attention, the De regimine principum was likely more influential in his own day. One example of its relative popularity is clear from Bartolus of Saxoferrato’s overt reliance on it when “translating” Aristotelian political ideas into the language of the ius commune in his De regimine civitatis (On the Government of a City) (translation available online).

55. According to Ubl 2003: 54–6, John of Paris had in his sights not Giles of Rome but university disputations of James of Viterbo and Henry of Ghent.

56. Giles of Rome, De ecclesiastica potestate 1.7–9, 2.13–15, 3.7 ([d. 1316] 2004: 38–60, 210–66, 348–50). For this work, see Krueger 2007. On theories of hierarchy, see Luscombe 1988b, 1998, 2003 and Pascoe 1973: 17ff.

57. Giles of Rome, De ecclesiastica potestate 2.7–8 ([d. 1316] 2004: 130–52).

58. See Oakley 2012: 199ff. For other discussions of the legitimacy of dominium, see McGrade, Kilcullen and Kempshall 2001: 587ff. (on Wyclif); William of Ockham [1341/2], Short Discourse: 84–7; Lewis 1954: vol. 1, 120ff. (on Richard FitzRalph).

59. The life and writings of John of Paris has recently been the subject of a collection of essays; see Jones 2015.

60. Page references in the text are to translation On Royal and Papal Power by John Watt (1971). According to the canon lawyers, the pope and other clergy were administrators of Church property, not the owners. See Tierney 1959: 39–43.

61. See also Ubl and Vinx 2000: 321, who quote from John of Paris’s unpublished Commentary on the Sentences to the same effect: “appropriatio est de iure humano”. Coleman 1983 suggested that John anticipated Locke.

62. For translations see Marsilius of Padua [1324] 1951/1980, 2005. Page references of the form “44–9, 61–3/65–72, 88–90” are to those translations respectively.

63. Hooker’s defence of Elizabeth’s governorship of the Church (Hooker [1594–1597] 1989) seems to have been influenced, at least indirectly, by Marsilius (see Piaia 1977: 213–8). Hooker maintains that when the people are Christians there is no “personal separation” between Church and State, and that the secular ruler is then (in some sense) the head of the Church, with sole authority to call church assemblies, with a veto over their legislation, with authority to appoint bishops and other officials, with exemption from excommunication.

64. Opus nonaginta dierum 65.35ff (Work of Ninety Days: 436, 438). (Note: where Ockham’s work is available in English, a parenthetical reference will follow the citation.) The Work of Ninety Days, the Dialogus and others of Ockham’s political writings are “recitative”, i.e., report opinions without explicitly indicating what the author holds; other works, including the Breviloquium, are “assertive” writings, in which Ockham states plainly what he holds. Guided by the assertive writings and by other clues it is usually possible to decide which opinions in the recitative writings are the author’s. See Knysh 1997. For the relationship between Ockham’s Work of Ninety Days and contemporary Franciscan writings about property, see Robinson 2011, 2012, 2014b; see also Miethke 2010, 2012.

65. According to Opus nonaginta dierum 92.16–45 (Work of Ninety Days: 573–4), the right to establish property seems to be from natural law of the third kind, supposing the circumstances of the fallen state. In Breviloquium 3.7.35ff. (Short Discourse: 89–90) it is said to have been given by God by a positive grant.

66. Property implies exclusion of use by others, Opus nonaginta dierum 26.38–41 (Work of Ninety Days: 308).

67. For all this argument see especially Opus nonaginta dierum, chapters 64 and 65, 87–90. The natural right of using should not be confused with the “use of right” and “right of using” that are legal rights. See Opus nonaginta dierum 2.127ff, 2.155ff, and 6.268–70, (Work of Ninety Days: 60–3, 145). For contrasting views on the success of Ockham’s argument, see Brett 1997: 50ff. and Kilcullen 2001c: 45f. For Ockham’s theory of property see also Breviloquium 3.7 (Short Discourse: 57–90).

68. All the translations of Ockham's works listed below other than the Work of Ninety Days address this issue. The Dialogus is in the process of being edited. So far, one volume has appeared (volume 8 of his Opera politica; the German edition and translation by Miethke includes copious invaluable notes). As work on the critical edition (and English translation) progresses, the results are posted online under the auspices of the British Academy. A (draft) translation of his Octo quaestiones de potestate papae (Eight Questions on the Power of the Pope; excluding questions 3 and 8 as of January 2017) is also available online, though question 3 may be found in Ockham, Letter: 303–33.

69. For Ockham’s disagreements with Marsilius, see the editors' Endnote 4 (Opera politica, vol. 8: 360ff; or online); see also Miethke's introduction to 3.1 Dialogus in Die Amtsvollmacht von Papst und Klerus: 38ff. The best, but not sole, evidence that Ockham knew the writings of Marsilius directly is in 3.1 Dialogus, books 3 and 4.

70. On the “regularly/occasionally” contrast, see Bayley 1949 and Robinson 2014a: 187ff. For Ockham’s attempts to specify papal power and its limits see Breviloquium 2.16–18 (Short Discourse: 51–8); 3.1 Dialogus 1.16–17 (vol. 8: 190ff.); Octo quaestiones, q. 1 (vol. 1: 16–68); De imperatorum et pontificum potestate cc. 8–13 (On the Power of Emperors and Popes: 98ff.).

71. A pope who falls into heresy loses office ipso facto, but still has to be removed from factual exercise of papal power; a pope who is not a heretic but is accused of serious sin (e.g., unjust interference with the rights of lay people) needs to be tried and then, if guilty, deposed. An early position of Ockham’s (Robinson 2012: 297f.), he continued to develop it. See, e.g., Octo questiones 3.12.120ff., (Letter: 327ff.). For Ockham’s view on how it can be done, see McGrade 1974: chapter 2, and Ockham’s Contra Benedictum 7 (Opera politica: vol. 3: 303ff.).

72. See Contra Benedictum 6.6 (Opera politica, vol. 3: 286): the phrase “legibus solutus” refers to civil law only (ius civile). For an overview of the ways the jurists understood this phrase with ample bibliography, see Black 2009: ch. 1.

73. Breviloquium 4.10 (Short Discourse: 124); 3.2 Dialogus 3.6 (Letter: 291–3). See Kilcullen, “The right to live under government” in the Other Internet Resources.

74. Tierney 1969; see more generally Tierney 1955 and Oakley 2003. Fasolt 1991: 318–9 has warned against speaking of “conciliar theory” per se.

75. Ockham’s opinion was that no part of the Church, neither pope nor council, was infallible (see Tierney 1972: chapter 6; and Kilcullen 1991). For what may be an attempt to answer Ockham, see Marsilius Defensor minor 12.5 (trans. Nederman: 42).

76. See Burns and Izbicki 1997 for an English translation of the debate over conciliarism between Cajetan, Almain and Maior. Like Ockham, Cajetan held that the constitution of the Church is monarchical, by divine law, but, unlike Ockham, did not envisage the possibility that on occasion exceptions might be made to divine law.

77. These collections are available online via the Bavarian State Library: see the listings in the bibliography.

78. The question of whether there was a sharp “break” with medieval political thought remains contentious. Medievalists often stress continuity (e.g., Oakley, Pennington, Tierney; see also Skinner), while scholars whose focus lies after the middle ages tend to stress rupture or break (Pocock 1975 is an influential example). In the context of the historiography of medieval political thought, see the exchange between Cary Nederman (1990 and 1996) and Francis Oakley (1995 and, less directly, 1996). See also Nederman 2009: chapters 1–4.

79. Some of these trends are more apparent in the writings of the medieval jurists and the so-called humanists who lived and worked in the city-states of Italy.

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John Kilcullen
Jonathan Robinson

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