Notes to Philosophy of Microbiology

1. The earlier phase of philosophy of biology occurred from the 1930s onwards, and did not underpin the second phase from the perspective of many of its later practitioners. For an overview of some of this earlier biological work within philosophy of science, see Byron (2007). At least one of the articles published near the end of this early phase was about microbes, specifically the nature of eukaryotic microbes (Gregg 1959), but it has seldom been cited.

2. All of these features actually have microbial analogues or precursors, as the discussion of microbial models in Section 4 will reveal.

3. A clarification from Tom Richards, personal communication (2013).

4. Thanks to Quentin Hiernaux for this point.

5. See Table 1 for doubts about the usefulness of the term “kingdom”.

6. Summary from the Microbiological Reviews website: accessed 2 July 2020.

7. For reasons why this experimental model worked and others didn’t, see Hastings (2020).

8. The experiment was suspended on 9 March 2020, due to pandemic-related personnel concerns. It is expected to resume exactly where the cultures left off before they were frozen.

Copyright © 2020 by
Maureen A. O’Malley <>
Emily C. Parke <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free