Notes to Iris Murdoch

1. It is conventional in Murdoch scholarship to cite pages from Sovereignty in the form XY A/B, where “XY” is the name of the specific essay therein, “A” is the page in Sovereignty and “B” is the corresponding page of that essay in Existentialists and Mystics.

2. In a famous lecture in 1945, Sartre appears to construe his view as universalist in something like a Kantian way (Sartre 1945). Scholars disagree as to whether this is a plausible interpretation of Sartre’s view (see Flynn 2004 [2013]) and it was not unreasonable of Murdoch to construe it as lacking that feature.

3. Although Murdoch embraces much of what she understands Freud’s theory of mind to be, she does not use the term “ego” the same way Freud does. For Freud the “ego”, contrasting with the “id”, operates with the “reality principle”. For Murdoch it is something like an individual’s system of self-directed and self-oriented motives and sentiments, including those that would be included in Freud’s notion of the “id”.

4. If “meta-ethics” is construed either as an enterprise with no substantive moral implications, or as an exercise in epistemology, metaphysics, or philosophy of language that can be engaged in prior to ethics, Murdoch would reject it (similar to her view regarding “philosophical psychology” mentioned above).

5. For Weil’s influence on Murdoch, see Broackes 2012a: 19–21 and passim; and Lovibond 2011: ch. 2.

6. Murdoch does not clearly distinguish the “moral” from the “evaluative”. She never focuses on moral value as a distinct subset of value in general. “Morality is everywhere” is not the same as “value is everywhere”, and she says a version of both. (See discussions of this issue in Diamond 2010, 1996, and Lovibond 2020.) She also tends to use “moral” and “ethical” interchangeably, and would find Williams’s famous distinction between them problematic (Williams 1985: ch 10: “Morality, the Peculiar Institution”).

7. And a slightly different formulation:

[T]he world we see already contains our values and we may not be aware of the slow delicate processes of imagination and will which have put those values there. (DPR 1966/EM: 200)

The use of “will” solidifies the agentic dimension of the creation of the perceived valuational world. “Imagination”, discussed much more fully in Metaphysics, is a mental process related to attention that Murdoch sees as largely but not fully under our control.

8. Ideologies are another category of socially-produced barriers to loving attention, for example, “meritocracy”, the view that one’s position in society is due entirely to one’s merit or lack thereof. This ideology generates representations of the successful and the unsuccessful that often place blinders on our ability to see persons in these categories properly (see Sandel 2020).

9. We're not speaking of the extent or full causal significance of unconscious bias, issues of some controversy (see Saul & Brownstein 2016).

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Lawrence Blum <>

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