Notes to Mental Representation

1. There is some unclarity in the current literature as to whether the conceptual/non-conceptual distinction concerns content — what is represented — or merely style of representational vehicle. See Byrne 2002/3. See also Gunther 2003 for a selection of important papers on non-conceptual content.

2. In the case of proprioception, to internal bodily objects and properties. The phenomenal character of pain, for example, is reducible to the representation of disturbances of a certain kind in some region of the body.

3. Though these theories were introduced to account for the content of commonsense psychological states, they may (in broad outline at least) also serve as theories of content determination for the various sorts of sub-personal informational states postulated by cognitive science.

4. A representational system is productive if there are indefinitely many distinct representations that may be constructed in it; it is systematic if the constructability of some representations is intrinsically connected to the constructability of others.

5. Though Putnam 1975 is frequently cited as a locus classicus of psychological externalism, in fact the arguments therein are for linguistic externalism — i.e., the view that the meanings of some terms are not entirely determined by the contents of the mental representations they are used to express. In Putnam’s thought experiment, the twins are psychological duplicates. (Though of course, as many (e.g., Burge 1979) have pointed out, Twin-Earth cases may be interpreted as supporting a psychological conclusion as well.)

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David Pitt <>

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