There may be as much philosophical controversy about how to distinguish naturalism from non-naturalism as there is about which view is correct. In spite of this widespread disagreement about the content of naturalism and non-naturalism there is considerable agreement about the status of certain historically influential philosophical accounts as non-naturalist. In particular, there is widespread agreement that G.E. Moore’s account of goodness in Principia Ethica is a paradigmatically non-naturalist account. Indeed, if a representative sample of contemporary philosophers were asked to name a non-naturalist in meta-ethics then Moore’s name almost certainly would predominate. For better or worse, Moore’s discussion of non-naturalism profoundly shaped 20th century meta-ethics. Thomas Baldwin was not exaggerating much when he claimed that, “twentieth century British ethical theory is unintelligible without reference to Principia Ethica; its history until 1960 or so being, in brief, that although Moore was taken to have refuted ‘ethical naturalism’, Moore’s own brand of ‘ethical non-naturalism’ was thought to make unacceptable metaphysical and epistemological demands; so the only recourse was to abandon belief in an objective moral reality and accept an emotivist, prescriptivist or otherwise anti-realist, account of ethical values.” (Baldwin 1990: 66) More recent defenders of non-naturalist theories (e.g. Shafer-Landau 2003, Enoch 2011, and Parfit 2011) often distinguish their accounts from Moore’s in a number of ways, but few if any would dispute that Moore’s account is a paradigmatically non-naturalist one.
Nonetheless, simply characterizing non-naturalism in terms of Moore’s view is not very helpful for at least three reasons. First, we still need some way of determining which dimensions of similarity to Moore’s views are the relevant ones. This is a standard problem with trying to understand a genus in terms of a particularly salient species thereof. Second, Moore defended a variety of theses about goodness in Principia which have been referred to as forms of non-naturalism, so we are then left with the question what these views have in common in virtue of which they are all forms of non-naturalism. Third, Moore’s non-naturalist account of goodness in Principia is itself unclear in certain crucial respects. Indeed, his later “Reply to My Critics,” Moore himself admitted that his attempts in Principia to explain in what sense goodness was a non-natural property were untenable (Moore 1942: 582). Nonetheless, Moore’s account in Principia is important to bear in mind when trying to characterize non-naturalism in meta-ethics. For a plausible constraint on any such characterization is that it not imply that Moore clearly did not put forward a form of non-naturalism in Principia. With this constraint in hand, we are in a position to develop a more general characterization of non-naturalism.
Very roughly, non-naturalism in meta-ethics is the idea that moral philosophy is fundamentally autonomous from the natural sciences. More accurately, a family of related but distinct doctrines has gone under the heading ‘non-naturalism’. In some contexts, ‘non-naturalism’ denotes the semantic thesis that moral predicates cannot be analyzed in non-normative terms (see Shaver 2000 and Gibbard 2002: 153). In other contexts, ‘non-naturalism’ denotes the epistemological thesis that knowledge of basic moral principles and value judgements are in some sense self-evident (see Frankena 1963: 85–86). However, this view (which some self-styled naturalists would actually accept) is more often and more usefully referred to as ‘intuitionism’ and I shall henceforth also refer to it as such. Most often, ‘non-naturalism’ denotes the metaphysical thesis that moral properties exist and are not identical with or reducible to any natural property or properties in some interesting sense of ‘natural’. However, just which sense of ‘natural’ is most apt in this context is highly controversial and I shall return to this point shortly. Understood in this way, non-naturalism is a form of moral realism and is opposed to non-cognitivist positions according to which moral utterances serve to express non-cognitive attitudes rather than beliefs that provide their truth conditions and is also opposed to error-theoretical positions according to which there are no moral facts. Moreover, each of these different conceptions of non-naturalism bears interesting relations of support to the others. For example, a prima facie plausible explanation of the alleged immunity of moral predicates from analysis in non-normative terms (non-naturalism in the first sense) would be that moral predicates denote non-natural properties (which entails non-naturalism in the third sense). Perhaps unsurprisingly, Moore accepted non-naturalism in all three of these senses. Because non-naturalism is far more often understood in the third of these three ways I shall henceforth use ‘non-naturalism’ with the third of these three meanings unless otherwise noted.
It is also sometimes suggested that non-naturalism is the thesis that moral properties are sui generis and irreducible (see, e.g. Pigden 1993: 421–422), and indeed this is one of the most distinctive aspects of Moore’s account of goodness. However, this is not the best way to understand non-naturalism. For intuitively whether a property is natural is orthogonal to whether it is sui generis. We should preserve conceptual space for properties that are natural and irreducible (fundamental properties of physics are perhaps the least controversial examples, but many would argue that the fundamental properties of psychology and sociology are also irreducible but natural) as well as properties that are non-natural but reducible to other non-natural properties (perhaps rightness is reducible to goodness or vice versa even if both are non-natural). Indeed, Moore himself was at one stage a non-naturalist about rightness but nonetheless thought that rightness was reducible to the property of being the action with the best outcome, though he later abandoned this view. Furthermore, a number of self-styled contemporary naturalists hold that moral properties are both natural and irreducible (Richard Miller and Nicholas Sturgeon, for example) and we should try to accommodate this characterization of their view. In Principia Moore often (though not always – he considers the example of yellowness) seems to ignore the fact that a property might be both natural and irreducible. Undoubtedly this has led to some confusion in later discussions of naturalism and non-naturalism (for useful discussion of Moore on this point, see Baldwin 1990: 83–84).
Perhaps the most vexing problem for any general characterization of non-naturalism is the bewildering array of ways in which the distinction between natural and non-natural properties has been drawn. Natural properties have variously been characterized as properties that (i) are the subject matter of the natural sciences (Moore 1903: 40), (ii) are invoked in scientific explanations (Little 1994: 226), (iii) would be identified by the best scientific theory and can be described in conceptual terms available to a being occupying a non-local point of view on the world (Crisp 1996: 117), (iv) can be known only a posteriori (Copp 2002, Moore 1903: 39), (v) can exist by themselves in time (Moore 1903: 41), (vi) confer causal powers (Lewis 1983), (vii) figure in the laws of nature (Vallentyne 1998), or (viii) explains similarity relations (Lewis 1983), e.g. why a black cat is more similar to a white cat than to a black dog. The first four of these characterizations are epistemological, and three of those four are cast explicitly in terms of scientific inquiry; the remaining three are metaphysical.
Some of these characterizations can be put to one side rather easily. For example, the thesis that natural properties must be capable of existing by themselves in time [(v) above] seems to make the very idea of a natural property deeply problematic. As C.D. Broad argued (see Broad 1942), it is unclear how the roundness and brownness of a penny, for example, could exist in time by themselves. In light of this objection, Moore himself eventually abandoned this way of characterizing natural properties (Moore 1942: 581–582). Understanding natural properties as those studied by the natural sciences [(i) above] threatens to make our characterization of the natural implausibly dependent on what the actual objects of scientific investigation happen to be, as if there could not be natural properties our actual scientific investigation somehow never discovered. It also makes it unclear why moral philosophy is not one of the sciences (Baldwin 1985: 26). We could try to finesse this point by holding that natural properties need not actually be the subject matter of the natural sciences but instead only must be fit for investigation by the natural sciences but this characterization is simply not very illuminating. For it cries out for a characterization of what makes something fit for study by the natural sciences, and that further characterization seems likely to do all the work in explaining what is involved in a property being natural.
So we can narrow down the list of candidate ways of characterizing the natural/non-natural distinction. Still, it would be very difficult and perhaps impossible to determine just which of the remaining characterizations of natural properties would provide “the” best way of characterizing the distinction between naturalism and non-naturalism in meta-ethics. More likely, there are advantages and disadvantages to each of the remaining taxonomies on offer. Moreover, which understanding of the distinction between naturalism and non-naturalism is the most helpful will vary depending on the context and indeed on one’s more substantive philosophical commitments. I shall therefore not here undertake the fool’s errand of privileging one particular way of making the distinction between natural and non-natural properties. Instead I shall simply try to indicate in the discussion of the arguments for and against non-naturalism where these differences might matter.
- 1. The Naturalistic Fallacy
- 2. The Open Question Argument
- 3. Intuitionism
- 4. Explanatory Impotence
- 5. Motivation
- 6. Explaining Supervenience
- 7. Methodology
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Naturalistic Fallacy
Moore famously claimed that naturalists were guilty of what he called the “naturalistic fallacy.” In particular, Moore accused anyone who infers that X is good from any proposition about X’s natural properties of having committed the naturalistic fallacy. Assuming that being pleasant is a natural property, for example, someone who infers that drinking beer is good from the premise that drinking beer is pleasant is supposed to have committed the naturalistic fallacy. The intuitive idea is that evaluative conclusions require at least one evaluative premise—purely factual premises about the naturalistic features of things do not entail or even support evaluative conclusions. Moore himself focused on goodness, but if the argument works for goodness then it seems likely to generalize to other moral properties.
Somewhat surprisingly, Moore in effect also argues that most forms of non-naturalism are also guilty of what he calls the naturalistic fallacy. In particular, he argues that so-called “metaphysical ethics,” according to which goodness is a non-natural property existing in “supersensible reality” also are guilty of the naturalistic fallacy. So, for example, a view according to which goodness is the property of being commanded by God where God is understood as existing outside of Nature is also charged with having committed the naturalistic fallacy. This suggests that the naturalistic fallacy is not well named in that it is not specifically a problem for naturalists, and Moore admits as much. If the point were purely terminological then it would be trifling but an important philosophical point is at stake here. The real force of Moore’s argument is supposed to be that attempts to reduce moral properties to anything else are doomed to fail. This is why Moore’s own view of goodness as sui generis and irreducible is supposed to avoid the naturalistic fallacy. Since the reductionist/anti-reductionist distinction cuts across the naturalist/non-naturalist distinction (properly understood), this suggests that the real target of Moore’s argument is reductionism rather than naturalism. Admittedly, if Moore is right then at least reductionist forms of naturalism fall prey to the naturalistic fallacy and it is therefore still relevant to the debate over naturalism and non-naturalism. However, the non-naturalist will need a separate argument against those naturalists who hold that moral properties natural but irreducible. As noted in the Introduction, Moore seems to have ignored the distinction between naturalism and reductionism and this is one important case in which that mistake seems important.
The naturalistic fallacy is very poorly named indeed (a point also made by Bernard Williams; see Williams 1985: 121–122). For not only is it not especially a problem for naturalists, it is also not really a fallacy even if Moore is right that it embodies a mistake of some kind. For it is highly uncharitable to charge anyone who advances the sorts of arguments to which Moore alludes as having committed a logical fallacy. Rather, charity demands that we interpret such arguments as enthymematic, and usually this is easy enough. For example, we should understand ‘X is pleasant, therefore X is good’ as an enthymeme whose suppressed premise is ‘Whatever is pleasant is good’. Nor must the non-naturalist even quarrel with such a suppressed premise. One can allow that goodness is itself a non-natural property but grant that all pleasant things necessarily have that non-natural property. What the non-naturalist must reject is the thesis that such suppressed premises are true in virtue of the identity of goodness with the natural property in question (being pleasant, in this case). So the so-called naturalistic fallacy is no fallacy at all. Rather, if Moore is right then the so-called naturalistic fallacy actually embodies a mistaken belief about the reducibility of goodness, perhaps the belief that ‘good’ just means ‘pleasant’ (or whatever). However, to suppose that whenever someone is metaphysically or semantically confused he is guilty of a ‘fallacy’ robs the term of its more standard and useful meaning. This point was made very clearly by W.K. Frankena in a landmark article published in Mind (Frankena 1939).
Finally, as Frankena also nicely pointed out, it cannot be assumed at the outset that what Moore calls the naturalistic fallacy really is a mistake of any kind. For certain naturalists could then reasonably complain that the central question has been begged. The naturalist proposes a certain kind of definition of some moral term and the non-naturalist then simply asserts that anyone who thinks such definitions are possible is mistaken. If we want to find a non-question-begging argument against naturalism then we must look beyond the so-called “naturalistic fallacy.”
2. The Open Question Argument
Moore’s “Open Question Argument” for the conclusion that goodness is a non-natural property is closely related to his worries about the naturalistic fallacy. Consider any proposed naturalistic analysis N of a moral predicate M. The Open Question Argument maintains that it will always be possible for someone competent with moral discourse without conceptual confusion to grant that something is N but still wonder whether it is really M. Whether goodness is co-instantiated with any natural property or set of natural properties is in this sense always a conceptually open question. If, however, N really was an accurate analysis of M then the question, “I know it is N but is it M?” would not be open in this way for a conceptually competent judge any more than the question, “I know he is a bachelor but is he unmarried?” can be an open one. Moore himself used the Open Question Argument to defend a non-naturalist account of goodness but held that rightness was reducible to goodness. Moore held that it was true by definition that right actions maximize goodness, though he later came to the conclusion that this definition of rightness was also vulnerable to an Open Question Argument. A very similar argument was used by Sidgwick to establish that certain moral notions are irreducible (see Sidgwick 1907: Book I, Chapter 3) and Moore credits Sidgwick with the idea (Moore 1903: 17). More recently, some philosophers have argued that naturalism cannot capture the normativity of moral properties, and these arguments also seem to be very similar to the Open Question Argument. The idea seems to be that for any naturalistic reduction one offers of some seemingly normative notion one can, without betraying any conceptual incompetence, admit that something has the property specified by the reductive account but hold that this lacks normativity—does not provide any reasons for action (see Dancy 1996: 180–183).
On its face, the Open Question Argument seems to beg the question against the naturalist just as much as the charge of a naturalistic fallacy. For if the naturalist holds that a given moral predicate M is equivalent in meaning to some definition N couched entirely in non-moral predicates then she is obviously committed to holding that the relevant questions are not open and the naturalist might therefore simply deny the main premise of Moore’s argument. However, the Open Question Argument can be given a non-question-begging interpretation. The crucial move is to understand the argument as an argument to the best explanation. On this interpretation, the main premise of the argument is not that the relevant questions are conceptually open, but the much more modest premise that they at least seem conceptually open to competent users of moral terms. The argument then proceeds to claim that the best explanation of its seeming to competent users of the terms that these questions are open is that they really are open. That is, after all, a relatively simple and direct explanation of the phenomenon and the sort of explanation that we seem to accept by default when considering conceptual questions in general. This argument does not beg the question insofar as the opponent of non-naturalism can grant that the relevant questions do seem open without thereby contradicting their position—the main premise of this argument does not directly entail non-naturalism.
Once again, however, the scope of the argument is not as great as Moore supposed. For anti-reductionist forms of naturalism (like Sturgeon’s) seem as invulnerable to the argument as Moore’s non-naturalist account. Still, if the argument were to defeat all reductionist forms of naturalism that would be of substantial interest and might well be part of larger argument for non-naturalism when combined with an independent argument against anti-reductionist forms of naturalism (for further discussion, see Ball 1988, Ball 1991 and Baldwin 1990: 87–89).
Perhaps unsurprisingly, the Open Question Argument so understood still faces an impressive battery of objections. Perhaps the meaning of a predicate is not as transparent to competent users of the predicate as Moore implicitly assumes. For example, some have argued that competence with a predicate consists in being disposed (for the most part) to use the predicate only in ways that are consistent with certain “platitudes” in which the predicate figures (see, e.g. Jackson and Pettit 1995). A correct definition of the term might then be understood as one that best explains those platitudes. On this sort of account a competent user of moral terms might respect the platitudes but not recognize the theory that best explicates those platitudes even if presented with it. An analogy with grammar illustrates the point. Let us suppose that competent speakers are ones who are disposed (for the most part) to follow certain grammatical rules but they might not recognize those rules as valid when presented with them. The question, “I know the sentence violates this rule but is it ungrammatical?” might therefore seem to them to be an open one and there need be no mystery in this. The same might be true in the moral case. The non-naturalist might respond to this by arguing that if the proposed “platitudes” are substantial enough to fix the reference of moral terms to some natural property then the platitudes themselves are vulnerable to an Open Question Argument. The analogy with grammar might seem to break down at just this point. For there seems to be much more room for intelligible moral disagreement amongst competent judges in spite of agreement about everything else than there is for grammatical disagreement amongst competent judges in spite of agreement about everything else.
Alternatively, perhaps the best explanation of the apparent “openness” of the relevant questions to competent users is that the predicates do not refer to properties at all. For it might be held that moral predicates do purport to refer to non-natural properties but fail to refer precisely because those properties would have to be so queer. This would be to defend a kind of error theory, as defended by John Mackie (see Mackie 1977 and Joyce 2001). In effect, this would be to grant that the non-naturalist is right about the semantics (moral predicates do purport to refer to non-natural properties) but wrong about the metaphysics (the non-naturalist is wrong to suppose moral predicates refer to anything).
Even more radically, it might be maintained that moral predicates do not even purport to refer to properties and that this explains why the relevant questions seem open. In particular, it has been argued that a non-cognitivist analysis of moral discourse can explain why the relevant questions seem open. The question, “I know its pleasant but is it good?” seems open on this account because one can admit that something is pleasant (or has whatever natural property you like) without having decided to approve (or disapprove) of the thing in question. It is easy enough to see why this would also block the inference to non-naturalism. For on a non-cognitivist account, as traditionally understood, moral predicates do not even purport to refer to properties but rather serve to express speakers’ pro- and con-attitudes. Hence, the non-cognitivist concludes, moral predicates do not refer to properties at all, much less non-natural ones (see, e.g., Ayer 1952). In fact, it is fair to say that non-cognitivists eventually gained at least as much mileage from the Open Question Argument as non-naturalists.
Finally, more sophisticated forms of reductionist naturalism hold that while moral predicates do refer to natural properties, they do not so refer in virtue of any sort of analytic equivalence between moral predicates and non-moral predicates. The analogy here is with certain theories of reference borrowed from the discussion of proper names and natural kinds (see, e.g., Boyd 1988). Some philosophers have held that identifications of natural kinds like ‘water=H2O’ are necessarily true but not analytic. Rather, they are a posteriori necessary truths that hold in virtue of ‘water’ bearing the right causal relation (it has not been easy to say what causal relations are of the right kind) to H2O. Water and H2O may well be the same property but a competent user of ‘water’ need not know this. Indeed, before the discovery of modern chemistry most users of ‘water’ did not know this and it is not obvious that the meaning of the word changed in light of this discovery. If this is a plausible semantic theory and if a similar theory is true of moral predicates (a thesis that requires further argument) then the Open Question Argument is in trouble. For given this semantic theory, just as a competent user of ‘water’ and ‘H2O’ could without confusion say, “I know it is H2O but is it water?” a competent user of ‘good’ and ‘pleasant’ could say, “I know it is pleasant but is it good?” without confusion. Whether this sort of causal theory of reference is plausible in the case of moral vocabulary is more controversial, but the defender of the Open Question Argument needs some reason to reject the analogy.
How can we come to know anything about non-natural properties? The question is a reasonable one on any of the myriad ways in which non-natural properties have been conceived. On many characterizations, non-natural properties by definition elude scientific investigation which many take to be the most reliable form of knowledge available to us. On other characterizations, non-natural properties are causally inert which makes it hard to see how we could reliably detect them.
At least two kinds of questions are relevant here. First, once we have a particular property in mind how can we know it is a moral one? Second, how do we come to know anything about moral properties apart from knowing they are moral? The first question might seem more difficult for the naturalist than for some non-naturalists; if goodness really is a sui generis non-natural property then perhaps being directly acquainted with it is sufficient for recognizing it as moral. The second question, though, is easier for the naturalist than the non-naturalist. Since the naturalist holds that moral properties are either identical to or reducible to some subset of natural properties there need be no mystery about how we come to have some knowledge of those properties even if there is some residual mystery as to how we discover that they are the moral ones. Or, at least, a commitment to naturalism in meta-ethics introduces no new problems about how we come to know anything about these properties. For given naturalism, the moral properties might well be identical to or reducible to familiar properties like the property of promoting happiness or the property of being truthful. In general we learn about such natural properties through observation and scientific inquiry and the naturalist can “piggy back” on whatever more general epistemological theory explains our ability to come to know anything about those properties. We learn, for example, what kinds of upbringing promote honesty through empirical observation and theorizing. Non-naturalism can be understood in many different ways, but none seems to make the task of explaining the possibility of moral knowledge as straightforward as it seems to be for the naturalist.
The non-naturalist’s standard move here is to defend some form of “intuitionism.” In its most straightforward form, intuitionism holds that we come to know about moral properties through direct observation of those properties. Just as we can learn that cat is on the mat through direct observation we can also learn that kicking the cat on the mat is wrong through direct observation. If we have the appropriate moral sensibilities and just look carefully enough at a given situation then we should be able to discern the relevant moral properties as such quite directly. It is worth noting that this move is in principle available to naturalists as well as non-naturalists. In some cases this will be easy; if you watch a bully beat up a defenseless child for fun then it should be easy enough to see the cruelty and wrongness of his action. In other cases, discerning the moral facts will be much more difficult. However, the difficulty of such cases is compatible with intuitionism. Familiarity with aesthetes makes it clear that perceiving certain properties can be very subtle and require considerable training and attention. Plausibly, an intuitionist epistemology fits better with some versions of non-naturalism than others. If, for example, we understand non-natural properties as properties we can know only a priori then the idea that we come to know them through perception seems problematic. In any event, if intuitionism is defensible then it provides the non-naturalist with an answer to both of the questions raised above. Plausibly, if we directly perceive moral properties (at least partly answering the second question) then we also directly perceive that they are moral (answering the first question).
Sometimes the intuitionist’s perceptual characterization of moral knowledge is metaphorical. The idea is that moral knowledge is not literally perceptual in the first instance but is somehow very much like perceptual knowledge. This approach has its advantages. In trying to make sense of the idea of moral perception of non-natural properties, some intuitionists have maintained that our ability to have veridical experiences of the moral properties is in virtue of our having a special faculty of mind whose function is to detect such properties. This raises a number of questions about the origin and functioning of such a faculty. An account that claims only that moral knowledge is somehow like perceptual knowledge need not face these difficulties. Of course, such accounts run the risk of being too vague to be helpful unless some less metaphorical account of moral knowledge is forthcoming. Even those who take the idea or perceptual moral knowledge literally are not thereby committed to belief in such special faculties. Perhaps moral perception is continuous with other ordinary forms of perception even if it is literally the perception of a non-natural property. If non-natural properties are by definition causally inert then this position seems problematic. On other ways of understanding non-natural properties, though, whether there is a problem will depend on further controversial philosophical questions. For example, if non-natural properties are understood as properties that would not figure in the best scientific account of reality then the issue obviously concerns the authority of science to determine the answers to all ontological questions. Non-naturalists sometimes accuse their opponents of crude scientism for assuming that science has such authority and this brings out some deeper methodological differences between naturalists and non-naturalists (see below, “Methodology”).
One interesting objection to the non-naturalist’s deployment of intuitionism is that this combination of views makes it a “cosmic coincidence” that our intuitions would reliably track the moral facts (see Bedke 2009). The force of the worry derives from the fact that non-natural properties, on some construals, are causally inert, whereas our intuitions are psychological states and hence part of the natural world. It is simply not clear how our intuitions could reliably track such facts, given that they are causally isolated from them. An obvious contrast is with the way in which our knowledge of the empirical world plausibly does depend on reliability secured through suitable causal connections. This is obviously related to other worries about the way in which the origins of our moral intuitions does not cohere well with their reliability, given non-naturalism – e.g. worries which focus more on the Darwinian influences on human moral judgment (see also Street 2006; for a reply to such worries, see Vavova forthcoming). Interestingly, some non-naturalists have tried to give a Darwinian argument for a kind of non-theological pre-established harmony between our moral intuitions and the moral facts (see especially Enoch 2011).
An even more fundamental worry arising out of the causal inertness of moral properties, given non-naturalism, is how our words and concepts manage so much as to be about those properties. Certainly on a causal theory of reference it would be very hard indeed to explain how our moral words and concepts could refer to such sui generis moral properties. This worry about what is sometimes called “semantic access” has only recently started to get the attention it deserves – see Wedgwood 2009 and Enoch 2011. Matti Eklund develops this worry about reference determination in an especially powerful way (Eklund 2017). He argues that a constraint on a plausible theory of reference determination must ensure that what he calls the “normative role” (roughly, the practical role played by normative predicates in our deliberations about what to do) must be sufficient to determine a unique non-natural referent. Otherwise, it will be possible for there to be other communities to use apparently normative predicates to refer to different non-natural properties. This constraint is very far from trivial to satisfy; Eklund suggests that Wedgwood’s theory is unique in trying to meet it. By contrast, a form of non-naturalism like the one defended by Cuneo and Shafer-Landau (Cuneo and Shafer Landau 2014) seems ill-suited to meeting this constraint. On their view, the reference of moral terms and concepts is fixed, in part by more substantive “fixed points” which would seem to go beyond the mere normative role that Eklund has in mind. Although Eklund admits the worry he has is in some ways ineffable, it seems like there ought to be some way in which the properties picked out by our normative predicates are the “right” ones to care about. The reason Eklund’s worry is perhaps ineffable is that we presumably must index “right” in “right ones to care about” either to what we mean by “right” or by what some deviant possible community means by “right,” but neither seems to capture the intended worry. Eklund notes the obvious analogies with the “Moral Twin Earth” objection to naturalism.
4. Explanatory Impotence
Developing a plausible epistemology (intuitionist or otherwise) is also essential to meet some of the most pressing objections to non-naturalism. One such objection begins with the premise that non-natural properties do not figure in the best explanations of our experiences and observations. Gilbert Harman famously argues that prima facie there is a sharp contrast between moral beliefs and scientific beliefs on this score. The best explanation of scientific beliefs often seems to entail the truth of those beliefs—Harman gives the example of a scientist’s belief that a proton is in a cloud chamber which seems to be best explained, in part, by the actual presence of a proton in the chamber. By contrast, this does not seem to be true of our moral beliefs. Rather, people’s moral beliefs can be explained more elegantly and plausibly in terms of their upbringing and psychology without reference to any mysterious non-natural moral properties. This contrast, combined with the epistemological principle that we should believe in a property only if it figures in the best explanations of our experiences entails that non-naturalism should be rejected. Indeed, Harman’s argument would, if sound, also apply to anti-reductionist forms of naturalism. However, the anti-reductionist naturalist can try to avoid this line of argument by maintaining that the natural properties constituting moral properties do figure in the best explanations of our experiences. Nicholas Sturgeon, for example, argues that reference to the moral property of being oppressive figures in the best explanation of the growth of the anti-slavery movement in the United States between the Revolutionary War and the Civil War (see Sturgeon 1988: 245; see also Railton 1986), and this is but one of a range of examples discussed by Sturgeon (for a reply, see Blackburn 1990). However, this strategy is unavailable to the non-naturalist on many interpretations of what it is for a property to be a non-natural one. For example, if it is part of the definition of non-natural properties that they are not invoked in scientific explanations then this defense is unavailable. However, on some interpretations of non-naturalism this move is available. If, for example, non-natural properties are simply understood as properties that do not figure in similarity relations then the non-naturalist might argue that often the best explanation of our moral judgements actually does advert to moral properties. Intuitionism and its plausibility are likely to be relevant here. The non-naturalist might argue that people’s clear and distinct experiences of moral properties can be explained only as hallucinations of some kind in a naturalistic framework, and that this does not do justice to the clarity and ubiquity of such perceptions.
Alternatively, the non-naturalist might point out that the charge of explanatory impotence itself must refer to evaluative properties (see Sayre-McCord 1988b). For the naturalist’s objection must be that the best explanation of our experiences does not presuppose the existence of moral properties of the sort the non-naturalist has in mind. After all, if any old explanation you like would do then the non-naturalist could no doubt provide some mediocre explanations of our experiences that made reference to non-natural moral properties. Once the naturalist allows that there are non-moral evaluative properties that are relevant to the assessment of theories there is room for the non-naturalist to argue that moral evaluative properties need not be all that different (metaphysically and epistemologically) and hence no more problematic than the evaluative properties presupposed by the objection. Moreover, this line of argument suggests that there is something self-defeating about the naturalist’s epistemological principle. It requires that we believe in properties only if they figure in the best explanation of our experiences. However, it is not clear that the property of being a good explanation itself figures in the best explanation of our experiences. In which case, the epistemological principle seems to recommend its own rejection. The problem here is very similar to a problem facing verificationist theories of meaning which seemed to entail their own meaninglessness. Presumably the naturalist’s best strategy is to argue that the values she has in mind are purely naturalistic ones that we do have independent reason to accept because they figure in the best explanations of our experiences. Whether this strategy is plausible will depend on the details of the naturalistic theory on offer.
Yet another reply to the objection is to argue that belief in moral properties (or, more broadly, normative properties) construed in terms of non-naturalism, is indispensable to our deliberation. The idea behind this strategy is to argue that there is no reason we should privilege explanatory indispensability over deliberative indispensability (see Enoch 2011). One worry about this strategy is that it is not clear that it helps support belief in specifically moral properties, but once we embrace non-naturalist realism about other normative properties there may be no further ontological costs to accepting the appearances about moral properties too. Like all transcendental arguments, this defense of non-naturalism is subject to worries about why the indispensability of some belief to our deliberation speaks in favor of its truth. Finally, it is not entirely clear why one must believe in normative properties as construed by non-naturalism in order to deliberate. A lot of the work of this argument consists in debunking naturalist and expressivist conceptions of moral belief as inadequate for our deliberative purposes. See both Enoch 2011 and Fitzpatrick 2011 for relevant discussion of this last point.
It is often held that moral goodness has a kind of “magnetism.” Intuitively, the recognition of moral properties like goodness bears some sort of intimate connection to motivation—not in the sense of being sufficiently motivated by such recognition that one actually does the relevant thing but in the sense of being motivated to some degree to do it. The general idea that there is some intimate connection between moral judgement and motivation is usually referred to as “judgement internalism.” (see Darwall 1983: 54). It is not obvious how the non-naturalist can explain how the recognition of moral properties can motivate. Mackie famously argues that the defender of objective values must implausibly maintain that moral properties have a kind of special causal power to motivate people simply in virtue of their recognition of them. He argues that the recognition of moral properties must have a sort of direct influence on the will so that anyone who recognizes them is thereby motivated. Since a property with this sort of causal power would be unlike anything else with which we are familiar and fits poorly into our scientific conception of the world, Mackie argues that we should not believe in such properties. Mackie’s official target is the thesis that moral properties are objective, but it is clear from his discussion that non-naturalist interpretations of moral properties are supposed to be especially vulnerable to his line of argument. Indeed, Mackie’s argument seems to have two stages. First, he in effect argues that any plausible interpretation of our pre-theoretical beliefs about morality will presuppose non-naturalism. Second, he argues that non-naturalism is itself untenable.
The non-naturalist has a number of possible replies to Mackie’s objection. First, the non-naturalist might simply deny that moral properties are motivating in Mackie’s sense. Mackie’s argument seems to “load up” the concept of a moral property with a lot of baggage that the non-naturalist need not accept. After all, some people seem to make perfectly sound moral judgements but remain unmoved to action by them. Some people care about morality and other people do not; one need not ascribe any mysterious motivational power to moral properties to explain why moral properties motivate when they do (see, e.g., Savavarsdottir 1999). This reply is fair enough so far as Mackie’s initial challenge goes, but it does suggest another related problem. For now we need some account of why some people care about morality and other people do not, since it is clear enough that this depends in some way on the person’s environment and constitution. The non-naturalist may well be able to give such an account but neither will this be a trivial task.
Second, the non-naturalist might argue that the motivating power of moral judgements is a trifling semantic truth rather than a deep metaphysical one. On this account, moral judgements are individuated not just in terms of their content but in terms of the motivations of the person making the judgement (see Tresan 2006, though he develops this approach on behalf of naturalism). So on this account someone who recognizes the property of goodness but is completely unmoved by it does not thereby have a moral belief. Only when the person has the appropriate motivations does the belief count as moral. It is unclear, however, whether this account adequately meets the objection insofar as it leaves it a mystery why we should individuate moral beliefs in just this way. Intuitively, it is something about the special nature of the content of moral judgement that explains why they are action-guiding, but on this account the content need not play any role whatsoever in the explanation.
A third reply to Mackie is similar to the second one but tries to improve on it by offering an explanation of the relationship between the content of a moral judgement and the appropriate motivation. The general idea is that moral properties can be recognized only by someone with certain motivations. It might be held that one cannot recognize something as cruel, for example, unless one disapproves of it (at least a little bit) and that cruelty is a non-natural moral property. This proposal differs from the second one in that it holds that moral judgements are individuated entirely in terms of their content and not even partly in terms of their motivational context. It just claims that judgements with certain contents cannot be made without certain motivational states (see, e.g., McDowell 1998). Whereas the second suggestion was semantic (“motivation on the cheap,” one might say), this reply is in part metaphysical and requires substantial work in the philosophy of mind. In adopting this strategy, the non-naturalist takes on the burden of explaining why judgements with a distinctively moral content require appropriate motivations and this is likely to be no easy task. Cruelty, for example, presumably is a moral concept but intuitively someone can believe that an action would be cruel and simply not give a damn. Indeed, intuitively it seems possible for someone to take the cruelty of an action to be an attractive feature or a reason to perform the action—schoolyard bullies nicely illustrate this possibility (a similar point is made in Blackburn 1998: 100) . Nor does the thesis that cruelty is a non-natural property make the defense of this view in the philosophy of mind any easier.
Mackie’s objection relies on the highly controversial premise that moral judgements necessarily are motivating and as we have seen the non-naturalist might reasonably just deny that premise (that was the first of the three replies discussed above). However, one might instead appeal to the much more modest premise that if an agent judges that some possible action of hers is morally required then she will be motivated to perform that action unless she is practically irrational. Michael Smith refers to this as the “practicality requirement on moral judgement” (see Smith 1994: 61). This requirement seems plausible because the recognition that an action is right plausibly is the recognition that the action is well-supported (perhaps conclusively supported) by justifying moral reasons for action, and such a recognition should motivate someone unless the agent is practically irrational. For present purposes, the point is that even if Mackie’s challenge can be bypassed or met in one of the three ways just discussed, a further challenge concerning motivation still faces the non-naturalist. For if the practicality requirement on moral judgement is correct then the non-naturalist needs to provide some account of why an agent’s recognition that one of the actions available to her has the non-natural property of rightness is such that her recognition of this fact rationally requires that she be motivated to perform the action. In particular, some account of why judging that something is well supported by reasons (understood in non-naturalist terms) is appropriately connected to motivation.
If either of the last two replies to Mackie’s objection works then it can be redeployed against this objection. For if either of those replies works then the non-naturalist can explain why the relevant moral judgements necessarily are motivating, which trivially entails that anyone who makes the relevant moral judgements either is appropriately motivated or is practically irrational. If, for example, it is an analytic truth that a judgment does not count as moral unless it is appropriately motivating then it trivially follows that anyone who accepts a moral judgment is appropriately motivated or is practically irrational simply because it follows that anyone who accepts such a judgment is appropriately motivated. However, these strategies are problematic in part for just the reason that Mackie’s version of internalism is problematic—both seem to make a certain kind of practical irrationality impossible by asserting that making a moral judgment guarantees appropriate motivation. In particular, it seems possible, though irrational, for an agent to judge that he is required to do something and yet not be motivated at all to do it. So perhaps non-naturalists should instead either try to accommodate Smith’s practicality requirement on moral judgement without committing themselves to a form of judgement internalism as strong as the one Mackie seemed to have in mind or argue against the practicality requirement. Of course, if Smith’s practicality requirement on moral judgement is sound then accommodating it is a challenge faced by every meta-ethical theory, but consideration of how the requirement might be accommodated suggests that the problem is especially pronounced for the non-naturalist.
The non-naturalist could simply deny the practicality requirement on moral judgement (this would be similar to the first reply to Mackie’s objection). This is considerably more controversial than denying the very strong link between motivation and moral judgement presupposed by Mackie’s objection, but may nonetheless be defensible. The idea would be that an agent can judge that she is morally required to do something and not be motivated accordingly without being guilty of any kind of irrationality. One might hold this on the grounds that the belief that one is morally required to do something does not commit one to the belief that there is conclusive reason to do it or on the grounds that the belief that there is conclusive reason for one to do something simply does not commit one to being motivated to do it on pain of irrationality. Unfortunately, a full discussion of the issues surrounding the truth of the practicality requirement on moral judgement goes beyond the present scope. For useful discussion, see Brink 1986, Foot 1972 and Smith 1994.
Alternatively, the non-naturalist might maintain that the practicality requirement on motivation is a trifling semantic truth. The idea would be that to be fully rational in part just means doing what one believes to be right. However, this move differs from the second reply considered above in that it is a clear attempt to define a normative notion (rationality) in purely naturalistic terms. This last claim assumes we can give a naturalistic account of rationality, which is not obviously correct given non-naturalism about rightness, but neither is it obviously incorrect. In any event, such an analysis of rationality sits poorly with the non-naturalist’s standard appeal to the Open Question Argument. For if the Open Question Argument is sound for moral predicates like ‘morally required’ then one might have thought that analogous arguments would go through for ‘rational’ and ‘irrational’. After all, rationality is plausibly a normative notion and on some accounts (see above) it is the idea of normativity that gives the Open Question Argument its force. This is one reason the practicality requirement on moral judgement is especially a problem for non-naturalists, since naturalists are not committed to accepting the soundness of the Open Question Argument in the moral case.
Finally, a more recent reply to such objections form motivation is that they misunderstand the role of the relevant non-natural properties in the motivational economy of a virtuous agent. On this view (defended in Chappell 2019), the virtuous agent is not motivated by some simple non-natural property like goodness. That, on this view, would be a sort of fetishism. Rather, the virtuous agent is motivated by the purely natural facts that make the action morally right, e.g. that it spares someone emotional distress. The role of the relevant non-natural property, here the property of being a reason for a given action, is to mark the relevant properties as the ones it is correct to be motivated by. One reply to this argument is suggested by Max Hayward (Hayward 2019). Hayward argues that our commitment to e.g. the value of our partner should not be conditional on the existence and distribution of non-natural properties. Yet non-naturalist moral realism is committed to the view that all value is contingent on the existence of such properties. Transposed to Chappell’s emphasis on normative properties as markers of our reasons, Hayward’s argument would imply the correctness of treating the relevant facts as reasons should not depend on the sort of obscure metaphysics posited by non-naturalist moral realists.
6. Explaining Supervenience
Non-naturalism has trouble explaining the necessary dependence of the moral facts on the natural facts. So long as our characterization of natural properties is broad enough to include both all of the mental properties and all of the properties that would figure in the best physical theory, it is very plausible to suppose that the moral supervenes on the natural in the following sense: there can be no moral difference between two situations or entire possible worlds without some natural difference but not vice-versa (there can be non-moral differences without moral differences). On some ways of understanding the natural properties, of course, it is unclear whether mental properties are natural ones and this is an important point. Perhaps mental properties elude scientific investigation but are real nonetheless. If we characterize the non-natural properties as ones that elude scientific investigation then mental properties will be non-natural ones. This is very important since it is not nearly so plausible that the moral supervenes on a set of facts that does not include the mental facts—as if the wrongness of an action could float independently of facts about pain, intentions and beliefs. For purposes of the present discussion I shall simply assume that the natural properties include the mental properties.
However, suitably formulated theses concerning the supervenience of the moral on the natural are plausible enough that some philosophers have held them to be analytic. Global supervenience theses are perhaps the most plausible ones, claiming merely that two entire possible worlds cannot differ only in their moral properties without also differing in some of their natural properties. To deny this thesis would be to allow that it could have been the case that the world was exactly like the actual world in all of its naturalistic features but in that world what Hitler did was not wrong. Since all the natural facts are the same in this possible world it will still be true that Hitler killed the same people, had the same intentions, etc. Such bare moral differences seem inconceivable. Very plausibly, the moral facts are in some way entirely fixed by the natural facts. The problem for the non-naturalist is that non-naturalism seems unable to explain this supervenience. For if moral properties and natural properties really are, in Hume’s terms, “distinct existences” then it is hard to see why it should be impossible for the former to differ with no difference in the latter and since the natural properties are non-moral ones (given non-naturalism) this makes supervenience seem problematic. Non-naturalism’s apparent inability to explain such a basic platitude as global supervenience poses a serious problem (see Mackie 1977, Blackburn 1984, and Blackburn 1988).
Naturalists of course can explain supervenience much more easily. For given naturalism, the moral properties just are certain natural properties, and the supervenience of the moral follows trivially from this (every property supervenes on itself). It is much less obvious, however, that the naturalist can explain a slightly different supervenience thesis. For it seems at least as plausible to suppose that the moral properties supervene on the non-moral ones as it is to suppose that they supervene on the natural properties. Indeed, the moral/non-moral supervenience thesis is probably more obviously correct than moral/natural supervenience theses because of the obscurity of the natural/non-natural distinction. Once we divide the natural properties into the moral and the non-moral, it becomes unclear why the moral properties should supervene on all the other natural properties (the non-moral ones). Perhaps the naturalist’s dialectical advantage is more modest than one would have thought. For if neither naturalists nor non-naturalists can explain the supervenience of the moral on the non-moral and if that supervenience thesis is less controversial than moral/natural supervenience theses then the fact that the naturalist can explain the latter looks less impressive.
Perhaps non-cognitivists (or “quasi-realists,” in Blackburn’s favored terminology; see Blackburn 1984) and error theorists reap the greatest dialectical dividends from reflection on how we might explain supervenience. The standard view is that the non-cognitivist’s explanatory task differs from the explanatory task facing both naturalist and non-naturalist forms of cognitivism. Whereas the naturalist and non-naturalist must explain a metaphysical relationship between two potentially distinct sets of properties the non-cognitivist instead needs only to explain the sensibility of a practice of moralizing governed by a supervenience constraint. Since one of the main points of moral discourse is to recommend options on the basis of their natural properties it is easy enough to see why such a constraint is sensible. To abandon that constraint would be to abandon the project of moralizing so understood. For if our practice of moralizing were not to include such a constraint then you could evaluate options differently even if they were identical in all their natural properties and this would make it hard to see in what sense options were being recommended on the basis of their natural properties. Since for the non-cognitivist there are no moral properties (from the perspective of serious metaphysics, anyway; but we can still “speak with the vulgar” as if there were such properties) we can in the same way derive that our moralizing must not allow that two items identical in their non-moral properties might still differ morally. For the point of moralizing is to recommend options on the basis of their natural properties and all the natural properties are non-moral according to the non-cognitivist. One worry about this line of argument is that quasi-realist expressivism, if successful, allows us to make all of the original and seemingly metaphysically problematic claims about moral reality in the only sense in which those claims can be understood. In that case, it is not entirely obvious why the quasi-realist does not, at the end of the day, face exactly the same explanatory burden as the non-naturalist realist (see Street 2011). Perhaps quasi-realists can avoid this specific worry about self-defeat by holding that moral properties are, after all, natural properties on their view. The view can remain expressivist so long as it also maintains that taking a view about just which natural property is identical to a given moral property is constituted by adopting suitable non-cognitive attitudes.
Like the non-cognitivist, the error theorist denies that there any moral properties, but unlike the non-cognitivist maintains that the legitimacy of moral discourse presupposes that there are such properties. This trivially entails that whenever there is a moral difference there must be some non-moral difference for the simple reason that there never can be any moral differences between cases given the error theory. Typically, the error theorist agrees with the non-naturalist (implicitly, anyway) about the semantics of moral predicates but holds that moral predicates do not refer precisely because moral properties to which they purport to refer would have to be so queer (see Mackie 1977). One aspect of the putative queerness of moral properties is the idea that they necessarily supervene on the natural (and non-moral) properties without being reducible to those properties.
How might non-naturalists respond to the charge that they cannot explain supervenience? They might argue that the objection must be unsound because it would prove too much. For the form of the argument seems to generalize into an argument that no class of properties can supervene on another class of properties unless the former are reducible to the latter in some way. It might seem in some of the cases not involving moral properties that this cannot be correct. The supervenience of the property of being a chair on all of the properties of microphysics seems unlikely to be explained in some reductive way but seems obviously correct nonetheless. Non-naturalist’s critics can either accept this implication of their argument but try to argue that it is not so implausible or try to block the implication in some way. A discussion of the former strategy raises very general questions that go well beyond the scope of the present article. So I shall here focus on the question of whether the moral case is in some way unique even though the more promising strategy here might be to argue that in these other cases some sort of reductive (albeit perhaps non-analytic) account is available after all.
Arguably the moral case is different from these other cases of supervenience without reduction because the supervenience of the moral on the natural (and non-moral) is analytic. Plausibly, someone who thinks two things could differ morally but be identical in all other respects does not fully grasp the meanings of moral predicates. This is not nearly so plausible in other cases in which we seem to have supervenience without reduction. Cartesian dualists can deny supervenience and their view does not seem conceptually incoherent however mistaken it may be. As Blackburn argues, if this sort of error is a conceptual one then “whole cultures have been prone to denial of an analytic truth” (Blackburn 1985: 59) which at best seems unlikely. The idea here seems to be that the only way a realist could explain supervenience qua analytic truth would be to hold that the moral is analytically identical to some property that can also be characterized in purely naturalistic terms. The non-naturalist, of course, is committed to rejecting any such analyses so if this is the only way to explain the analyticity of supervenience then non-naturalists cannot explain it. In which case, the appeal to analyticity might seem to block the ‘proves too much objection’.
However, this would be too quick. Blackburn’s appeal to the analyticity of supervenience in the moral case notwithstanding, the ‘proves to much’ objection can be reinstated against Blackburn’s original argument that non-naturalists (and moral realists more generally) cannot explain supervenience. For the non-naturalist might instead hold that the analyticity of supervenience simply falls out of the conventions governing our use of moral vocabulary. It is simply an empirical fact that those we take to be competent users of moral language do respect supervenience constraints and would think anyone who did not respect those constraints must be conceptually confused. As Thomas Baldwin argues, “The realist can maintain that it is a conceptual truth that there are necessary connections between the ethical and the non-ethical, even though the particular connections themselves are not analytically necessary.” (Baldwin 1990: 99) In which case, the appeal to analyticity seems not to help block the objection that the argument from supervenience proves too much. One might buttress this defense of non-naturalism by pointing out that it does seem analytic that moral properties are “resultant” ones in Jonathan Dancy’s sense—the instantiation of a moral property must always be explained by the instantiation of certain particular non-moral properties.
Nonetheless, Baldwin is mistaken to suppose that this entirely disarms the argument from supervenience. Baldwin might well show that Blackburn cannot escape the charge of proving too much simply by appealing to the thesis that supervenience in the moral case is a priori. Showing that Blackburn’s move does not explain why the argument would not prove too much still does not provide a satisfactory defense of non-naturalism, though. For if the non-naturalist simply appeals to conventional and linguistic facts then they might well explain why it is analytic that if there are any moral properties then they must supervene on the natural (and non-moral) ones. The original objection, though, was a metaphysical one rather than a semantic one. The problem for the non-naturalist now becomes one of explaining how the non-natural properties in question could satisfy the relevant supervenience constraints and hence count as moral in the first place. The challenge is to provide a metaphysical account of how there could be properties like the properties to which the non-naturalist maintains our moral vocabulary purports to refer. Otherwise we are left either with the error-theoretic conclusion that there are no moral properties or the non-cognitivist conclusion that moral vocabulary does not even purport to refer (in the sense of ‘refer’ in play when one does serious metaphysics, anyway; again, the non-cognitivist will allow that we can ‘speak with the vulgar’ here). So there is still a problem for the non-naturalist. Nonetheless, Baldwin seems right in that the appeal to analyticity seems not to have done the work for which it was invoked by Blackburn. For it again seems as if the argument from supervenience generalizes to other cases of supervenience without reduction. Perhaps the non-naturalist’s critics should simply embrace this implication but argue that the prospects for reduction in these other cases are much brighter than the non-naturalist suggests they are.
A more promising approach for the non-naturalist would be to offer a positive explanation of supervenience in explicitly non-naturalist terms. In his systematic defence of non-naturalist moral realism, Russ Shafer-Landau takes just this strategy. There he argues that although each moral property is distinct from any natural property or properties, still each instantiation of a moral property is fully constituted (or, as he sometimes puts it, ‘realized’) by some concatenation of natural properties (see Shafer-Landau 2003: 76–78). In effect, the idea is to distinguish types from tokens, and argue that the constitution of every token moral property by some concatenation of natural properties is consistent with the non-identity of that moral property with any natural property or combination of natural properties. Shafer-Landau suggests that this strategy is the most plausible one for explaining supervenience without reduction in the philosophy of mind, and that this should make us optimistic about the prospects of an analogous strategy in the moral case.
As I have argued elsewhere, it is not at all clear that the appeal to token constitution can do the needed work. Moreover, even if this appeal could somehow explain supervenience, it would have further unfortunate consequences for the non-naturalist. Since I have discussed these objections at length elsewhere (Ridge 2007), I shall be brief here and simply summarize the main worries. First, Shafer-Landau’s constitution thesis by itself does not entail supervenience. A full explanation of supervenience will require some auxiliary premises, and Shafer-Landau does not tell us what these premises are. Fortunately, his appeal to an analogy with the philosophy of mind helps us fill in the blanks. For the closest analogue there seems to be David Robb’s attempt to explain supervenience without reduction in the philosophy of mind in terms of tropes, where tropes just are property instantiations. Trying to carry out the Robb strategy (which I shall not try to summarize here; for details, see Robb 1997), the needed premise for Shafer-Landau would seem to be that if a given natural trope constitutes a moral trope, then it necessarily constitutes that trope. This, plus Shafer-Landau’s thesis that necessarily, every moral trope is fully constituted by some set of natural tropes, would indeed entail supervenience, so this does seem like an interesting way to fill out the details of his strategy.
Why, though, should we suppose that this necessitation thesis (that if one trope is fully constituted by another trope, then it necessarily is) is true? Robb’s own thesis was actually about trope identity rather than trope constitution, and this gives Robb’s thesis more immediate plausibility, as identity does seem to be necessary. Shafer-Landau, however, wants to appeal to constitution rather than identity (this is a departure from Robb), and this makes it very unclear why we should accept the analogous necessitation thesis.
A second possible worry about Shafer-Landau’s strategy is that it does rely on a metaphysics which quantifies over tropes (Shafer-Landau prefers to speak of ‘property instantiations’ but this is really a merely nominal difference). This is itself a controversial metaphysical commitment. Moreover, Shafer-Landau seems committed to meta-tropes—tropes of tropes. For he needs this thesis to explain how a fact (which for Shafer-Landau just is a property instantiation) can itself have the property of being a reason. While this is of course a metaphysical commitment that can perhaps be defended, it does give some dialectical hostages to fortune.
Third, Shafer-Landau’s approach seems to have the very odd consequence that certain forms of first-order monism are ruled out. Shafer-Landau himself explicitly claims that his theory can be neutral on this front, and it would be unfortunate if his theory did have such striking implications for first-order theory. Why do I say that Shafer-Landau’s theory seems to lead very quickly to the rejection of certain forms of monism? Because on a standard view of tropes, a property (that is, a type) just is a resembling set of tropes. In this context, whether a given property is moral or natural will depend upon whether the relevant sort of resemblance is one which is especially salient from the point of view of moral theory, on the one hand, or from the point of view of one of the natural sciences. It could be relevant from the point of view of both such perspectives, but this would be for naturalism to be true, which, of course, is inconsistent with non-naturalism! The main point is that for any naturalist view which holds that something is good if and only if it instantiates some particular single natural property (pleasantness, say), it would follow that the relevant sort of resemblance would be salient from the perspective of one of the natural sciences. For all pleasantness tropes do resemble one another in a way which would be salient from the point of view of psychology (or possibly biology)—or at least, insofar as pleasantness is a natural property this is likely to be so. In which case, a standard view of tropes would entail that the property itself is a natural one. In which case, we would have a form of reductive naturalism. So for this strategy to work, it seems that any form of first-order monism which holds that things are good if and only if they instantiate some single natural property, must be rejected. Otherwise we end up with a form of naturalism, rather than non-naturalism. Insofar as the non-naturalist (quite rightly) aspires to remain neutral on such first-order questions, this is a theoretical vice of the proposed explanation.
Obviously there is a lot more that can be said by both parties to this debate. For example, for useful more recent discussion of the more general issue of whether there can be necessary connections between distinct existences, see Wilson 2010. In any event, it is good that non-naturalists in moral philosophy are not merely relying on the appeal to companions in guilt, but are also actually offering positive explanations of supervenience. Shafer-Landau offers an ambitious explanation of supervenience in non-naturalist terms. Even if his initial strategy fails for some of the reasons discussed above, it at least is a step in the right direction, and it might be possible to refine his strategy in a way to avoid some or all of the worries raised above. It is early days for this approach to supervenience in the case of moral philosophy, and it will be interesting to see how this debate plays out. For further discussion of Shafer-Landau’s strategy here, see also Mabrito 2005, Shafer-Landau 2005, Wedgwood 2009 and McPherson 2012. Useful discussion can also be found in Dreier 2019, Gert 2019, and Moberger 2019.
The debate over non-naturalism is difficult to resolve in part because the issues often hinge on fundamentally different methodological starting points. Advocates of non-naturalism tend to be less concerned with finding a place for value and obligation in the world as revealed by science and more interested in taking our common sense conception of morality as given and seeing what it implicitly presupposes. Non-naturalism’s opponents, by contrast, put a great deal of weight on explaining our moral practices in a way that fits well with a properly scientific view of the world and are happy to reject the presuppositions of common sense if they conflict with that conception. So non-naturalists tend to be more interested than their opponents in respecting our pre-theoretical intuitions about morality and moral judgement. Hence non-naturalists often give substantial weight to the intuitive force of the Open Question Argument. They also are less willing to revise common-sense moral beliefs about particular cases for the sake of aligning those beliefs with some ambitious naturalistic moral theory. It is no coincidence that so-called moral particularists, who deny that morality can adequately be captured by any set of principles linking natural features to moral ones, tend to favor some form of non-naturalism. Naturalists, by contrast, are more likely to emphasize the importance of rejecting beliefs that fit poorly with our best scientific account of reality; if common sense commits us to properties that do not fit well into that account then so much the worse for common sense. Given these deep methodological differences, the only apparent way avoid philosophical stalemate would be to develop an argument for one of the two positions whose plausibility does not depend on the controversial methodological assumptions associated with that position. The best candidate for such an argument considered here might well be the argument that non-naturalists cannot explain supervenience. For the supervenience of the moral on the non-moral seems to fall out of common sense rather than out of our scientific world-view. Since the methodology associated with non-naturalism itself puts great weight on common sense, the argument from supervenience seems like a promising one. At the very least, the argument from supervenience seems uniquely well situated to undermine non-naturalism without begging any central methodological questions.
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