Mental Disorder (Illness)

First published Wed Feb 20, 2019; substantive revision Fri Nov 22, 2019

The concepts of mental disorder, or illness, are ascribed to deviations from normal thoughts, reasoning, feelings, attitudes, and actions that are by their subjects, or by others, considered socially or personally dysfunctional and apt for treatment. Schizophrenia, depression, obsessive-compulsive disorder, substance abuse, and mania are examples. The concept of mental disorder or illness plays a role in many domains, including medicine, social sciences such as psychology and anthropology, and the humanities, including literature and philosophy. Philosophical discussions are the primary focus of the present entry, which differs from the entry on Philosophy of Psychiatry in noting several different approaches—not only those of the philosophy of science and mind, but also those arising from phenomenological and social theory traditions.

As a category, mental disorder is not well fitted to the part it plays in contemporary psychiatry. Although now widely judged to be forms of disorder (or illness), some conditions, such as those above, have not always been so understood (Porter 2002). Even when deemed to be disorder or illness, moreover, that status has frequently indicated as much ethical, as organic, deficiency (Irwin 2013). Such reminders direct our attention to contemporary medical psychiatry’s uncompromisingly biological, and avowedly value-free “medical model”, with its incumbent analogies and assumptions, and to the general question of how the taxa of psychiatric classifications are to be viewed as objects of natural science. This model has received intensive and continuing philosophical analysis and critique, including by those denying these conditions are deficiencies at all. And along with issues arising from more recent advances in cognitive psychology and the neurosciences, such foundational issues make up much of the following entry. Because of their focus on ideas central to the philosophy of mind and ethics (the relation of mind to body, and issues of responsibility and identity, for example) analyses of mental disorder have extensive implications for those fields. But as clinical phenomena, these conditions also reflect an inescapable, everyday, societal reality, giving theoretical inquiries additionally urgent practical, moral, and legal, implications.

1. Terminology

The language here is highly contentious. There are exceptions, but in a long history mental illnesses have been referred to as “evil”, as “willful error”, as “grave misfortune” or, at the very least, regarded as unwelcome.[1] And with some regularity, conditions like those listed in the current diagnostic and classificatory manual of the American Psychiatric Association (DSM-5 [APA 2013]) and or the International Statistical Classification of Diseases and Related Health Problems (ICD-11 [WHO 2018]) have been provided new classificatory titles and terminology, such revisions often solely aimed at reducing negative and stigmatizing associations. Authors cited in what follows use “mental disorder”, “psychiatric disability”, “psychiatric disorder”, “mental illness”, “madness”, “psychopathology”. Controversy attaches to these terms, as it does to particular diagnostic labels (such as “schizophrenia”), because some question whether these mental differences are forms of illness or disorder at all. Although it is not widely employed, the more neutral “mental difference” better accommodates each side of this controversy, and the choice of terminology employed in what follows is not intended to promote a disorder or illness view.

Three changes of language require special attention. Frequently, the term “illness” in “mental illness” has been replaced by “disorder”, apparently without a consistent rationale beyond avoiding explicitly medical language. The rise of cognitive psychology has brought a parallel trend where “the cognitive” and “cognition” are sometimes introduced as equivalents or replacements for “the mental”. This new language around “cognition” combines the earlier faculty psychology divisions of affection and cognition: as much as doxastic states, emotions are “cognitive”.[2] Then finally, increasing use of “mental and behavioral”, sometimes shortened to “behavioral” (as in “behavioral health”), reflects substantive decisions also, such as the inclusion of addictions and compulsions in the class of disorders, and a preference for precisely measurable symptoms.

Because it is now more common in philosophical writing, the expression “mental disorder”, replaces “mental illness” in what follows. And unless otherwise indicated, “mental disorder” is taken to refer not only to more “mental” conditions like psychoses and affective disorders, but also to “behavioral” conditions such as addictions and character disorders. Frequently, the shift from ’mental’ to “cognitive” also indicates allegiance to substantive theoretical tenets. Here, however, “cognitive” and “cognition” are used only as terms of art within particular theoretical analyses.

2. Folk Psychology, Conceptual Analysis, and Science

Both common sense folk psychology and medical psychiatry employ concepts of mental disorder or illness. (“Depression” refers to the same mood states and attitudes, for example, whether used by a professionals or non-professionals.) This can foster confusion, and inconsistencies arise at the boundaries where mental disorders meet other kinds of disorder. Rather than traditionally mental symptoms, for example, “hysterical” (“psychosomatic”, “somatoform”, or “conversion”) syndromes exhibit bodily paralyses, minor skin conditions, and intestinal maladies (Shorter 2006; Micale 1995; Scull 2009). Yet they remain mental disorders in common understanding, and long found a place in standard psychiatric classifications.[3] Also anomalous, some conditions with apparently mental symptoms are the causal product of what are, indisputably, diseases of and damage suffered by the brain. (Delusions following cerebral hemorrhage are an example.) They are judged to be neurological rather than psychiatric complaints however, and excluded from the class of mental disorders according to both everyday conceptions, and diagnostic taxonomies. Similarly, although perception is widely judged a mental capacity, some conditions affecting sight, such as blindness, are absent from diagnostic classifications.

There are different views about the conceptual relationship between the informal and more clinical language, and philosophers and others have approached this problem in several ways depending on varying foundational assumptions. Some insist that the confusions and inconsistencies that occur result from the fact that the concept of mental disorder employed in psychiatry’s conception and classification of disorders is too closely allied to the parallel concepts in folk psychology. Confusion and inconsistency at the boundaries between mental, neurological, and organic disorders arise, according to Dominic Murphy, from acceptance of inconsistent folk psychological categorizing, ill-suited to the properly scientific taxonomic task which, because it is tied to the hope for a theory of the “hidden structure” of the taxonomic domain, seeks causal explanation. Relinquishing intuitively grounded, inherently normative folk psychological categories, and accepting the divisions that ensue from scientific research through a combination of psychiatry and cognitive neuroscience, is the first step towards achieving a scientific psychiatric classification (Murphy 2007). Without a principled and systematic way to identify the class of mental disorders, Murphy’s concerns suggest, any disorder taxonomy that is presently employed will likely prove inaccurate. The old adage that once their organic causes are known, all mental disorders are transformed into neurological conditions, bespeaks an expectation that the out-moded, folk psychological category of mental disorder is itself temporary and will eventually be rendered otiose—an outcome anticipated without regret by adherents of strong mind-body reductionism (see Guze 1992; Churchland 1989).

Adopting more conservative approaches, others have urged the importance of maintaining the category of mental disorder (Brülde & Radovic 2006). Everyday language and the traditional classifications built around it have provided a common framework for research and clinical practice; and with any further blurring of the boundaries between mental disorders and the brain damage and disease treated by neurologists, demarcations of professional competence would be lost. Fear of over-diagnosis, of according too much power to medical psychiatry and the psychopharmacology industry, and of relinquishing to experts decisions about mental health and conceptions of eudaimonia more appropriately resolved by non-scientists, have all challenged the societal place occupied by medical psychiatry (see §10).

It is not only for such social and political reasons, and considerations of practicality and custom, that common sense concepts have been supported. Also at stake here is the nature of the epistemic role accorded to conceptual analysis. Whether cast in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, or more loosely, there is disagreement over how much analyses of mental disorder must be guided by everyday language and categories. Some analyses acknowledge more than the most immediate observations derived from the empirical and cognitive sciences, and may adhere to an account of mind and mental processing employing mentalist terms and normative presuppositions inapplicable within an exclusively physical framework (see §4, §5, and §8). In addition, some regard mental disorders as socially constructed entities, the existence and classification of which necessarily rely on societal features of the world (see §10).

A meta-taxonomy of these varying foundational assumptions includes three intersecting issues: what mental disorders are; how much we can presently know about them; and different approaches to their analysis. Thus, objectivist (or naturalist) accounts, hold that mental disorders are empirically discoverable items that can be provided value-free description, while evaluativist (or normative) analyses deny the possibility of such value-free description (these are discussed in §8.1). Prepared to relinquish our current concepts, revisionists are also loosely distinguishable from conservatives favoring the retention of (at least some) traditional categorizations. And finally, the nature of mental disorder will be sought either through a posteriori scientific research based in cognitive science, or through conceptual analysis derived in part or whole from social and cultural norms.

3. The Mental in Mental Disorder

In a once-common practice, mental or “functional” disorders were diagnosed just when no somatic traits were evident. Such language is now explicitly disavowed, eclipsed by a growing confidence that all disorders involve bodily states (Sykes 2010; APA 2013: 309). Still, the “mental” in mental disorder is variously construed. In this section we'll first consider different views on "where" in disorder that mentality lies and, then, different views on what it consists in.

3.1 Internal Causes and Downstream (Symptomatic) Manifestations

On traditional, two-part models from pathology, dysfunctional organic processes internal to the individual are manifested in, and causally responsible for, more readily observable signs and symptoms; collectively, these two parts make up the disease concept. Employed for mental disease (illness, disorder), certain of those underlying processes have been delimited as mental by appeal to the traditional categories of faculty psychology (perception, affection, cognition, memory, and so on). For example, hallucinations represent dysfunctional perceptual capabilities, mania and depression disturbed affect regulation, and delusions defective cognitive processing. A disorder is thus determined to be mental as distinct from physical if its internal causes involve psychological faculties (Wakefield 1997). By contrast, although also governed by traditional facultative divisions, other accounts ascribe disabled mentality not to underlying features but to effects on the subject’s social and personal functioning (Rashed & Bingham 2014; Wakefield 1992, 1997.). For example, it is because her states of sadness and self-doubt result in absenteeism, that the person with depression seeks medical help (see §4.2).

On two-stage accounts both internal and outwardly-observed features form a part. (At least this is true of mental disorders that are prototypical, according to George Graham [2010].) Internal and more readily observable features are each included in the DSM definition of mental disorder:

a syndrome characterized by clinically significant disturbance in an individual’s cognition, emotion regulation, or behavior, that reflects a dysfunction in the psychological, biological or developmental processes underlying mental functioning. (APA 2013: 20, emphasis added)

The different positions on mental disorder just sketched—emphasizing internal conditions, observable manifestations, and both—are discussed in Section 4. Each position exhibits vulnerabilities. Accounts stressing inherent features regularly rely on hypothetical entities or processes, expecting that out of future discoveries will emerge knowledge of causal mechanisms presently hidden from view. (This position has a long history; for a recent version, see Murphy 2007.) Perhaps explained by its status as a new science, this faith has been sorely tested, thus far, by confused classifications, apparently ill grounded research, and other liabilities, as well as incomplete models of mental dysfunction (see §4 and §6). If these impediments can be overcome, emphasis on internal causes may be expected to yield powerful explanatory models, laying the ground for the incalculably valuable targeted interventions and effective prevention and treatment sought by all. (See entry on Philosophy of Psychiatry). Placing emphasis on disabling or dysfunctional symptoms has comparable vulnerabilities associated with relativism. One setting’s dysfunctional mental symptom may be another’s normal, admired, or useful trait; and mental disorder must be distinguished conceptually from deviance, as well as from normal responses to the losses and setbacks that are our common human experience (these issues are discussed in §4, §8, and §10).

3.2 The Mark of the Mental

Views on the nature of the mental in mental disorder come from both philosophical accounts and, implicitly, from cognitive psychology. In some philosophical accounts including those stemming from phenomenological traditions, the mental is distinguished by particular features: it bears a special relationship to conscious awareness, and to persons, for example, or may be taken to exhibit the distinctive “aboutness” or intentionality exclusive to mental attitudes (see §5). Some theorizing about meaning and language similarly emphasizes the reasons-responsiveness of all human thought and action, by which disorder can alone be explained and understood (Campbell 1999, 2001, 2013; Thornton 2007).

Explanatory accounts of cognitive capacities in cognitive psychology have taken several different forms over the years: information processing models, which themselves were made up of computational processes and representations; connectionist networks; and, more recently, directly neural accounts. Moreover, philosophical reconstructions of cognitive psychology and cognitive science must be distinguished from the cognitive psychology practiced by psychologists—although little discussion of "the mental" occurs in either. Instead, focus is on the cognitive when, as was pointed out earlier, the "cognitive" subsumes capacities, states, and processes that used to be considered non-cognitive, such as sensations and emotions. Widespread acceptance of these shifts in much theoretical and research writing on mental disorder has gone some way toward eclipsing more philosophical concepts of mind and the mental, even though commonsense cognitive capacities, which are understood to involve intentionality, remain the starting point of the research program of cognitive science, and branches of cognitive psychology and cognitive neuroscience address traditionally “mental” processes such as reasoning and consciousness.

The focus of cognitive psychology usually lies with computation and representation. Mental/cognitive states (representations) depict features of the outside world (as well as other mental states and abstract entities), and mental/cognitive processes operate on those inner symbols, transforming and manipulating them (see Von Eckardt 1993; Friedenberg & Silverman 2011; Cratsley & Samuels 2013, and the entry on cognitive science). Although demarcated by the faculties known as “mental”, the realm of the cognitive is typically construed as properties or processes with a causal role in determining behavior, or behavioral capacities, that offer no resistance to naturalistic characterization (Chalmers 1996). Candidates for a distinctive “mark of the cognitive” are debated—but so is the need for one (for discussion of this question, see Varga 2018).

3.3 Metaphysical Implications

Contrary to what has sometimes been feared, the broad grouping of mental disorders does not require an embrace of unwanted metaphysical dualism. Mental disorders are conditions or states attributed to persons, but this need entail neither that they are entirely non-physical in nature, nor that they must be explained in solely neuro-scientific terms. Maintaining the separation between mental and physical disorders is compatible with some form of weak physicalism, for example, allowing that mental or psychological processing involved in functions such as perception, reasoning and memory, depends on the workings of the brain (see Schaffner 2013 and the entry on health).

4. The Disorder in Mental Disorder

How might mental disorders be distinguished from non-disordered mental states and conditions? Depression and anxiety, the schizophrenias, obsessions, compulsions and the like are core instances of mental disorder, but psychiatric classification acknowledges many other conditions as well. From such a large and apparently heterogeneous collection, the broad category may best be judged a family resemblance one. Indeed, through a different historical or cultural lens, the assembled variations known today as mental disorders would likely appear incoherently arbitrary and diverse. Yet, spurred by essentialist expectations (and out of concern about the unwarranted “medicalization” of normal states and behavior), the quest for a unifying conception of mental illness or disorder has persisted within philosophical research. Characteristic features have been identified, including disunity, irrationality, the presence of suffering and disability, and several forms of dysfunction. Formal analytic definitions have also been proposed, and are illustrated in Section 4.4.

4.1 Disunity and Irrationality

Works of ancient philosophy are focused more on the psyche’s health (or eudaimonia) than its illness. Nonetheless, there are hints that just as a unified soul is one that is healthy (as well as rational and virtuous), a soul lacking unity will be disturbed, or mad. Offering an account of the harmonious soul, whose rational and non-rational elements achieve a unified whole, Aristotle leaves us a picture of the warring and fractured state of an unhealthy soul, for example.[4] The emphasis on disunity is here tied to the vices and irrationality: a fully unified soul is virtuous and rational, a dis-unified one vicious and irrational in its unhealthy divisions. And, while they adhere to a different account of the passions and a more knowledge-based and Platonic analysis of vice, this link with the vices and virtues is also characteristic of the subsequent Stoic analyses (Irwin 2013). A conception of mental illness as psychic disunity (as well as an association between health, rationality and virtue) reoccurs in later philosophy (Spinoza, for example), and in psychoanalytic traditions. Within present-day disorder descriptions, some symptom clusters readily fit the classical emphasis on disunity (addictions, and bipolarity, for example); others, including most personality disorders, are less persuasively depicted in such terms (see Worrell & Denham 2016).

As a characteristic attributed to mental disorder irrationality or “unreason” has been linked to emphasis on order and logic during the “Age of Reason”, which (together with the emergence of empirical science), is seen to have laid the foundation for our contemporary psychiatric categories and theories.[5] In the present day, cultural norms and intuitive folk psychology assign the boundaries of mental disorder, and these intuitions conflict about some particular conditions (addictions, and disorders of “character” or personality, for example). Yet disturbed or disabled doxastic states and capabilities remain core exemplars of disorder, over which intuitive agreement is consistent. Characterized by incomprehensibly disordered thought, failure to adjust beliefs in response to new evidence, inconsistencies between thought and action, and delusional convictions, psychosis and psychotic thought patterns are regularly judged prototypical features of mental disorder. So the rationalistic analysis of disorder may yet correspond—but to a reduced version of the presently sprawling overall category.

Forms of doxastic irrationality are still the mainstay of much policy and legal analysis about mental disorder. Assessments of criminal responsibility, of fitness to stand trial, and of the capacity to undertake binding contracts, for example, are cast in terms of the defendant’s ability to know and understand (Reznek 1987; Robinson 1996, 2013; Adshead 2008). Ostensibly, construing mental disorder as a want of rationality has been weakened in the face of evidence from behavioral economics showing that holding and acting on well-grounded and reasons-responsive beliefs occurs rarely in the general population, and common prejudices and superstitions seem to be indistinguishable from clinical delusions with respect not only to their prevalence but to the way they are adopted and maintained (Bortolotti 2009, 2013).

Confidence that irrationality defines mental disorder is similarly eroded if, understood as effective social function and personal flourishing, mental health lies in traits such as unwarranted optimism, and the distorting tendency to emphasize, and remember, success over failure experiences in “positive illusions”(Taylor & Brown 1988; McKay & Dennett 2009; Jefferson et al. 2017). Along these lines, some illusions, delusions, and hallucinations have recently been acknowledged

perfectly acceptable, sometimes praiseworthy ways of being hopeful, committed to imagining and enacting a better world for oneself and others…making moral and meaningful lives. (Flanagan & Graham 2017: 309)

But as this indicates, whether disorder is usefully characterized as a want of reason depends, finally, on guiding, normative conceptions of mental health or eudaimonia, and of the role of reason in those conceptions—not on facts of the matter, or consequentialist reasoning.

4.2 Suffering and Disability

Other depictions of disorder rely on one or both of the groups of traits around suffering, distress and psychic pain, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, disability, incapacity and personal or behavioral dysfunction. These are the features noted in a series of influential prefatory remarks in the diagnostic and statistical manuals (the DSMs and ICDs). The wording of the fifth edition of the DSM introduces a disjunction:

Mental disorders are usually associated with significant distress or disability in social, occupational, or other important activities. (APA 2013: 20, emphasis added)

A very similar passage from the ICD-10 is comparably qualified:

“Disorder”…is used here to imply the existence of a clinically recognizable set of symptoms or behavior associated in most cases with distress and with interference with personal functions. (WHO 1992: 5, emphasis added)

Because distress, psychic pain, and suffering form a part of normal human experience, and the presence of distress is also used to separate disorder from social deviance, further qualifications follow each of these statements (WHO 1992: 5)). In addition, as the disjunction in the DSM formulation apparently recognizes, many disorders fail to exhibit evidence of distress or suffering.

Psychodynamic or psychoanalytic presuppositions may posit underlying distresses that are masked, or submerged, within the psyche; and the elusive phenomenology of some conditions suggests the presence of nameless existential anxieties hidden from awareness (Ratcliffe 2008, 2017). But such explanations aside, distress has been widely regarded as a ubiquitous, if not unfailing, feature of disorder. In symptom-focused accounts laying stress on the consequences of the syndrome, distress becomes prominent as a form of disabling dysfunction (Stein et. al. 2010). Instead of separate criteria (and either singly or jointly sufficient for disorder, as in the respective DSM and ICD definitions above), suffering and dysfunction are conjoined on a “distress-impairment” analysis, where disorder status is assigned with (and defined as) distress that is “unmanageable or disabling” (Bolton 2013). Whether this analysis applies to the whole class of mental disorders as presently understood is doubtful: its plausibility increases with what has been called “distress related conditions”, such as depression and anxiety, that are “more constitutive of the illness” (Bolton 2012: 10; see also §4).

To accommodate exceptions that seem neither distressing nor disabling (such as manic states), mental disorder is sometimes characterized not by distress and dysfunction but by raised risk of such outcomes (Gert & Culver 2004). But risk of disorder is not disorder, and risk language invites troubling issues around over-diagnosis and false positives ((Schwartz 2008; Stein et al. 2010; Bolton 2013; Broome, Fugar-Poli, & Wuyts 2013).

Loosely understood, moreover, distresses such as these are an inescapable part of the human condition and a normal response to life’s vicissitudes. When and whether normal (and even appropriate) suffering reflects pathology has long been the source of philosophical—and societal—disagreement (Wilkinson 2000; Horwitz & Wakefield 2007). In the discussions of “normal sadness” that accompanied the revision of a fifth edition of the DSM, the grief exclusion that had (temporarily) exempted from diagnosis the suffering around mourning and grief, was challenged, its proposed elimination charged with “medicalizing” or “pathologizing” normal and appropriate human feelings (Zachar 2014; Wakefield 2012). We might expect the separation of normal from pathological distress and, more broadly, the characterization of mental disorder in terms of distress, to be indicated by distress emanating from the disorder itself, rather than from other contingencies. But equally outcomes of the disorder itself are the distresses resulting from the stigma and discrimination that follow diagnosis and treatment, as well as a host of other, frequently negative, consequences in jarring and alarming disruptions to personal lives, selves, and relationships (Tekin 2011).

Pathological distress must thus be further specified, as the result of causes inherent to the individual and/or her disorder. Research identifying and explaining the physical elements of affect regulation predicts that biological markers will eventually allow us to distinguish distress that is a symptom of depression, for example, from that which is a more normal response (Horwitz & Wakefield 2007). (In serving to shrink the margins of disorder, such biomarkers may be welcomed by those decrying over-diagnosis, even if an evaluative interpretation as to whether, and when, such biomarkers occur in healthy and unhealthy form is still required.)

Rather than illness attributions being made on the basis of any antecedent facts about the body, Mohammed Rashed and Rachel Bingham argue that the subjective experience of distress and the extent of impairment of the person’s day-to-day functioning is an intrinsic property of depression: conceptually such attributions are made on the basis of “consequences of the syndrome as they manifest for the subject” (Rashed & Bingham 2014: 245). Similarly stressing intrinsic properties, others have emphasized that psychological symptoms may constitute a mental disorder, even as it is caused by biological or social factors. Thus, in the case of depression without evidence of known biomarkers, our intuitions suggest disorder would be attributed on the basis of psychological symptoms alone. Were known biomarkers present without evidence of any psychological symptoms, on the other hand, no attribution would be made. These intuitions may shift with time, it is recognized, so the assertion is limited to how most people and most psychiatrists now understand, define, diagnose, and treat, depression (Sinnott-Armstrong & Summers forthcoming). But today at least, disorder would be attributed on the basis of the symptoms of depression with or without known biomarkers.

Analyses characterizing felt distress as a property constitutive of some given psychiatric condition (such as depression), are also compatible with recent models focused on the causally interconnected statistical networks making up symptom clusters. These clusters are depicted as reinforced through feedback loops that serve to rope together assorted symptoms independent of any underlying, antecedent, common, cause. In the case of depression, a range of symptoms arise from diverse sources and, through their looping interactions, form, worsen, and maintain the disorder as a relatively stable entity and conceptual whole (Kendler, Zachar, & Craver 2011; Borsboom & Cramer 2013).

Symptom-focused accounts sometimes combine suffering with disability, as was noted. But standing alone, something the affected person is prevented from doing, or unable to do as well as others, captured in the ideas of disability, impairment, incapacity and personal or behavioral dysfunction, offers an alternative characterization that can acknowledge disorders without apparent personal suffering (notably mania, some personality disorders, and some addictions).

Dysfunction and disability have been allied, or treated as rough equivalents, but disability is also placed in opposition to dysfunction. Instead of construed as internal to the person, disabilities are often represented as conditional impairments, dependent on context (including physical and social arrangements). They impose limitations on the person’s ability to perform everyday activities and participate as more typically-abled people do and, on this view, call for appropriate accommodation analogous to ramps for those using wheelchairs (Oliver 1996; Polvora 2011). The analogies linking psychiatric with other disabilities may not be complete, however, nor can accommodations be achieved as easily as installing ramps (see Amundson & Tresky 2007; Rashed 2019).

4.3 Dysfunction in Two Stage Analyses

Dysfunction forms a central element of the most widely discussed analytic definition of mental disorder, introduced in Section 3. The notion of dysfunction applies in two distinct ways in Wakefield’s harmful dysfunction analysis, one way avowedly objective, and the other not (see §4.4). In the first, dysfunction occurs in some part or parts of a bodily or neural system. That dysfunction in turn causes dysfunction in some part or parts of the individual’s social and personal system (grounding the normative judgment of harmfulness). Only the first kind of dysfunction is claimed to permit non-evaluative description.

The characteristic dysfunction of mental disorder is here part of a standard, idiopathic model, as we saw, with these disabling traits understood as the symptomatic, causal manifestations of an underlying, pathological process. The appropriateness of that model for psychiatric conditions has received persistent critique during the twentieth century (see §10.1). Recent challenges include the alternative network models (introduced in §4.2), where symptomatic dysfunction emanates not from some disabled inner mechanism, but instead emerges piecemeal from interacting experiences that cumulatively build clusters of disabling symptoms out of feedback loops (Kendler, Zachar, & Craver 2011; Borsboom & Cramer 2013). In support of this alternative model is accumulating evidence from the social sciences that a range of factors combine to bring about disorder: individualistic risk factors, but also aspects of the broader context in which the individual finds herself (Bolton 2010; Kirmayer, Lemelson, & Cummings 2015).

4.4 Formal Definitions

Eschewing a more formal analysis, some definitions (including the “distress-impairment” analyses introduced earlier), rely on prototypical cases (see Graham 2010, for example). Others are more ambitious, proposing analytic definitions in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. Some are intended to cover other medical conditions as well as mental disorders. (For those stressing the inseparability and interdependence of mental and bodily disorder, no important distinction is acknowledged between mental and physical disorders [Pârvan 2015].) (i)–(iv) below are a sample of these efforts.

  1. A disease is the absence of normal function of a mechanism or process in a person that detracts from the person’s survival or reproduction (Boorse 1977). More recent elaborations on this early version of the definition emphasize biological function and statistical normality, so that on a bio-statistical theory, diseases are internal states that depress a functional ability below species-typical levels (relative to age and sex) (Boorse 1997). Critiques of this definition have challenged its aspiration to be value free; its introduction of an arbitrarily selected reference class; and its failure to honor the accepted distinction between “disease” with its implied defectiveness, and mere difference (Bolton 2008).
  2. A condition is a mental disorder if and only if (a) the condition causes some harm or deprivation of benefit to the person as judged by the standards of the person’s culture, and (b) the condition results from the inability of some internal mechanism to perform its natural function, wherein a natural function is an effect that is part of the evolutionary explanation of the existence and structure of the mechanism (Wakefield 1992). Critiques of this definition occur later in this section and in Section 5. In addition, definitions in evolutionary theoretic terms introduce a category of innate risk factors that is belied by the way natural, social, and individual factors are inextricably interwoven in disorder (Bolton 2008). And the formulation relies on unsubstantiated, empirical assumptions about the way natural selection underlies natural function (Lilienfeld & Marino 1995; Murphy & Stich 2000). The relativism in (a) above has been challenged (Gert & Culver 2004: 421; Bolton 2008). And rather than exhibiting dysfunction, at least some mental disorders may be explained in relational terms, by traits that are mismatched in the person’s context, due to their developmental or evolutionary features (Garson 2015).
  3. A mental malady is a condition of a person, other than his rational beliefs and desires, such that he is suffering, or at increased risk of suffering, an evil (death, pain, disability, loss of freedom or opportunity, or loss of pleasure), in the absence of a distinct sustaining cause (Gert & Culver 2004). The concept of a sustaining cause is unacceptably vague and inclusive, permitting conditions to count as disorders that are not, intuitively, disorders at all (Murphy 2007). For example, some disorders leave permanent, non-pathological alterations in the character that outlast any immediate stressors, such as a more pessimistic outlook or increased risk-adverseness (Radden 2009).
  4. A condition is pathological if and only if it is an abnormal bodily/mental condition that requires medical intervention and that harms standard members of the species in standard conditions (Reznek 1987: 163–4). For criticisms of this definition’s appeal to baseline population norms, and to medical intervention, see comments on (i), (ii) and (iv) above. Reference to required medical intervention fails to acknowledge the fears about over-medicalization and over-diagnosis often prompting the quest for a definition in the first place; its “required” also invokes debates and concerns over enhancement. (See Elliott 2003; Savulescu, ter Meulen, & Kahane 2011.)
  5. Diseases involve deprivation, but a disease is a depriving relation rather than a depriving entity, depending on the patient for its existence…the person is not conceived as ontologically diminished or defective because it suffers the deprivation. Drawing on Augustine’s ontology of disease, bodily integrity, and the human person, Alexandra Pârvan argues that disease stands in ontologically necessary connection with the patient as person. (From this is derived a treatment approach based on how the person relates to the disease, and a goal of reconfiguring the person as deprived but not diminished [Pârvan 2015, 2016].) This account is limited inasmuch as it requires adherence to its Augustinian ontology.

5. Phenomenological Approaches

The symptoms of mental disorder are primarily, if not exclusively, states about which their subject can claim a sort of authority. (Since in describing these states subjects can intentionally or unintentionally mislead, such loosely phenomenological [or “experience-near”] reports may nonetheless present epistemic limitations as data (Kontos 2016).) Psychology can provide reliable behavioral assessments of disorder, and indicate its presence through laboratory performance tests. But no mental disorder is thus far independently verifiable (though blood tests or scans, for example). So first person reports play a special part in understanding such disorder for the clinician, and those establishing philosophical analyses are similarly beholden (Flanagan 2011; Varga 2015). Carl Jaspers’ 1913 General Psychopathology, which combines close, clinical description with the method and presuppositions of existential and phenomenological thinkers such as Husserl and Heidegger, has been widely discussed (Jaspers 1913 [1963]). (Jaspers’ pairing of clinical and philosophical knowledge makes him one of the undisputed originators of the research field known as the philosophy of psychiatry and psychopathology.) Confusingly, not every loosely “phenomenological” clinical approach focused on the patient’s experience and report adheres to all of the tenets of the philosophical discipline of phenomenology derived from these traditions, however (see Parnas & Sass 2008).

The phenomenological strand of philosophical analysis influenced by thinkers like Husserl and Heidegger remains focused on immediate, first person report (for example, self-experience in psychosis (Parnas & Sass 2008), disordered temporal experience (Fuchs 2005, 2013), delusional states (Parnas & Sass 2008; Gallagher 2005, 2011, 2013), and affective disturbances (Ratcliffe 2008; Ratcliffe & Stephan 2014; Jacobs et. al. 2014)). In these traditions neither psychology nor psychopathology are empirical sciences in the usual sense because they involve distinctive forms of explanation. Arising within nineteenth century social science, the hermeneutical approach involving meanings calls for Verstehen (understanding), a distinctive, interpretive way of apprehending human action. (See Jaspers 1913 [1963]; Phillips 2013,Wiggins & Schwartz 2011; Spitzer & Uehlein 1992.) These differences of approach bring differing orientations towards fundamentals, and writing following German and French traditions has been placed in contrast to the “Anglo-empiricist” approach judged more influenced by empirical science, and showing greater emphasis on objectivity and measurement (Mullen 2011).

These differences bring contrasting theories about psychology as science. Whether, bypassing diagnostic categories and medical disease models entirely, symptoms and the subjective life of the patient should be the main or even sole locus of attention, is one (Stanghellini 2004); another is whether the experiences associated with psychosis, particularly, must be categorically divorced from more typical psychological processes (Sass 2001; Parnas & Sass 2008). Emphasizing the unique challenges imposed by interpretation in psychiatry, Somogy Varga has argued for a hermeneutics distinctive to psychiatry that is grounded in ideas about the self-interpreting aspect of human beings, “mental disorder” thus standing in an asymmetrical relation that is supervenes on our self identities (Varga 2015).

There is disagreement over the correct application of phenomenological method (Mishara 2007; Sass, Parnas, & Zahavi 2011). But psychopathology likely offers a challenge so great as to call for a range of approaches (Ratcliffe 2011; Wiggins and Schwartz 2011; Gallagher 2013). Attempts have also been made to combine phenomenological with empirical approaches: Matthew Ratcliffe’s work on affective states employs social research methods, for example (Ratcliffe 2008; Ratcliffe & Stephan 2014). And efforts to tie in phenomenological theorizing with findings in neuroscience have yielded the hybrid methodology of phenomenological clinical neuroscience advocating an initial study of subjective experience to only then be probed for its underlying neurobiology (Mishara 2007: 34).

The merging of empirical and phenomenological methodologies is also readily supported by the tenets of some accounts of embodied and enactive cognition. Conceptions of the embodied, embedded, and sense-making enactive mind bring emphasis on the way, shaped by perceptual experience, consciousness and the first person perspective form the basis of all mental processing (Varela, Thompson, & Rosch 1991; Durt, Fuchs, & Tewes 2017; Di Paolo & De Jaegher 2017). Applied to mental disorder, this departure from classical cognitivist assumptions and analogies suggests that in at least some, and perhaps all cases, disorder grows out of disturbances in embodied interaction with the environment, and not from dysfunctions occurring in high-level cognitive mechanisms (Drayson 2009; Stanghellini 2004; Maiese 2016).[6]

6. Classification

While Section 3 focused on what might separate mental from non-mental disorders, and Section 4 was concerned with how to separate disordered from non-disordered states, Section 6 addresses another aspect of classification: controversies over how different types of putative mental disorders should be distinguished from one another. These controversies, like so many about psychiatry, span the disciplines of medicine, science (including neuroscience and psychology) and philosophy.

The diagnostic and statistical classificatory manuals and international disease classifications (DSMs and ICDs) share broad features in providing a categorical scheme of separate mental disorders: each disorder is idiopathic in arising at least in part from morbid factors within the person, and each is identified on the basis not of causal explanation but “descriptively”, using polythetic (disjunctive) criteria to be employed with clinical observation of individual patients (including their self-report). Aside from serving the institutions providing services, their uniformity is aimed to enhance inter-diagnostician reliability; and research based on these reliable classifications, it has been hoped, should eventually allow validation of the categories (APA 1980). (Failure of this hope to achieve its promised yield in research findings partly motivated the revised research domain criteria (RDoC), described later in this section.)

Philosophical discussions of psychiatric classification can be arranged according to their allegiance to the DSMs and ICDs, and their accompanying presuppositions. Following early work by Carl Hempel (1961) that depicted psychiatry’s claim to scientific status as depending on the value neutrality of its classifications, much discussion of classification has been entirely critical, conceding little usefulness to the approach, skeptical of the promise of validity, doubtful of its methodology and claims to scientific authority, un-persuaded by the categorical system employed, as well as its individualistic and idiopathic emphasis, and dubious over its claim to being, or being able to be, value-free. Philosophical analysis has often been focused on particular symptom descriptions, disregarding or disavowing the diagnostic categories of which they are presumed to be clinical manifestations, in some cases introducing and employing revised categories such as “distress related conditions” (Bolton 2012), “body image disorders”(Morris 2013), and “real hallucinations” (Ratcliffe 2017). Others have accepted the entities so classified (Sass, Zahavi, Frith and colleagues, for example).

Criticisms of DSM and ICD classifications have addressed their research purposes and usefulness, categorical approaches and supposed value-neutrality. (The claim to value neutrality is discussed in Section 8. These classifications recognize the presence of many overarching values, including the methodological ones implicit in their goals of achieving validity and reliability. But further, unsupportable values (such as homophobia and misogyny) have been identified as well.)

6.1 Research Purposes and Usefulness

Even by those within psychiatry, it has been widely concluded that as tools for research, the prevailing classifications are flawed, producing findings tending to be inconsistent, non-replicable, non-specific, or ambiguous, with the categories involved exhibiting problems of construct and predictive validity, as well as imprecise phenotypic definitions, widespread heterogeneity, and extensive comorbidity (Cuthbert & Insel 2013; Poland 2014). Reviewing these flaws in the classification scheme and the research dependent on it, Jeffrey Poland and Barbara Von Eckardt conclude that it provides a very poor map of the domain of mental illness, leading to a crisis in mental health research practice (Poland & Von Eckardt 2013).

Research-related concerns such as these have led to upheavals within psychiatry, issuing in new, dimensional criteria by which the research domain is to be approached (Revised Domain Criteria, or RDoC). Separate units of analysis (genes, cells, circuits, self reports, etc.) are each employed in specific research domains (such as positive and negative valence systems, cognitive systems, systems for social processes, and arousal/regulatory systems), and the intersections of units of analysis with research domains produce segments of a spectrum linking normal and atypical features. Although whether the following goals are entirely compatible has been questioned, the aim here is to promote both more accurate research and more effective treatments (Cuthbert & Insel 2013; Perring 2016). And while answering some of the concerns about the earlier classificatory model, RDoC has in its turn been criticized for, among other features, its conception of validity; its assumptions about the uniformity of normal distributions; its continuing acceptance of clinical and medical presuppositions assigning disorder to the individual rather than the broader social context; and its finding little place for personal agency, and assuming a traditional, individualistic and autonomous model of self challenged by today’s philosophical analyses. (See essays in Poland & Tekin 2017.)

In partial defense against objections to DSM-type classifications, Elizabeth Lalumera employs the contrast between conceptions (procedures of identifications) and concepts (reference fixing representations). Mental disorders may still correspond to theoretically informed concepts, thus far incompletely understood, and presently known only through descriptive conceptions enabling identification practices in diagnosis and care (Lalumera 2016).

6.2 Categorical and Dimensional Approaches

DSM-type classification adheres to a classical nineteenth century disease model, whereby each disease is a discretely bounded entity, made up of a symptom cluster emanating from underlying organic states or processes within the individual patient. The applicability of each aspect of this model to mental disorder has been challenged. Some would replace its idea of validity (involving a relation between classificatory name and underlying disease) with the statistical concept of predictive or prognostic validity, which proceeds without reference to underlying causes. Rather than discretely bounded, many disorders appear to be continuous with normal states. In an interpretive and definitional choice, over which the data remains ambiguous, mental disorders arguably represent no more than tails of normal distributions of particular traits in the general population (Machery 2017). But the uniformity of these normal distributions has also been questioned (Poland & Tekin 2017).

Some diagnostic conditions (post-traumatic stress disorder, most unarguably) apparently arise from elements of their subject’s surrounding social, economic, and cultural context. Even those with more claim to idiopathic genetic, neurological, or biological causes or predisposing factors are recognized to exhibit a course more strongly influenced by environmental than (hypothesized) inherent factors, thus putting pressure on the “common cause” hypothesis, whereby a syndrome is explained by a single inherent feature (Borsboom & Cramer 2013). Solely internal, organic states and processes, and genes, cannot alone explain all, and probably any, diagnostic disorders.

Expanding with each new addition, the collection of disorders enumerated and described in these classifications has prompted alarm over the boundaries of mental disorder, the erosion of normal, mentally healthy states and variations, and the inappropriate role played by medical psychiatry and, finally, science, in dictating norms of healthy psychic functioning. Added to narratives critical of modernist science and psychiatry, other philosophical criticisms of such “medicalization”, emphasize the increasing influence of neuroscience in transforming cultural expectations and diminishing individual agency, and the power over psychological norms exhibited by the psychopharmacological industry (Phillips 2009, 2013; Rose & Abi-Rached 2013; Moncrieff 2008; Sadler 2005 , 2013, Whitaker & Cosgrove 2015; Valenstein 2002).

In contrast to these commonly-voiced apprehensions about over-medicalization, there remains the persistent charge of under-diagnosis and under-treatment of those with diagnosable mental disorder, often attributed to stigma, and to the socioeconomic status of under-served communities. Epidemiological findings about the incidence of disorder, as distinct from its diagnosis, are notoriously insufficient (due to self-stigma and fear of discrimination, for example, but also to distorting placebo effects, and to research methods misleadingly susceptible to false positives (Jopling 2009; Horwitz & Wakefield 2007; Poland & Von Eckardt 2013)). The actual epidemiological data remains opaque and equivocal, leaving these contrary speculations unresolved and likely unresolvable.

The DSM and ICD diagnostic classifications have been remarkably influential worldwide: today, they appear almost immovably permanent. But viewed within their broader moral, political, and social context, which includes psychiatry’s apparently uneven provision of effective treatment, the appropriate stance to adopt towards them, as Christian Perring has pointed out, remains critical and skeptical (Perring 2016: 87).

7. Natural Kind Status

Philosophers of science have explored whether mental illnesses might be classified as natural kinds, the claim made about particular diagnostic categories or symptom clusters (depression, schizophrenic disorder, and autism, for example), as well as about separate symptoms (Cooper 2007; Samuels 2009). Bolstered by recognition that even the category of biological species would not meet an essentialist criterion for classification as natural kinds, a “homeostatic property cluster” account of natural kinds has been proposed (Ellis 2001; Cooper 2007; Murphy 2007; Samuels 2009). (See entry on Species.) The expectation here is merely that a natural kind must be able to ground explanations and inductive inferences, and enable effective human intervention. Linked by shared causal properties such as genes, on this view, their homeostatic aspect ensures that property clusters making up separate disorders (or symptoms) will remain stable enough to behave the same way in response to the same conditions, due to a similarity-generating mechanism explaining their co-occurrence. (That comparable stability and consequent predictive properties could arise not from shared causal properties such as genes, but as the result of feedback loops binding symptoms together in stable clusters has also been proposed. See essays in Kincaid and Sullivan 2014.)

Granted, psychological categories seem to be more like biological species than like gold, magnesium or atomic particles, for instance, in possessing fuzzy boundaries and seeming to rest on continua, rather than forming discrete categorical entities. But the differences have often been seen as profound, as three examples will demonstrate. (i) Some have taken psychological categories to represent a different order of being, as we saw in Section 5, with its own distinctive forms of causal explanations (Jaspers 1913 [1963]; Bolton 2008; Wiggins & Schwartz 2011; Kusters 2016). (ii) Others point out that psychological categories can alter, and eventually even be altered by, the persons they classify, forming “interactive” kinds through such looping effects. Indeed, mental disorders have been denied the status of natural kinds on precisely the grounds that instability in their properties results when they have been classified and labeled (Hacking 1995). And in a final example (iii), some have tried to show that the relation between mental illnesses and biological kinds differs according to the role played by values in establishing the taxa of mental illness (Wakefield 1992; this claim is discussed in §8). None of these differences has gone un-criticized. A thoroughgoing mind to brain reductionism would reject (i). About (ii), it has been pointed out that the classification of biological species is also subject to the instability wrought by looping effects. And similarly, it has been argued in response to (iii) both that values also enter into the classification of biological species, and that once we reach the categories of interest in this analysis, non-evaluative traits form the observable taxa of such species (Cooper 2007).

By adopting a thoroughgoing biological reductionism it will be possible (although not necessary), to accept as dispositive the parallel between psychiatric categories and other categories recognized as natural kinds on non-essentialist definitions. But, although the diverse ends to which disease taxonomies can be put argue against finding a single answer about the kind status of mental disorders, focus on the purposes served by disorder language and categories has proven fruitful, here. (i) Mental illnesses have been assigned to a category of “practical kinds”, where membership in this class depends on some external criterion that is pragmatically relevant in the clinical context, such as a certain degree of functional impairment, and remains unrelated to the underlying structure of the kind (Zachar 2014). Along with practical kinds, moreover, mental disorders may be further classified according to their status as dimensional, discrete, and fuzzy kinds, and there is little reason to suppose mental disorders are all of one kind (Haslam 2002, 2014). (ii) Whether or not they exhibit the stability required of classifications into true natural kinds, mental illnesses do possess the properties relevant, and sufficiently stable, to guide clinical treatment, as Şerife Tekin illustrates using the lack of illness awareness (“insight”) common in patients with some diagnoses. A settled self-conception that involves being mistakenly seen as ill can be effectively treated using trust-building strategies that avoid medical language forcing the subject to explicitly acknowledge illness (Reimer 2010; Tekin 2016).

8. Values and Mental Disorder

Values have unfailingly played a part in the way mental disorders are classified, conceptualized, experienced as personal diagnosis, and treated. Philosophical accounts fall into evaluativist and objectivist camps, however, according to their allegiance to the possibility of a value-free science of psychiatry (these are considered in §8.1). Values also affect societal and personal attitudes towards disorder and diagnosis, in ways that are more immediate, considerably more urgent, and morally consequential (see §8.2). Some of these issues are dealt with in bioethical research directed specifically to psychiatry (§8.3).

8.1 Evaluativism (Normativism) and Objectivism (Naturalism)

Present day conceptions, classifications, and attributions of mental disorder contain many values, some explicit, others implicit, some moral, others non-moral (Sadler 2005, 2013)>. Unacceptable bias has been repeatedly identified, exemplified in categories such as homosexuality (with its homophobia), pre-menstrual syndrome (unwarrantedly assigning disorder status to normal function), masochistic personality disorder (pathologizing misogynist gender roles), and oppositional defiant conduct disorders (exhibiting racial bias) (Sadler 2005, 2013; Potter 2014; Poland 2014).

There is no question that values have played a role in discourse on mental disorder. The question remaining is whether moral values are inescapably attached to the conceptualization and classification of mental disorders at the level of theorizing, forming an inherent part of their definition. Such “evaluativism” (“normativism”, or “constructivism”) is placed in contrast to “objectivism” (“naturalism”), which seeks a value-free, naturalist account of mental disorder. Debates over these questions have dominated philosophical research in psychiatry and psychopathology for decades, many played out around attempts to define mental disorder in ways that are value-free (see §4). (Objectivist or naturalist conceptions have implications well beyond these academic debates, it should be added. For example, a related societal issue with practical consequences concerns the expectations around a value-free medicine in those assigning, and subject to, diagnoses, regardless of the facts of the matter.)

Etymology indicates that “illness” and “disorder” contain values (such as the preference for health over ill-health). The contrast between evaluativism and objectivism reveals nothing distinctive about mental disorder in this respect. But the theory of values based medicine (VBM) emphasizes that, because they are shared, values in the rest of medicine are not usually contentious. When VBM is adopted as a treatment approach, these contested values can be acknowledged, and the different perspectives supported, and subjected to negotiation (Fulford 2004, 2014).

As was shown earlier (§4.4), philosophical definitions aiming to avoid all values have been proposed, relying on appeal to allegedly value-neutral statistical norms, and adaptive function, respectively. The vulnerability in Boorse’s (1997) statistical definition, where normal function is determined according to the person’s reference class, identified by such criteria as age, and sex, lies both with assigning the appropriate reference class, a process that inevitably re-introduces values, and at the point on a continuous distribution curve where deviance from the mean is granted the status of dysfunctional, an assessment also involving normative judgments (Bolton 2008). Recognizing that a trait may be dysfunctional in evolutionary terms without being disvalued, and disvalued without being evidence of dysfunction, Wakefield’s two-part definition explicitly accommodates the evaluative element marking the category. This attempt to provide a naturalistic and value free evolution-based account of “function” and “dysfunction” has been subject to a range of damaging objections, including the claim that biological dysfunction is not, as promised, value neutral, carrying as it does a preference for evolutionary fitness. Discerning what would be the maximal response in terms of perpetuating the species represents another of these objections, since no agreed-upon conclusion about this can be drawn in a value-neutral, or perhaps any, way. (See Murphy & Stich 2000.)

Evaluativism and objectivism are customarily depicted as incompatible contraries, although the different domains where claims about disorder occur (including ordinary usage; conceptually clean versions of “health” and “disease”; the operationalization of dysfunction, and the justification for that operationalization), indicate need for a more nuanced analysis of the role of values in health and disease (Kingma 2014). The broad contrast between evaluativism and objectivism has also been resisted for other reasons. Judgments about mental disorder need not be entirely arbitrary and subjective as long as those values are taken to be real features of the world along the lines of McDowell’s secondary property value realism, for example. In this relaxed naturalism, objectivism merely means requiring no special subject for the disciplining, conception, and framing of judgments, and providing a contrast between correct and incorrect, or truth and falsity, for the relevant judgments (Thornton 2007).

8.2 Social and Personal Attitudes Towards Disorder and Diagnosis

The present discussion concerns evaluations that are primarily negative, although as we saw earlier, positive evaluations arise in traditions valorizing madness, and many in the neuro-diversity movement insist that autism spectrum and other mental disorders are human variations analogous to differences of gender, which ought to be granted respectful accommodation, not clinical treatment.(See Chapman 2019, Hoffman 2019.) Negative social attitudes towards observable disorder have led to stigma, self-stigma, and discrimination (Hinshaw 2007). The madman and madwoman have been the subject of fear, misunderstanding, disparagement and condemnation, their failings exaggerated and humanity denied (Gilman 1985). With modernity, care and protection apparently replaced earlier, moralistic and neglectful arrangements. (The reforms’ real effects and costs remain an unsettled matter of historical debate.[7] ) At the same time formal exceptions and protections, such as the insanity defense, recognized mental disorder as an exculpating excuse for wrongdoing and negligence. Despite such attitudinal change, however, these issues around responsibility remain contentious and unresolved (C. Edwards 2009).

The effect of diagnoses on those so distinguished has been demonstrated to be extensive, often personally transformative, and rarely consistently benign. The extent of these effects has drawn research attention to first-person report, and to the eloquent madness memoirs increasingly available for study. It has led to theorizing within formal philosophical writing, and also within the rhetoric of social movements and identity-focused political interest groups (see §10). The Recovery movement, for example, stresses the way the self and identity are diminished by diagnosis, eroding and occluding other, more positive, attributes making up the whole person. (See Jacobson & Greenley 2001; Pouncey & Lukens 2010; Davidson 2013.) Critiques of diagnosis place emphasis on its dehumanizing and “objectifying” effects that, multiplied by stigmatizing societal attitudes about psychiatric labels, engender self-stigma (Sadler 2005; Hoffman & Hansen 2017; Weiss, Ramakrishna, & Somma 2006; Hinshaw 2009; Thornicroft 2006; Kendler & Zachar 2015).

Not only the social and personal effects of diagnosis in individual lives and within mental health care, but also the societal face of psychiatric care, are achieving belated recognition. Recent data on the effects of the biogenetic explanations regularly accompanying diagnosis of mental disorder advocates for greater attention to these attitudes: research findings cannot be read as evidence of embodied defectiveness, with patients reduced to broken mechanisms; instead, patients must be brought to be aware that “their agency and optimism are not dissolved if their problems have a biological dimension” (Haslam & Kvaale 2015: 402–403).

8.3 Psychiatric Bioethics and Neuroethics

The social attitudes and values adopted towards mental disorders, added to features associated with such disorders themselves, have given rise to a bioethics differing in emphasis from that which addresses ethical issues in most of general medicine. Widespread stigma about such disorder raises extra privacy and confidentiality issues, for example. Because of the powerful and disruptive effects of the experience of disorder, conceptions of disorder, and of its treatment, are often linked to the self and identity of the subject in distinctive ways (Tekin 2011, forthcoming). The perceptual, affective, and reasoning disabilities that at least temporarily mark severe disorder are seen to jeopardize the widely-valued traits of rational autonomy, responsibility, and coherent and unified personhood, leading to challenges over autonomy and decisional capacity (R.B. Edwards 1997; Radoilska 2012; Sadler, Fulford, & van Staden 2015). And most significant, treatment raises fundamental ethical issues because it regularly employs coercive methods.

These coercive practices are judged of serious moral concern in recent policy documents. For example, coercive treatment apparently violates rights proclaimed by the United Nations Convention on the Rights of Persons with Disabilities (2006). Important philosophical issues here include whether there are person-centered and more paternalist principles that would respectively obviate, and justify, coercive treatment; how to define coercion; what constitutes valid consent; and links between coercion and stigmatizing consequences (Kallert, Mezzich, & Monahan 2011; Cratsley 2019; Pouncey & Mertz 2019). Recent theorizing addresses “mental disorder exceptionalism” (different treatment for mental and physical conditions), proposing capacity tests that would apply to everyone with reduced capacity, regardless of cause (Szmukler & Dawson 2011; Szmukler 2016).

Looking toward the future, the related, and broader field of neuroethics explores developments and prospects in neuroscience possessing increased urgency, or distinctive relevance, for psychopathology. (See Bluhm, Jacobson, & Maibom 2012; Roskies 2007; Glannon 2015; Caruso & Flanagan 2018.) For example, encroachment on “mental privacy” can be expected to disproportionately affect those with stigmatized disorders and symptoms; and a future can be envisioned in which the semantic authority of first person symptom descriptions is undermined by diagnoses independently verified through imaging or other technologies; also, traditionally gendered traits such as empathy likely perpetuate bias within neuro-scientific methods and findings (Maibom 2012). More generally, this new knowledge seems likely to foster a trend from the treatment of disorder to its prediction based on observed risk factors, which in turn spawns initiatives such as the identification and treatment of early onset, “prodromal” conditions in younger subjects (children and youth), likely affecting identity development and self-management (Broome, Fusar-Poli, & Wuyts 2013; Whitaker & Cosgrove 2015). (See entries on Philosophy of Neuroscience, and Neuroethics.)

Responsibility concepts, together with those around personhood, autonomy, diminished capacity, treatment responses, and individual rights, make up an inescapable aspect of the broad field of psychiatric ethics that includes part of the more general neuroethics. Two areas of recent research will serve to illustrate, the first concerning responsibility and blame. Attitudes of blame are customarily treated as an appropriate sequel to assigning responsibility (Watson 2004). By emphasizing the tie between responsibility and (morally-neutral) agency, Hanna Pickard uncouples responsibility from blame. At least for the apparently willful behavior of those diagnosed with disorders affecting agency, she argues, the proper stance for the care-giver is grounded in an empathic attitude that assigns responsibility without blaming, because it is one most conducive to improvement and recovery (Pickard 2011).

Closely related to these philosophical concerns about responsibility are issues involving the personality disorders, which, due to their long-recognized relationship to more normal character weaknesses, and their evidently dimensional nature, sit uneasily within psychiatric classifications (Sinnott-Armstrong 2008; Radden 2011; Pickard 2011). Among one DSM grouping (cluster B personality disorders, including borderline, narcissistic and antisocial), additional distinguishing features have been observed: their symptoms are described using moralistic language. Rather than medical entities, susceptible to medical treatments, they are better approached using persuasion, and methods reminiscent of the “moral treatment” of earlier times, Louis Charland argues (Charland 2004).

Philosophical challenges to customary moral, ethical, and medical presuppositions introduced in this section have been influenced by, and are difficult to separate from, critiques of medical psychiatry during the second half of the twentieth century that have taken place not only within academe, but also beyond it. These are discussed in Section 10.

9. Particular Psychopathologies

The category of psychosis, employed for extreme states of disorder affecting perceptual capabilities (in hallucinations) and reasoning (in delusions), are introduced here, followed by a sample of particular disorders among the many that have received philosophical attention: addiction, anorexia, psychopathy (anti-social personality disorder), and depression. Philosophical analyses of other diagnostic categories include defiant disorder (Potter 2014), borderline personality (Potter 2009); obsessive compulsive disorder (Glas 2013; Szalai 2016); dissociative identity disorder (Braude 1991; Radden 1996; Worrell & Denham 2016; Maiese 2016); anxiety (Horwitz & Wakefield 2012), and neurodevelopmental conditions such as autism spectrum disorder (Baron-Cohen, Lombardo, & Tager-Flusberg 2013).

9.1 Psychosis

The severity of hallucinations and delusions, with almost unfailing consequences for their subject in clinical, legal, social, and personal settings, serves to distinguish them from many of the general controversies about disorder noted thus far. The incidence of and pathology associated with hallucinations has been questioned, as has their origins, and phenomenology (Leudar & Thomas 2000; Ratcliffe 2017; Henriksen, Raballo, & Parnas 2015). And delusions have attracted the particular attention of philosophers for their incomprehensibility, which challenges standard epistemology and theories about meaning, language, belief, and intention (Coltheart & Davies 2000; Bortolotti 2009). They have also been the impetus for important collaborative work between several sciences: in addition to being psychiatric disorders delusions occur as symptoms of neurological diseases of and injury to the brain, and as such have been subject to considerable empirical study. Philosophical research on delusions primarily addresses issues about their intelligibility; about their status in relation to more normal doxastic states; and about explanatory models.

The intelligibility of delusions remains contested. Delusions are expressed using unexceptional syntax, and some involve content that, while inaccurate or implausible, is entirely comprehensible. These, Jaspers insisted, are secondary delusions; primary delusions, in contrast, are distinguished by their meaninglessness: attributing meaning to them is a misapplication of the hermeneutic approach (Jaspers 1913 [1963]; Gorski 2012). Influenced by Wittgenstein, others have adopted the position that all delusions are meaningless utterances (Berrios 1991). Findings in brain science have been employed to confirm the latter view. Delusions are hypothesized to reflect thought and narrative fragments trapped in the off-line, default cognitive mode, due to brain activity that prevents processes of critical evaluation (Gerrans 2014). In contrast, and following Freud, others have stressed that delusions are always comprehensible, but able to be understood only within a context that includes the person’s whole life, ideas and values (Bentall 2004; Wickham & Bentall 2016, Mullen & Gillett 2014)

Delusions are belief-like, but disagreements arise over whether they are beliefs, imaginings, some formes frustes of one of these two, or a distinct hybrid form. The doxastic position (delusions are beliefs) must somehow accommodate that compared to typical beliefs, delusions are not responsive to countervailing evidence, and are only weakly behavior guiding. (See entry for Delusions.) Associated more with imagining than with believing, these same features have led to the assertion that delusions are imaginings mistakenly identified as beliefs (Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; Broome & Bortolotti 2009). Apparently part belief and part imagining, they have also been proposed as a new hybrid form on the basis of these contradictory elements: “bimagining” (Egan 2009).

Increasingly, explanations of delusions are multi-factorial. Influential early models that grew out of research on single-themed delusions resulting from brain damage, such as Capgras, hypothesized two deficiencies: an initiating aberrant experience or perception due to brain dysfunction, combined with some failure of the system of “belief fixation” by which initial beliefs are critically reviewed in light of other information (Davies et al. 2001; Davies & Davies 2009; Young 2011). The second factor in such “two factor” theories is faulty inference, and is on some accounts distinguished by degree alone from common forms of reasoning error such as attribution bias (Bentall 2004). On an alternative, “prediction error” model, perceptual aberrations conflict with prior (Bayesian) expectations when accompanied by reasoning bias, giving rise to delusions (Stone & Young 2007; Mishara & Corlett 2009). The “polythematic” and complex delusions more often seen in the psychiatry clinic, that are partially driven by social and environmental effects, present significant challenges for cognitive science, since they involve the higher cognitive systems that apparently resist modular analysis and decomposition.

9.2 Addiction

Polarized societal attitudes towards responsibility for addictive behavior and towards its disorder status, are mirrored in philosophical analyses and theoretical positions (West 2006; Poland & Graham 2011; Flanagan 2017). Accounts that construe addiction as a disorder reducing responsibility invoke the idea of irresistible compulsion and periodic failures of self-control (Vohs & Heatherton 2000). Objections to this “willpower” view include its being unable to distinguish those who won’t from those who cannot abstain from using, deficiency from deviance (Foddy & Savulescu 2010; Levy 2013). Added to these difficulties, the phenomenology of addiction is not uniform (Kennett 2013).

Others see addiction as motivated on a standard structure of beliefs and desires, with addictive behavior simply reflecting the person’s highest priority (Foddy & Savulescu 2010). Efforts to combine these contrary positions propose an interaction between systems that regulate desires and systems that control which of those desires are acted upon (Holton & Berridge 2013). Similarly, addicts have been characterized as engaging in a misevaluation that, serving to explain their resistance to contrary evidence, is further reinforced by unthinking and impulsive behavior (Summers 2015; Lewis 2015). Reduced reasons-responsiveness and diminished responsibility have also been analyzed in terms of a deficiency of “extended agency”—the ability to extend one’s will over time to shape one’s future (Levy 2006). On another account, addiction can also be understood as disease or deficit in terms of an inability to realize vital goals, with addicts’ reduced health at least partially caused by mental disposition (Nordenfelt 1995).

9.3 Anorexia

Among eating disorders, the apparently voluntary self-starvation known as anorexia nervosa has been a subject of intense speculation and theorizing. Because of its strong gender link, this behavior has been interpreted as an attempt to exert power by a group (adolescent girls and young women) marked by powerlessness, in a form of extreme, perfectionistic self control, creating an alienated, unheimlich body (Svenaeus 2013). The role of individual agency in these activities, particularly, has been linked to self identity and identity formation (Tan, Hope, & Stewart 2003; Tan, Stewart, Fitzpatrick, & Hope 2010; Gillett 2009; Morris 2013). The disorder apparently occurs more frequently in settings of Western or Westernized, influence and affluence. Implicated as triggers have been aesthetics around women’s appearance, as well as more general Western moral priorities around self-control, and ethereal, non-bodily qualities associated with weightless lightness (Bordo 1993; Giordano 2005).

Like other self-harming practices, self starvation has not received medical diagnosis in many historical and cross-cultural contexts, where explanations instead appeal to the subject’s religious, ideological, or political motivations. So the motivation of the anorexic individual deserves attention, especially her beliefs, attitudes and feelings (Giordano 2005; Svenaeus 2013; Morris 2013). Efforts to isolate underlying perceptual dysfunction once supposed to explain the anorexic’s attitudes have been unsuccessful (Morris 2013). A more complex hypothesis, involving interaction between defective “body schemas” (non-linguistic, preconscious, bodily representations) that are distorted by, and also generate, the anorexic’s attitudes, await the attention of neuroscience. (See Morris 2013; Gadsby 2017.)

9.4 Psychopathy

In their apparent failure to recognize the difference between moral and merely conventional transgressions, it has been questioned whether so-called psychopaths (those diagnosed with antisocial personality disorder) are appropriately held responsible for their attitudes and actions (Sinnott-Armstrong 2008; Adshead 2013); whether, in seeming to hold normal moral beliefs without being motivated by them, they provide a counterexample to motivational internalism; and whether their observed amygdala dysfunction serves to excuse (Levy 2007). Patients with damage to the ventromedial frontal lobe exhibit symptoms similar to those of the psychopath (Roskies 2003): how similar, is questioned, as is what these patients with “acquired sociopathy” show about whether natural psychopaths should be exempt from responsibility (Kennett & Fine 2008; Sinnott-Armstrong 2008). The deficits apparently exhibited by psychopaths (in empathy, rationality, and volition, for example) have also been explored for the light they throw on the ingredients of the “moral point of view” (Schramme 2014). Treatment approaches critically rest on how these traits are understood (Maibom 2014). For further discussion of psychopathy, see entry on Philosophy of Psychiatry.

9.5 Depression

Since the humoral theories of earlier eras, mood disorders have been strongly associated with bodily states.[8] Chief among the several hypotheses about depression challenged by philosophers are appeals to hormonal changes and biology (particularly as they would explain depression’s persistent gender link), and accounts derived from evolutionary psychology (Varga 2012, 2016; Bluhm 2011). Related work also emphasizes that explanations of depression must appeal to broader societal structures, rather than individual vulnerabilities (Bluhm 2011; Bluhm, Jacobson, & Maibom 2012)). The uncertain line between disorders of mood and normal states of distress was discussed earlier (§4.2). It has prompted contrasting hypotheses about “true” depression, as we saw, including inferences to brain dysfunction (Horwitz & Wakefield 2007), and criteria that appeal to a disabling degree of suffering (Bolton 2013).

First person symptom descriptions from memoirs, in-depth case studies, and analysis of large data sets, have illuminated the disorder in several ways: its classification and conceptualization (Hoffman & Hansen 2017); the relation of affective states to the self (Ratcliffe & Stephan 2014; Browne 2018); the disorder status of its mood-based phenomenology (Radden 2013); the relation of depression to autonomy, and to narrative theories of emotion in treatment contexts (Radoilska 2012; Biegler 2011); temporal experience (Fuchs 2001, 2013; Ratcliffe 2008), and many more.

10. Anti-psychiatry, Feminist Theory, Post- and Critical- Psychiatry and Identity Politics

10.1 Anti-psychiatry

“Anti-psychiatry” has come to stand for ideas from mid-twentieth century thinkers such as Thomas Szasz, R.D. Laing, and Michel Foucault. Many of these involved social and political critiques and calls to action, with real-world consequences that have been linked to deinstitutionalization, human rights movements, and a shift towards more autonomy-focused mental health care. In English language theorizing Szasz and Laing rejected the appropriateness of analogizing particular “problems in living” (Szasz) with medical disorders, insisting that misapplication of the medical model to mental health was emblematic of the overreach of the medical establishment. The practices and discourses within society and its institutions making up the era’s episteme are depicted historically by Foucault, the focus on the exercise of psychiatric power that, arising with modern science, is increasingly exerted through mechanisms of protection, surveillance, and control. With modernity, on this account, power is no longer brute force, instead taking a more diffused and subtle form that imperceptibly disciplines and controls not only bodies, but selves (Foucault 1965, Bracken & Thomas 2010, 2013; Rose 2010; Iliopoulos 2012). Foucault’s sweeping ideas remain central to the “post psychiatry” and “critical psychiatry” that have emerged during the beginning of the twenty-first century.

10.2 Feminist Theory

Interwoven with these ideas from the start have been relentless critiques from feminist theory. These include acknowledgment of the women’s actual, unwarranted, institutionalization, as well as emphasis on harms of disempowerment and silencing (Kristeva 1987 [1989]), and of epistemic injustices (Dotson 2011; Sanati & Kyratsous 2015; entry on Feminist Social Epistemology). In a legacy affecting mental disorder even today, binary conceptualizations have assigned women and the feminine to illogicality, emotionality, subjectivity, the bodily, and madness (in contrast to men’s more valued traits) (G. Lloyd 1984; Potter 2009). Earlier feminist thinkers focused on the medicalization of women’s normal traits, as well as research neglect and distortion of gender-linked disorders; separate and unequal treatments; the mental health vulnerabilities associated with traditional women’s roles and identities; and diagnosis and treatment understood as tools of patriarchal social control (Russell 1995; Ussher 2011).

Feminism has consistently rejected traditional causal explanations of women’s disorder derived from allegedly natural biological predispositions, pointing instead to the effects of women’s oppressive socialization and to the consequences of devaluing women’s characteristics and abilities (Bluhm 2011). Similarly, it has emphasized the embodiment, and relationality, of the self (Bluhm, Jacobson, & Maibom 2012). And more recent work, much of it influenced by social theory and phenomenological approaches, focuses on the intersection of gender with marginality, invisibility, non-normativity and oppression in lived experience (Nissim-Sabat 2013; Zeiler & Folkmarson Käll 2014).

10.3 Post and Critical Psychiatry

Objections to the modernist presuppositions of psychiatry also take issue with the model by which disorder reflects flawed brain mechanisms or processes, serving to enhance the status of psychiatry and disempower those diagnosed with disorder (Bracken & Thomas 2005, Iliopoulos 2012). The new brain sciences will magnify this disempowerment, it is argued, with the agency and authority previously attributed to persons replaced by a bio-scientific “management of the mind” (Phillips 2009, 2013; Rose and Abi-Rached 2013). A more recent descendant of mid-twentieth century writing is the collection of concerns known as critical psychiatry: critiques of the influence of the pharmacological industry (Phillips 1996, 2013; Moncrieff 2008; Whitaker & Cosgrove 2015; Valenstein 2002; Karp 2017); a discourse around mental disorder that, influenced by hermeneutics, aims to be more sensitive to the meaning of symptoms (Bracken & Thomas 2010); and the promotion of a more equal and collaborative relationship between carers and those they treat (Double 2006; Cohen & Timimi 2008).

Associated with these ideas, some research appeals to the unique expertise of “service users” or “survivors” in analyses of mental disorder (Faulkner & Leyzell 2000; Gergel 2012; Cooper 2017). And these innovations have been analyzed appealing to critical theory, narrative research methods, the impediments to representational authority, and the co-production of knowledge (Voronka 2016; Russo & Sweeney 2016).

10.4 Identity Politics

Claims arising from political movements made up of recipients of psychiatric care include the call for a seat at the policy-makers’ table; representational authority based on first person experience of psychiatric symptoms; the complaints of unjust treatment by the “survivors” of diagnosis and care; requests for equality of mental with other disabilities, and or mental with other medical conditions; recognition of neuro-atypicality from proponents of a neurodiversity model of disorder (Ortega 2009); and from “mad pride”, the claim that madness is an attribution from which to draw strength and cultural identity. Largely neglected until now within psychiatry or philosophical writing, the claims of mad pride have recently been critically evaluated and related to the social theory of philosophers like Honneth and Taylor (Rashed 2019).

11. Future Prospects

Where might we expect philosophical work on mental disorder to go from here? Certainly, one issue must be what role or roles remain for commonsense psychology. An aspect of this is the tug of war over who decides mental health—society, or science? Ought we be guided by the values around utility sought by modern science? Or should richer eudaimonic visions be pursued? Even granted the authority to override science in determining ideals of mental health, society—and philosophy— still contend with issues such as how generously to attribute normalcy, and what might limit thinking in terms of neuro-diversity rather than deficiency, in light of the implications such alternatives hold for traditional liberal values around responsibility and the self. We can anticipate that with the ways to verify, understand, and ameliorate mental disorder it promises, neuroscience will not resolve, but instead augment and extend questions such as these, perhaps in directions barely dreamed of.


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Several colleagues offered suggestions about earlier drafts of this entry, for which I am extremely grateful: Edward Harcourt, Lisa Bortolotti, Jeff Poland, Derek Bolton, Somogy Varga, Kelso Cratsley, John Sadler, George Graham, Alexandra Pârvan, Şerife Tekin, and Christian Perring. My special thanks for invaluable comprehensive critique are owed to Ginger Hoffman and two anonymous readers assigned by the Encyclopedia.

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Jennifer Radden <>

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