Notes to Mencius

1. For a thoughtful overview of recent interpretations of the concept of Heaven, see Cline 2014. Regarding Virtue, see the discussion later in this subsection.

2. For an excellent discussion of the evidence, see Kim and Csikszentmihalyi 2014. When I refer to “Confucius” in this entry, please take this as shorthand for “Confucius as represented in the received text of the Analects.

3. For a classic discussion of the evolution of the Chinese concept of Virtue, see Nivison 1996d and Nivison 1996a.

4. “Wisdom, benevolence, and courage–these three–are the universal Virtues of the world.” Mean, Chapter 20, translation mine. For the Chinese text, see Zhu Xi, Zhongyong jizhu, under Other Internet Resources.

5. For discussions of agent–relativity, see Jeske 2014, Ridge 2011, and the references therein.

6. Traditionally, Mencius is said to have lived from 372–289 BCE (Legge 1970, 16). However, many recent scholars put his lifetime about twenty years earlier. D.C. Lau concludes, “There is no convincing evidence, as far as one can see, for any events recorded in the Mencius happening before 319 B.C.” (Lau 1970, 10). Mencius is treated as a respected older man in the Mengzi, so it is likely that he was born around 390 BCE.

7. For a translation of the stories, see Wang 2003, 150–155.

8. See Mengzi 2A2 and Van Norden 1997.

9. One of the most historically influential views is that of Zhu Xi (1130–1200). Zhu Xi understood extension as a matter of discovering the universal Pattern (also translated “principle”) which is fully present in each thing that exists. We begin from the parts of the Pattern that are already clear to us, and infer (seemingly by an analogical process) to the manifestations of the Pattern in other cases. Because the Pattern is fully present in each individual as his or her nature, knowledge of the Pattern is intrinsically motivational. However, this interpretation assumes a Buddhist–influenced metaphysical framework that some interpreters argue is alien to ancient Confucianism. See the discussion of Pattern in Van Norden 2014, Section 2, and the further references therein.

10. For discussion of these issues, see the essays in Liu and Ivanhoe 2002, and the references therein. See also the excellent discussion in Wong 2013, Section 2.5 on “Mencius’s Defense of Love with Distinctions.”

11. Graham (1967, 14–15) takes this to be a decisive objection to Mencius’s view.

12. The qíng of X (what X is inherently, or the essence of X) is closely related to its xìng (nature). However, “nature” emphasizes characteristics that are biological (in a broad sense) and developmental, while “essence” is a more static and linguistic notion. In Mencius’s era, the essence of X is the characteristics that X has intrinsically, or the ones it must have in order for it to be appropriate to refer to it as an “X.” This interpretation is controversial. I here follow Dai Zhen 1777, Section 30, Graham 1967, Mou 1970, vol. 3, 416–17, and Shun 1997, 183–87. Other commentators have taken “qing” to mean emotions or passions (e.g., Zhu Xi, Sishu jizhu, commentary on Mengzi 2A6 and passim). The term certainly comes to have this sense in later texts. If Dai Zhen et al. are correct, an evolution occurred in which the “essence” of a human being was so often taken to be our emotions that the sense of the term shifted to match what had become the standard referent. However, it would not substantially affect the overall interpretation developed here if the traditional commentators are correct. The translation of qing as “essence” is also controversial. “Essence” is conveniently brief (as opposed to “what a thing is inherently”), and Graham (1967) argues that it is adequate as a translation as long as we keep in mind that it does not have the ontological connotations of Aristotle’s notion of essence. However, Shun warns about the dangers of using “essence” as a translation: “…I hesitate to ascribe an Aristotelian framework to early Chinese thinkers and…it is unclear that early Chinese thinkers drew a distinction between essential and accidental properties” (1997, 185).

13. The Chinese term rendered “misled” is bì. In its nominal use, it frequently refers to a “fixation” or “obsession” on one aspect of something to the detriment of others. A nice illustration of its use is found in Xunzi’s essay, “Undoing Fixation,” in which Xunzi diagnoses the errors of other philosophers, each of whom focuses on some one aspect of the Way (an aspect that is legitimate in itself) to the exclusion of others (see Xunzi 21; Hutton 2014, 224–35).

14. Compare 6A7: “The sages first got what our hearts prefer in common. Hence, order and righteousness delight our hearts like meat delights our mouth” (translation modified from Van Norden 2008, 151).

15. See Zhu Xi, Sishu jizhu, commentary on Analects 17.2, translated in Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 203.

16. Translation mine. For the Chinese text, see Wang Yinglin, Sanzijing, under Other Internet Resources.

17. It is open to the rival philosopher to bite the bullet and accept this implication. However, Mencius has at the least raised a strong, prima facie objection.

18. Schwartz (1985, 142) compares Mozi’s argument to that of Thomas Hobbes, but Graham (1989, 45–46) is correct in noting that Mozi does not assume that people in the state of nature are purely self–interested: “[t]he primitive war of all against all before the origin of the state is seen by the Mohist not (as for example by the Confucian [Xunzi]) in terms of conflicting desires but of conflicting moralities. Individuals compete, but whether for themselves or for family or lord seems not to enter the argument.”

19. As the phrase “mutually filial sons [jiāo xiào zĭ]” suggests, Mozi envisions a society in which the highest form of filial piety is for every young person to treat every person of his or her parents’ generation with the same filial devotion they would treat their own.

20. Due to the fragmentary and largely second-hand nature of the evidence for his views, the interpretation of Yang Zhu in the following paragraph is highly speculative. For discussions, see Kushner 1980, Graham 1989, 53–64, Emerson 1996, and Shun 1997, 36–47. Graham has argued that the “Robber Zhi” chapter of the Zhuangzi may reflect the views of the historical Yang Zhu. (For a translation, see Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 369–75.) The “Yang Zhu” chapter of the Liezi presents a view that is attributed to Yang Zhu (translated in Graham 1990); however, the unrestrained hedonism of this text is inconsistent with earlier evidence about the views of Yang Zhu.

21. Some of the most influential discussions of the debate between Confucians and Mohists include Wong 1989, Nivison 1996c, and Shun 1997, 127–35.

22. Mencius is not arguing that Mohism is “self–defeating” in the technical sense specified in Parfit 1979. Parfit is concerned with the successful implementation of a normative theory (assuming that such is possible). Mencius is challenging whether impartial consequentialism can be successfully implemented.

23. Graham (2001, 58) gives “the principles of Goodwill and Duty,” while Watson (1996, 41) has “the rules of benevolence and righteousness,” but duan does not mean anything like “rules” or “principles.”

24. The relationship between the Zhuangzi and Mengzi passages was first noted in Nivison 1996b. For helpful explanation of qi (but romanized as “ch’i”), see Schwartz 1985, 179–84.

25. For a partial translation of the Four Books, see Gardner 2007. For selections from Han Yu, Zhu Xi, and other Neo–Confucian philosophers, see Tiwald and Van Norden (2014).

26. For a detailed discussion of this point, see Ivanhoe 2002. The situation is arguably similar to the development of Christian theology in the West, in which (for example) Augustine’s understanding of the Bible was deeply influenced by the Platonism of his own intellectual milieu.

27. The situation is complex, though. For a Marxist appropriation of Confucian (including Mencian) ideas, see Liu 1939. For a general discussion, see Nivison 1956.

28. For a good summary, see N. Serina Chan, “What Is Confucian and New about the Thought of Mou Zongsan?” in Makeham 2003, 131–164. For the difficulties in defining “New Confucianism,” see Makeham, “The Retrospective Creation of New Confucianism,” ibid., 25–53.

29. For some other works that advocate a virtue ethics interpretation of Confucianism, see Angle 2012, Sim 2007, Van Norden 2007, and Yu 2007.

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