There is unanimous agreement that Nāgārjuna (ca 150–250 CE) is the most important Buddhist philosopher after the historical Buddha himself and one of the most original and influential thinkers in the history of Indian philosophy. His philosophy of the “middle way” (madhyamaka) based around the central notion of “emptiness” (śūnyatā) influenced the Indian philosophical debate for a thousand years after his death; with the spread of Buddhism to Tibet, China, Japan and other Asian countries the writings of Nāgārjuna became an indispensable point of reference for their own philosophical inquiries. A specific reading of Nāgārjuna’s thought, called Prāsaṅgika-Madhyamaka, became the official philosophical position of Tibetan Buddhism which regards it as the pinnacle of philosophical sophistication up to the present day.
- 1. Life and works
- 2. Emptiness and svabhāva
- 3. Arguments against svabhāva
- 3.1 Causation
- 3.2 Change
- 3.3 Personal identity
- 3.4 Knowledge
- 3.5 Language and truth
- 4. Conclusion
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1. Life and works
Even though legendary accounts abound, very little can be said precisely about Nāgārjuna’s life. That Nāgārjuna was a Buddhist monk who lived some time between 150 and 250 CE, probably mainly in southern India is rarely disputed. If we want to go beyond these bare facts, however, intricate historical detective work is required. Some interesting connections have been discovered by this but they are of limited importance in the present context which is primarily aimed at providing information about Nāgārjuna’s philosophical works. The interested reader is referred to Mabbett 1998 and Walser 2005 for further discussion.
Fortunately there is more information about Nāgārjuna’s works than there is about his life but the situation is still far from ideal: it is not easy to come up with a precise list of texts Nāgārjuna composed. This is partly due to the fact that different authors bearing the name “Nāgārjuna” might have lived during different periods of the development of Buddhist thought in India, and partly due to the tendency of attributing newly composed works to the great authorities of the past. For the present purposes, however, we can divide Nāgārjuna’s works into three main groups (further discussion can be found in Ruegg 1981, Lindtner 1982). In the list I give here the ascription of the works mentioned to Nāgārjuna is largely uncontested. References to reliable translations into English are provided in the list of primary sources in the bibliography.
- The argumentative works
The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way (MMK) (Mūlamadhyamakakārikā). This is the most important of Nāgārjuna’s works. In its 450 stanzas it expounds the entire compass of his thought and constitutes the central text of the “philosophy of the Middle Way”. It has been commented upon by a large number of later authors. (Ye 2011 provides a useful edition of the Sanskrit, Tibetan, and Chinese recensions of this work).
The Sixty Stanzas on Reasoning (Yuktiṣaṣṭikā). A shorter treatise, discussing the notions of emptiness and dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda).
The Seventy Stanzas on Emptiness (Śūnyatāsaptati). Another short treatise, dealing in addition with questions of agency and the two truths.
The Dispeller of Disputes (Vigrahavyāvartanī). In this work of seventy verses with an autocommentary in prose Nāgārjuna responds to a set of specific objections raised against his system. These objections come both from Buddhist and non-Buddhist opponents and initiate discussions of topics which do not get much coverage in Nāgārjuna’s other works (in particular epistemology and the philosophy of language).
The Treatise on Pulverization (Vaidalyaprakaraṇa). A very interesting and difficult work in which Nāgārjuna sets out to refute the logical categories of the non-Buddhist Nyāya school. Like d. this text has never attracted the attention of classical commentators.
The Precious Garland (Ratnāvalī). A long text addressed to a king containing a comprehensive discussion of ethical questions. Because discussion of the theory of emptiness plays a comparatively minor role in this text it is sometimes subsumed under the epistolary works (see below).
The hymns (Catuḥstava). There is some discussion which of the various hymns ascribed to Nāgārjuna actually make up the quartet of ‘four hymns’ often referred to in the commentarial literature. They differ in interesting respects from the works mentioned in the preceding section. Common to many of them is a positive conception of ultimate truth which ascribes specific qualities to it and gets close to the theory of Buddha-nature (tathāgatagarbha) that became very important in the later development of Buddhist thought.
The epistolary works. The Friendly Letter (Suhṛllekha), like the Precious Garland (Ratnāvalī), which is sometimes assigned to this group is a work addressed to a king. This fact may explain why the text is primarily concerned with ethical matters. It devotes relatively little space to the kind of philosophical discussion which is Nāgārjuna’s most characteristic contribution to Buddhist thought.
2. Emptiness and svabhāva
The central concept around which all of Nāgārjuna’s philosophy is built is the notion of emptiness (śūnyatā). Emptiness is of course always the emptiness of something, and the something Nāgārjuna has in mind here is svabhāva. Different terms have been used to translate this word into English: “inherent existence” and “intrinsic nature” appear to be the more popular choices, but “substance” and “essence” have also been proposed. None of these cover the full complexity of the term, however. We therefore have to give some more detailed account of the way svabhāva is characterized in Nāgārjuna’s thought. By understanding what empty things are supposed to be empty of we simultaneously gain a more precise understanding of the concept of emptiness.
We can distinguish two main conceptual dimensions of the concept of svabhāva, an ontological one, which refers to a particular way in which objects exist, and a cognitive one, which refers to a way in which objects are conceptualized by human beings. Within the ontological dimension we can distinguish three different understandings of svabhāva: in terms of essence, in terms of substance, and in terms of absolute reality. (Even though this distinction is largely based on Madhyamaka authors later than Nāgārjuna it is still a useful heuristic tool for understanding the philosophical point he was trying to make.)
If we understand svabhāva in terms of essence it has to be considered a property an object could not lose without ceasing to be that very object: the svabhāva of fire is to be hot, the svabhāva of water to be wet: whatever ceases to be hot is no longer fire, whatever ceases to be wet is no longer water. According to this understading svabhāva is also identified with the kind of specific qualities (svalakṣaṇa) that allow an observer to distinguish an object from other things: by knowing that something is hot, together with a variety of other svalakṣaṇas we know that what we have in front of us is fire rather than something else. It is important to note that this concept of svabhāva (which plays only a small role in Nāgārjuna’s writings but becomes more important in later Madhyamaka writers) is not the target of the Madhyamaka critique. When Nāgārjuna argues that things are empty of svabhāva it is not this notion of essence he is concerned with. The philosophically more important understanding of svabhāva is an understanding in terms of substance.
In Buddhist philosophical thought preceding Nāgārjuna we find the distinction between primary existents (dravyasat) and secondary existents (prajñaptisat). Primary existents constitute the objective and irreducible constituents of the world out there while secondary existents depend on our conceptual and linguistic practices. Early schools of Buddhist metapysics hold that only irreducible dharmas (entities that may be conceptualized analogous to particularized properties or tropes (see Goodman 2004)) are really real whereas everything else, including shoes and ships and sealing-wax is a mere aggregate of such dharmas constructed by our conceptualizing mind. According to this theory the entire world around us would be relegated to the status of mere secondary existents, apart from the property particulars which are primary existents. In this context svabhāva is equated with primary existence and denotes a specific ontological status: to exist with svabhāva means to be part of the basic furniture of the world, independent of anything else that also happens to exist. Such objects provide the ontological rock-bottom on which the diverse world of phenomena rests. They provide the end-point of a chain of ontological dependence relations.
Nāgārjuna argues, however, that there is no such end-point and denies the existence of an ontological foundation (see Westerhoff 2017. For the relation of this idea to the debate about the well-foundedness of grounding in contemporary metaphysics see chapter 3 of Westerhoff 2020). This fact is sometimes used as support of the accusation that Madhyamaka is really a nihilistic doctrine, a doctrine that nothing exists. For if the secondary existent is reduced to the primary, and if there is no primary, what is there left? This interpretation has a relatively long history, beginning in ancient India and continuing to find supporters nowadays (see Spackman 2014, Westerhoff 2016). Nevertheless, there are powerful systematic and historical reasons against it. First of all, it is not clear that this kind of ontological nihilism is in fact a consistent position (if there is nothing, is there not at least the fact that there is nothing, i.e. something? See, however, Westerhoff 2021). Secondly, the Mādhyamikas themselves are very clear that their position avoids both of the extreme views, the view that believes in the existence of svabhāva as well as its nihilistic opposite.
It is the understanding of svabhāva as a primary existent or substance that constitutes the main target of Nāgārjuna’s philosophical criticism. Before we have a closer look at the form this criticism takes we must briefly mention the final ontological understanding of svabhāva, namely svabhāva as absolute reality. If svabhāva is regarded as the true nature of phenomena it is sometimes characterized as not brought about by any causal process, as unchangeable and as independent of any other object. The interesting problem arising here is that for the Madhyamaka the true nature of phenomena is emptiness, i.e. the absence of svabhāva understood as substance, and that svabhāva understood in this way is also characterized as not brought about by any causal process, as unchangeable and as independent of any other object. So it seems to be the case that something that has all these properties must exist (since there is svabhāva which is the true nature of phenomena) and must not exist (since, the Madhyamaka argues, svabhāva understood as substance does not exist). In the Buddhist commentarial literature we find several different ways of dissolving this contradiction (for more discussion see Westerhoff 2009: 40–46). One way of tackling the issue is by differentiating two senses in which svabhāva can be “independent of any other object”. This can be understood as the familiar understanding of substance as a primary existent noted above. But it can also be understood as meaning “not dependent on any specific phenomenon”. We could then argue that emptiness as the true nature of phenomena is to be understood as svabhāva and thus as independent only in the second, but not in the first sense. This is due to the fact that svabhāva in the sense rejected by Madhyamaka thinkers is regarded as a superimposition mistakenly projected onto objects which in fact lack it (see below). Thus emptiness only exists as long as svabhāva understood as substance is mistakenly projected onto some object or other. Emptiness does not depend on any specific phenomenon to exist, but there has to be some phenomenon mistakenly conceived for emptiness to exist. Emptiness is not some kind of primordial reality ante rem but a corrective to a mistaken view of how the world exists. This account boils down to saying that there really are only two ways of understanding svabhāva: as essence and as substance. What was earlier called svabhāva as absolute reality is only a specific form of svabhāva understood as essence: in the same way as heat is an essential quality of fire emptiness is an essential quality of all phenomena. Things could not be the things they are without being empty.
In concluding our exposition of the different conceptual dimensions that make up the concept of svabhāva in Madhyamaka thought we finally have to consider the cognitive understanding of the term. This constitutes an indispensable component of Nāgārjuna’s concept since for him the purpose of determining the existence or non-existence of svabhāva is not just to arrive at a theoretically satisfactory understanding of reality but is taken to have far more comprehensive implications for how we interact with the world. Realization of the non-existence of svabhāva is supposed to have important soteriological consequences as part of Buddhist practice; ultimately it is understood to be the way to the liberation from existential suffering, the final of the famous four noble truths expounded by the Buddha. It is important to realize that svabhāva understood as substance that Nāgārjuna rejects is not a theoretical posit, an entity an insufficiently sophisticated philosopher might postulate, but a kind of cognitive default, a way of superimposing something onto the world that is automatic and immediate and not the result of detailed theoretical reflection. We carry out such superimpositions when we regard the rapidly changing set of psycho-physical aggregates that constitutes us as a single, permanent, independent self but also in our daily interaction with other persons, medium-sized dry goods, linguistic representations and so forth. These then lead to all sorts of painful emotional entanglements and constitute the key source of suffering described in the Buddhist teachings. It is crucial to keep in mind in this context that the Madhyamaka distinguishes between the understanding of the absence of svabhāva or emptiness and its realization. The former is a purely intellectual response resulting from being convinced by the Madhyamaka arguments; it does not entail that phenomena will no longer appear as having svabhāva. They will only cease to appear in this way as a result of the realization of emptiness. The aim of Madhyamaka thought is therefore not simply to present an accurate account of the nature of the world, but to bring about a cognitive shift, a change in the way in which the world appears to us. It is useful to compare this situation with the perception of an optical illusion such as the Müller-Lyer illusion in which two lines of equal length appear to be of different length. By using a ruler we can convince ourselves that our perception deceives us; by learning more about perceptive mechanisms we can understand why we perceive the lines in the way they do. But none of this implies that the lines will in the end look as if they are equally long.
3. Arguments against svabhāva
As we noted earlier the understanding of svabhāva in terms of substance (which is rejected by Nāgārjuna) conceives of it as an end-point in a series of dependence relations. Various kinds of dependence relations are discussed in the Madhyamaka literature; the most important ones for our purposes are mereological dependence (the dependence of a composite object on its parts), causal dependence (the dependence of an effect on its cause) and conceptual dependence (the dependence of an object on the conceptualizing mind). For the Madhyamaka these dependence relations are equivalent to the extent that none ever bottoms out. They do have different weight in their philosophical argumentation, however, since only establishing that conceptual dependence does not have a foundation is sufficient for establishing the absence of svabhāva in the comprehensive sense intended by the Madhyamaka philosophers. Even if there was no foundation for mereological dependence, i.e. even if there were no partless particles, or no foundation of causal dependence, i.e. no first cause there would still remain an important sense in which things exist substantially, namely independent of human cognition and conceptualization. Only if we can show that no objects exist independently with respect to conceptual dependence are we able to establish Nāgārjuna’s anti-foundationalism in the full sense.
It is interesting to note that despite the fact that arguing for the non-existence of svabhāva and the establishment of the theory of universal emptiness is the central concern of Nāgārjuna’s philosophy we do not find a “master argument” to accomplish this (see Siderits 2000: 228 and 2003: 147). Of course we do find systematic lists of the core Madhyamaka arguments, in particular in the later scholastic developments of this school but none of them is regarded as the single argument that settles the matter once and for all. The reason for this comes directly from the comprehensive rejection of svabhāva. If nothing has its nature intrinsically and independently there can also be no argument for a particular thesis that by its very nature establishes its conclusion independent of the context in which it is made and independent of the audience towards which it is directed. The Madhyamaka refutation of svabhāva must proceed in a step-by-step manner. If there is someone who believes that some objects of kind x exist substantially the Madhyamaka will produce an argument to show that these objects really lack svabhāva. For another opponent, who thinks that not the xs but the ys are substantial a different argument has to be used. It is plausible, however, that there are certain areas of human thought in which human beings inevitably superimpose svabhāva on things which in fact lack it. A great deal of Madhyamaka literature is devoted to the discussion of these, and to arguments showing their lack of svabhāva. The following section will examine some of these areas more closely.
In Nāgārjuna’s discussion of causation we usually find him investigating a set of alternative ways in which cause and effect could be related. Each of these is subsequently found to be unsatisfactory. As a result Nāgārjuna does not conclude that causation is impossible, but that our understanding of the causal relation must be based on some faulty premiss. This premiss is the presupposition that cause and effect exist with their own svabhāva. What this means is that they are qualitatively distinct, independent objects: first the cause exists without the effect, later the effect can exist without the cause, once the cause has passed out of existence. Apart from being independent of each other, cause and effect are also independent of the cognizing mind. The chain of causes and conditions is something that exists out there in the world, independent of human interests and concerns. Nāgārjuna intends to show that because there is something wrong with all the understandings of causation usually encountered, the difficulty is likely to lie in a mistaken supposition that underlies all of them.
In his most well-known discussion of causation Nāgārjuna distinguishes four ways in which things could be causally be brought about. They could be produced
- from themselves, or
- from other things, or
- from both themselves and from other things, or
- from neither.
The idea that things are their own causes is a somewhat peculiar one. The Buddhist discussion usually distinguishes two different views under this heading: that cause and effect are the very same object, and that the effect is somehow contained in the cause. One plausible candidate for the identity of cause and effect is persistence through time. The idea here is that the cause of the present rock is the rock one second ago, and that these two rocks are the very same thing. Of course this only works if we are not endurantists, i.e. if we do not think that there are different temporal slices all of which make up the rock. If this is the case then what we are looking at here is one part of an object causing another, rather than one object causing itself. For a perdurantist who believes there is some object wholly present during each time there is the difficulty that we usually believe causes to temporally precede their effects. No object can be temporally prior to itself, however.
Assuming that the effect is somehow already contained in the cause (or in the causal field, that is in the collection of the cause and all the necessary background conditions) might be a more interesting way of spelling out self-causation. This also entails that when the cause is present, the effect is present too, contrary to our usual assumption that it is the cause which brings about the effect at a later time. Yet we are not able to find the effect if we look amongst the components of the causal field: amongst petrol, oxygen, a spark and so forth there is no explosion to be found. This does not mean that given a sufficiently detailed description of the causal field we might not be able to infer the effect. But this would hardly be sufficient to allow us to speak of the containment of the effect in the cause.
3.1.2 Causation from other things
To assume that cause and effect are distinct phenomena might strike us as the most natural understanding of causation. Yet Nāgārjuna argues that cause and effect cannot be substantially distinct. This is because the effect depends existentially on the cause (if the cause did not exist the effect would not exist) and the cause depends at least notionally on the effect (if there was no effect the cause would not be called “cause”). The kind of independence demanded by substantial existence, by existence by svabhāva, is simply not available for things which are cause and effect. On the other hand if we had a set of objects that were distinct in the required sense it would be hard to see how we could make sense of any of these being either cause or effect since no pair of objects from the set would be connected by a dependence relation. If two objects are distinct by svabhāva there cannot be any dependence relation of any kind holding between them. For any two objects from this set that we label “cause” and “effect” we can similarly imagine reversing the assignment as the existence of any one does not influence the existence of any other. But this implies that it cannot be the causal relation we are talking about, since in general the roles of cause and effect cannot be switched.
3.1.3 Causation from both themselves and from other things
The most convincing way of understanding this alternative is in terms of a cause that contains the effect in itself as a potentiality that is actualized given certain conditions. A block of marble (the cause) may be said to contain a statue (the result) as a potentiality that is made real by a variety of supporting conditions, namely the sculptor’s actions. Here cause and effect are not wholly distinct (since the block and the statue share some parts) nor are they identical (since the block is not the statue), thereby avoiding the difficulties implied by the preceding two accounts. This account is fine as far as it goes, but it would not support the contention that either cause or effect exist substantially, with svabhāva. The supporting conditions could not exist without the block and the statue could not exist without either or these. None of the objects involved have the roles they play from their own side, independently of one another.
3.1.4 Causation from neither
A final possibility to envisage is that causation is neither self-causation nor causation from a distinct object. This is usually understood as the belief in the complete absence of causation since the first three alternatives are taken to be exhaustive: if these alternatives are ruled out the only remaining possibility is that there are no causal relata since there is no causal relation. A major difficulty with this view is that it fails to account for our ability to grasp facts about the world, since our epistemic access is most plausibly understood as causal. If there is no causal interaction between our sense-organs and the objects out there how is knowledge of the world possible at all? A further concern is the fact that the world appears to us to be causally ordered. It is not the case that more or less anything follows from anything else, but certain things only follow from certain other things. As such an account that denies the existence of causal relations altogether cannot be a satisfactory account of the world as we experience it.
Neither of the four alternatives just examined allows a plausible understanding of cause and effect as existing with svabhāva. Nāgārjuna therefore argues that there must be something wrong with the assumption that cause and effect exist in this way. They are not independent but mutually dependent. The dependence of the effect on the cause is easy to understand: if there was no cause there would not have been any effect. But how can we make sense of the reverse? Even if the cause had not produced the effect if would still have existed (even though it would not have been called “cause”). There are three different ways in which we can make sense of Nāgārjuna’s assertion that the cause also depends existentially on the effect.
(a) Firstly we can argue that if Nāgārjuna debates with an opponent who holds that since a cause has its property of being a cause essentially, its notional dependence on the effect will entail its existential dependence. For something being a cause essentially means that this is a property it could not lose without ceasing to be that very object. But since the presence of this property depends on existence of the effect, the existence of the cause as that very object also depends on the existence of the effect.
(b) A second interpretation which does not have to assume that causes are essentially causes argues that Nāgārjuna does not intend to refer to the existential dependence of some particular cause on its effect but rather to the existential dependence of the property of being a cause on the property of being an effect. If an object a falling under property P notionally depends on something falling under Q this means that the property P existentially depends on the property Q, as P can only exist if some object falls under the property ‘identical with the property Q’, i.e., if the property Q exists.
The property ‘being the left side of my body’ depends existentially on the property ‘being the right side of my body’, even though the objects falling under each do not existentially depend on one another. This is due to the fact that one property could not exist without the other one, but the objects falling under them could. In the case of cause and effect we could therefore interpret Nāgārjuna as saying that the properties ‘being a cause’ and ‘being an effect’ depend existentially on one another, even though the existential dependence of objects falling under them is not symmetric: the effect depends existentially on the cause, but the cause does not need the effect for its existence.
(c) The third and final reading claims that while Nāgārjuna undoubtedly also wanted to assert the existential dependence of the properties ‘being a cause’ and ‘being an effect’ on each other he moreover made the claim that not only the particular object which is the effect needs the cause for its existence, but the cause also needs the effect. Such a reading can be supported by considering an entire causal field, that is the cause together with the necessary background conditions, rather than just particular causes. A causal field is a cognitive artefact, a collection of objects assembled with the sole purpose of explaining why a particular effect came about. Divorced from this explanatory role there is no reason for introducing the concept at all. We might therefore want to argue that the causal field also depends for its existence on the effect it produces. This is of course not to say that every member of the causal field existentially depends on the effect they jointly bring about: the spark, petrol, and so forth would still exist, even if they for some reason did not manage to bring about an explosion. But the collection only exists if there is some effect it causes. Whether we want to argue that a causal field depends for its existence on the effect it brings about is intimately connected with our view of the existence of collections. We might either think that whenever the are some objects there is the collection of those objects. Or we might deny that every arbitrary assembly of objects constitutes a collection. We would then argue that for some objects to form a collection there must be something which makes them hold together as a collection, for example that they all exemplify a property, or that they were put together for a specific purpose. If we adopt the first view of collections then clearly a causal field will only depend notionally on its effect, since ‘being a causal field bringing about that effect’ is only one way in which we can refer to the pre-existent collection that contains all the elements of the causal field, but not anything which brings it about. Adopting the second conception, however, it may be the case that the only thing that binds all the members of the causal field together is that they are considered to be the things that jointly bring about a particular effect. In the absence of this effect the collection disintegrates and ceases to exist.
Nāgārjuna seems to favour the second interpretation when he asserts that a cause could not exist without an effect. (MMK 4.3) It is significant that what is denied here is not just the ascription of the label ‘cause’ to some object because it is related to some other object, the effect, but the existence of the cause in the absence of the effect. Nāgārjuna endorses not just the uncontroversial notional dependence of the cause on its effect, but its existential dependence as well. Applied to the discussion of causal fields this implies that a causal field can only exist if the effect it brings about does, and for this reason cannot be taken to exist whenever all of its members do. If we adopt reading c) given above we have to conclude that for Nāgārjuna causes and effects are both notionally and existentially dependent on one another. They therefore cannot exist from their own side, irrespective of the existence of one another. Moreover, they also depend for their existence on us, because it is our cognitive act of cutting up the world of phenomena in the first place that creates the particular assembly of objects that constitutes a causal field, which then in turn gives rise to the notions of cause and effect. This entails that the causal field, cause and effect are empty of svabhāva.
An important point we must not lose sight of in the context of the discussion of causation is that while showing that objects stand in causal relations is sufficient for showing that they are empty of svabhāva in some way (since they do not exist independently of one another), this on its own would not be sufficient support for Nāgārjuna’s thesis of universal emptiness. Just the fact that some objects are cause and effect does not mean that they exist in any way dependent on human cognition, and it is this dependence on cognition or conceptualization that is generally regarded as the most profound understanding of emptiness. (It is also useful to note in this context that the Ābhidharmikas, a Buddhist school that was one of the main targets of Nāgārjuna’s criticism saw no conflict between objects being causally produced and their possessing svabhāva.) Mark Siderits (2004: 411) has pointed out that what we have to argue first of all is that the objects we usually interact with are causally produced so that speaking about them involves essential reference to causality. We further need to appeal to the principle that if some object essentially involves a property that is conceptually constructed then the object is conceptually constructed too. Chess games are conceptually constructed, and since “the book describing the longest chess game ever played” essentially involves chess games it is conceptually constructed too. But, as Nāgārjuna set out to show, since the causal relation does not exist from its own side, is conceptually constructed, and therefore empty, each causally related object must be so constructed and therefore empty in the most profound sense of being conceptually constructed.
The discussion of change, in particular that of spatio-temporal change, of motion, occupies a prominent position in Nāgārjuna’s arguments. In the second chapter of the MMK we find a long discussion of the impossibility of motion. Parallels with Zeno’s paradoxes have been drawn and it has been argued that Nāgārjuna’s aim was to refute certain views of the structure of space and time (Siderits and O’Brien 1976). Nevertheless, there is some evidence that Nāgārjuna two main aims were something else: firstly, to reject a substantialist interpretation of some of the key notions of the Buddhist teaching and, secondly, to defend a specific view of the relation between individuals and their properties.
Nāgārjuna employs two key arguments that we might want to call the property-absence argument and the property-duplication argument. The first (MMK 2:3–3, 9–10) questions the suitability of such statements like “the mover moves” because there are difficulties conceiving of a mover without motion. Nāgārjuna argues that there is a difficulty with thinking of the individual (the mover) and the property (the motion) in the familiar way, as mutually independent objects. In the case of a blue vase the vase and the blueness can exist without each other (at least as long as we are not trope theorists) whereas there clearly is no mover that does not move. The two stand in a dependence relation since the individual depends on the property it instantiates. It therefore cannot exist by svabhāva.
The second argument (MMK 2:5, 11) states that if we were to think in terms of a mover moving there would be two motions rather than one: that motion which makes the mover a mover, and that motion by which it moves. The reason for this is that a mover is an example of an individual where a distinction between its constitutive and instantiated properties cannot be drawn. The constitutive property is what constitutes an individual (something is a cube, or a pot, or a vase) and the instantiated properties are had by the individual (it is heavy, or round, or blue). If we apply these notions to the case of the moving mover we would require two different motions: one which constitutes the individual and one which is its property. But of course there is only one motion: that of the moving mover. The point Nāgārjuna makes here is not just there are problems when analyzing statements like “the mover moves”, “the thunder roars” and so forth in terms of an ontology of constitutive and instantiated properties but the more general observation that this has implications for the way we can apply these terms even to more usual statements like “the vase is blue”. That the distinction between constitutive and instantiated properties makes no sense in the case of “the mover moves” shows that there is no substantial distinction between these properties, and that the conceptualization of a situation in terms of them is purely a result of cognitive convenience. Since we want to stress certain features we speak of a blue, round vase instead of a vase-shaped, round, blue thing or a vase-shaped, blue, round thing, but this in no way implies that there is a fundamental difference between the properties “being a vase”, “being round”, and “being blue” so that only one of them is constitutive while the others are instantiated. There is no ready-made world that is already sliced in such a way.
When Nāgārjuna argues that neither mover nor motion exist by svabhāva he first of all makes an important point about some central concepts of the Buddhist world-view. The goal of the Buddhist path is the liberation from cyclic existence, a form of existence that is nothing but the moving about (samsṛ) through a succession of rebirths. When Nāgārjuna speaks about the mover (gati) he has in mind both the familiar motion from one end of the road to another one as well as the motion from one life to the next. Nāgārjuna’s arguments to the effect that mover and motion are interdependent, that the beginning and end of motion are not to be found “out there” in the world entail that the person who is reborn, the cyclic existence he is reborn in and the liberation from that cyclic existence do not exist substantially.
Nāgārjuna’s second main point is that his analysis of motion has specific implications for our view of individuals and properties. The aim of his arguments is to show that the distinction between individuals and properties is not one which exists independent of our conceptualizations. As the talk about the ‘property’ instantiated by an individual like a mover or a clap of thunder had to be explained in terms of a single feature seen in two different ways – as constitutive and as instantiating – in the same way talk of the properties of ordinary individuals such as a blue vase could be seen to be equally a reflection of the division of their features into constitutive and instantiating properties, something which is just a reflection of our pragmatic concerns in conceptualizing the individual in question, but not a reflection of its intrinsic nature.
For the Madhyamaka school conceiving of substances as individuals instantiating properties is deeply unsatisfactory. For the sake of illustration (and using an Indian example) assume a substantially real, fundamental entity the only property of which is being spatially extended. Now what is the individual in which this property inheres? As it is not characterized by any other properties it must be some kind of propertyless bare particular. What makes it a bare particular? Given that we are dealing with substances here it should not depend on some other object. But if it is a bare particular by svabhāva and being a bare particular is therefore its intrinsic nature we are in the same situation as we were with the spatially extended entity. For now we can ask what the individual is in which being a bare particular inheres, and then we are well on our way into an infinite regress. Note that this problem does not got away if we feel uneasy about the property ‘being a bare particular’ and do not want to admit it. For we have to assume that the individual has some determinate nature due to which it is a bearer of its properties and the difficulty will just reappear with whatever we take such a nature to be.
It does not help much if we conceive of substances as particularized properties or tropes instead. For then it is unclear how we can individuate one spatial-extension-trope from another. We cannot differentiate them according to the individuals in which they inhere because we have just rejected the existence of individuals at the level of substances. We cannot say that this spatial-extension-trope is different from that because they turn up in different individuals, since the different individuals are just collections of tropes. Of course we could try to tell apart the various trope-substances by the collections in which they occur (or, more precisely, by which other tropes they are related to via a higher-order compresence-trope). The difficulty for this is that it introduces dependence-relations via the back door, for every trope will existentially depend on being connected to just these other tropes via a compresence-trope — we cannot take a trope and ‘move’ it to another collection. As we want to conceive of substances as entities that are not existentially dependent on one another this approach inevitably introduces a certain tension into our system. It thus becomes apparent that once more a conceptual scheme that can be more or less straightforwardly applied to non-substances breaks down once we attempt to analyse the supposedly foundational objects of our world in terms of it. While the analysis of a red apple into an individual and the property it instantiates is at least on the face of it unproblematic, the same analysis generates problems when applied to ultimate existents. (See, however, Siderits 2014, 2016: 113.)
3.3 Personal identity
Nāgārjuna’s criticism of substance does not just apply to the world of objects, to the phenomena around us, but equally to the world of subjects, that is our own and other persons’ self. This is very much in harmony with the Buddha’s own conception of a person that rejected a self existing with svabhāva. Such a self would have to be conceived of as distinct from both our body and our psychological states, as essentially unchanging, as a unifier of our diverse beliefs, desires and sensory impressions, and as an agent that makes the decisions that shape our lives. The alternative presented by the Buddha is a view of the self that regards it as a continuously changing array of five psycho-physical aggregates (the physical body, sensation, perception, intellect, and consciousness) without an inner core. Many of the arguments Nāgārjuna presents when rejecting the notion of a substantially existent subject bear a close resemblance to those brought forward by the Buddha himself. (See the entry on Buddha.) Nevertheless his works also provide us with some arguments with a distinctly Nāgārjunian slant. In MMK 18:2a the opponent wonders: ‘if there was no self, where would the self’s properties come from?’ The worry behind this question is that the undeniable fact that there are properties of the self—since the Madhyamaka does not want to deny that seeing, feeling, tasting and so forth takes place — implies that there must be a bearer of such properties, i.e. a self. Since properties depend existentially on something that instantiates them a self must be postulated as the instantiator of all the mental properties we observe. It appears as if we need a substratum for the psychological states, desires, beliefs and so on. However, the body, because of its continuously changing nature, cannot be regarded as adequate for such substratumhood. Therefore some kind of self has to be postulated.
But if we take into account the distinction between constitutive and instantiated properties described above it seems possible to dissolve this worry. Nāgārjuna differentiates between the property we see as constituting an individual (such as roundness in the case of a circle, treeness in the case of a tree etc.) and those properties that the individual is then taken to instantiate (such as redness in the case of the circle, and greenness in the case of the tree). As became evident in the discussion of motion where Nāgārjuna introduces this distinction, the difference between constitutive and instantiated properties is not regarded as bearing any ontological weight. It is rather a reflection of our epistemic priorities and practical concerns that we describe an object as a tree which is green, rather that as a green object which has the property of treeness. As a consequence there is no fundamental ontological difference between a substratum (dravya) and the qualities (guṇa) that inhere in it, contrary to the view that is e.g. held by the Naiyāyikas. (See the entry on Analytic Philosophy in Early Modern India (Navya-Nyāya).) When we speak of an individual having a property we nominalize the predicate expressing the property we take to be constitutive and ascribe the instantiating properties to the individual thus created. There is, however, no deep ontological reason why we could not change our view of what the constitutive and what the instantiating properties are, and thereby describe the very same situation in terms of different individuals and properties. But if we accept this picture of ontology it is evident that we are not obliged to infer the existence of a substratum or underlying individual from the existence of a quality. Of course the Mādhyamika does not deny that there are a variety of sensory and mental events that happen in close temporal and causal connection. But our ascription of these to a single self does not commit us to the existence of such a self at the ontological level, any more than the ascription of redness to a circle commits us to the existence of an individual — the circle — and the redness it instantiates. In the same way in which we select one property, such as circularity, as constitutive and then group all the other properties around this new-found ‘individual’, in the same way we select certain properties of a causal nexus of sensory and mental events, some ‘shifting coalition of psycho-physical elements’ and group the remainder of the properties around this new-found ‘self’. To speak of the self and its properties in terms of substratum and quality is perfectly acceptable, as long as we do not assume that such talk is based on a distinction with an ontological grounding.
Another issue Nāgārjuna raises (in MMK 9:3) concerns the epistemic status of the self. A tension arises once we note that in its role as a unifier of our cognitive life a substantial self features in all our experiences, as the subject having the experiences, but at the same time, given the distinctness of such a self from our body and all parts of our mental life it must also be distinct from all experiences. In order to have epistemic access to our self it must be able to function as a cognitive object. Since we assume, however, that it is not only a cognitive subject but also intrinsically a cognitive object it cannot ever occupy this role — at least if we make the plausible assumption that being an object and being a subject are mutually incompatible properties. Now given that we do not seem to be able to acquire knowledge of the self by introspection or by observation of the outside world it appears that the only cognitive route left open to us is inference. We have to establish by an argument that the self exists. It might strike us as slightly curious that what seems to be the most intimate object of our acquaintance has to be known by a most indirect route. We might also consider it as somewhat epistemically implausible to assume that everybody’s belief in a self is arrived at by a process of drawing inferences from a set of clues. One Nyāya argument for the existence of the self based on the supposed existential dependence of qualities on a substratum has already been discussed above. The Mādhyamika will be reluctant to accept it since he does not agree with the Nyāya ontology of individuals and properties it presupposes. Other arguments would obviously have to be dealt with on a case-by-case basis. But the Mādhyamika will argue here that in fact no such argument is needed, since it is perfectly possible to account for our self-awareness, as long as we give up the conception of a substantial self. If we conceive of the self as a temporally stretched-out compound of psychophysical events then there is no fundamental difficulty that the same type of event turns up on the cognizing subject side on one occasion, and on the cognized object side on another. Given that there is no unified substratum constituting the self there is also no necessity for something to be essentially a subject of experience. As different parts can play different roles at different times our self-knowledge can be just explained by a momentary identification with a mental event that presently functions as a cognizing subject.
Given that Nāgārjuna rejects the picture of a substantial self described above we have to consider which alternative picture we are presented with instead. The self is obviously seen as depending on the five constituents, which rules out the assumption that any independently existent substance could be regarded as a self. The emerging view of the self is characterized by two main properties.
Firstly it is to be regarded as a sequence of events that stand in close temporal and causal relations. Physical processes cause sensory events, which are then framed by concepts, used as the basis of decisions, which give rise to actions, which in turn set physical processes in motion which cause new sensory events and so forth. The self is not seen as a cognitive nucleus which stays constant amidst the stream of changing sensory impressions and mental deliberations, but rather as the entire set of such sensory and mental events which are interconnected in complicated ways.
Not only does the self depend for its existence on the constituents, but the constituents only acquire their existence as distinct parts of the stream of mental and physical events by being associated with a single self, which, regarded as a constitutive property, produces the basis for postulating the individual in which the various properties of the self inhere. It is precisely this reason that keeps the Mādhyamika from regarding the constituents as ultimate existents (dravya) and the self as merely imputed (prajñapti). For the Mādhyamika not only is there no substantial self, there is also no substantial basis on which a non-substantial self could be built.
Secondly, the self is characterized by a mistaken self-awareness. This means that the self which is essentially a sequence of events does not regard itself in this way, but considers itself to be a substantial self, that is, an essentially unchanging unified agent distinct from its physical and mental properties. To this extent it is deluded about its real nature. Nāgārjuna therefore compares the agent to an illusion created in a magical performance that in turn brings about another illusion (MMK 17:31–32). This construction allows him to reconcile his rejection of a substantial self as an essentially unchanging unifier of our mental live distinct from both its physical and mental attributes with the acceptance of the self as an agent who will experience the results of his actions, an assumption which could not be relinquished within the Buddhist worldview. This is a very important point, since the identification of the self with a causally interlinked set of events might tempt us to throw out all prudential considerations for our future selves, as well as those for other selves. Since none of these have any ultimate existence we might think that all actions connected with them in some way (that is all our conscious actions) are all equally insubstantial too, so that in the ultimate analysis it does not make any difference how we act. Nāgārjuna counters this view by distinguishing the view from the inside of an illusion from the outside view. When we are dreaming and are not aware we are doing so we understandably prefer to leave a building by using the stairs, rather than jumping out of the window. For somebody who is not dreaming, however (and also for our later, waking selves) it does not make any difference whether we jump or not since at the ultimate level (from the point of view of the awakened one) there is no fundamental difference between the two actions. This does not imply that whilst we are still under the thrall of the illusion we should leave all prudential and moral considerations behind. On the contrary, as long as we are under the influence of the illusion we have to act in accordance with its laws, even if we might suspect that it is an illusion. Unlike in the case of dreaming, where the mere wondering whether we are dreaming sometimes allows us to see through the nature of the dream the mere suspicion that there is no substantial self is (unfortunately) not yet a realization of the emptiness of the self.
The Indian philosophical tradition distinguishes a variety of epistemic instruments (pramāṇa) by which epistemic objects (prameya) are accessed. Which epistemic instruments were accepted and how their function is understood differs amongst philosophical theories. In his discussion of epistemology Nāgārjuna lists four such instruments: perception (pratyakṣa), inference (anumāna), recognition of likeness (upamāna), and testimony (āgama). His primary concern is not a discussion of the nature and interrelation of these different epistemic instruments, but the question of how to establish any particular set of such instruments, whether it is the one just indicated or a different one. Once we have agreed that the existence of epistemic objects is established by the epistemic instruments (as for example the existence of the desk in front of me is established by my perceptual abilities, in this case primarily non-defective vision) we then have to address the further question of how to establish the instruments. How do we know that these instruments are good guides to the objects out there in the world?
There are three different ways in which we can try to establish epistemic instruments. First of all we could regard them as established by mutual coherence. Secondly we could assume that the epistemic instruments justify themselves. We do not have to go beyond perception to realize that perception usually delivers an accurate picture of the world, but perception itself presents a faithful representation of the world and of its own validity. Finally one could regard the epistemic instruments and objects as mutually establishing each other. The instruments establish an object by giving us epistemic access to it. But we could also argue that the epistemic object in turn establishes the epistemic instruments. Given that we manage to interact with the epistemic objects more or less successfully (as confirmed by the evolutionary success of our species) there must be something amongst our cognitive means which gives us a relatively accurate account of the way things are. In this way epistemic success allows us to establish the means of knowledge via the objects successfully cognized.
Nāgārjuna does not devote a great deal of discussion of to the first alternative, the establishment of the epistemic instruments by mutual coherence (for some discussion see Stoltz 2021: 156–157). The reason for this is that this is hardly a position his realist Naiyāyika opponent will want to adopt. There are, after all, coherent fairy-tales. Let us therefore have a closer look at the other two alternatives, paying particular attention to whether there is any way in which the epistemic objects and instruments could be construed as having their nature intrinsically, that is, as existing with svabhāva.
3.4.1 Are the epistemic instruments self-established?
Regarding the epistemic instruments as self-established has the immediate advantage of avoiding two difficulties. Firstly we get around the infinite regress of establishing the instruments by other instruments, which then in turn need yet other instruments to establish them, and so forth. Unlike other forms of infinite regress which Nāgārjuna accepts (such as an infinitely extended chain of causes and conditions) this regress is vicious, since the burden of proof is transferred in its entirety to the preceding stage, as an epistemic instrument would have to establish all the succeeding ones. Secondly the self-establishment of the epistemic instruments allows the opponent to hold on to the assumption that everything knowable is established by such instruments. It might be attractive to give up this assumption in order to escape the vicious regress, but this then makes it necessary to give a special reason explaining why ordinary objects are by established epistemic instruments, but not the instruments themselves.
Despite these advantages, Nāgārjuna argues, there are some serious problems with the assumption that the epistemic instruments are self-established. First of all, if an epistemic instrument, such as visual perception, was self-established it should be able to exist independently of the existence of an object of vision. But if we then assume that it is an essential property of visual perception to see, visual perception must be able to function as its own object, as otherwise there might be no other object to be seen. This, Nāgārjuna claims, then leads to a problem already encountered in his analysis of motion. The mover and the place being moved over cannot exist simultaneously, since motion takes time; vision cannot see something that exists simultaneously with it (such as itself), since vision takes time too (MMK 3:2–3, see also Garfield 1995: 139–139).
Secondly, observing again that if the epistemic instruments are self-established they will be established independently of the objects known, Nāgārjuna argues as follows. Assume that we wanted to chose those amongst all the different means of cognitive access to the world that deliver accurate knowledge of the nature of the objects known, that is, that qualify as epistemic instruments. We would select all those that have a specific internal quality. The possession of this quality would then guarantee that its possessor delivered accurate information about the nature of the objects cognized. But how is the connection between the specific internal quality and the correct representation of the object justified? After all there are all sorts of properties our means of cognitive access to the world can have, so how do we know that a specific one is a guide to accurate representation?
Suppose we are presented with a set of fancy mechanical devices and are asked to select the five best tin openers from these. No detailed study of the internal properties of each will allow us to accomplish that task. We have to analyse each in relation to a tin and try to determine the way in which it might open it. Only then would we be able to conclude which particular properties of the mechanisms are correlated with good tin-opening abilities. In the same way we can only regard an internal quality of a way of accessing the world as a characteristic of an epistemic instrument once we have assessed it in relation to the objects cognized. Only then can we conclude that this particular property really leads us to the knowledge of the nature of the object, rather than doing something else. But in this case the establishment of the epistemic instruments can no longer be regarded as self-establishment since it incorporates reference to other objects (namely the objects known) at an essential place.
3.4.2 Do the epistemic instruments and objects establish each other?
If the argument for the self-establishment of the epistemic instruments is not successful, the remaining option is to argue that the instruments and objects mutually establish one another. Assume that I see an apple on the table. The existence of the apple, the epistemic object, is established by the epistemic instrument which is perception. But we could equally argue the other way round: that the object known establishes the epistemic instrument. This would invite the immediate objection that we then need prior cognitive access to the object known, and if we have this we must already have established the epistemic instrument. We are therefore pointlessly establishing it twice. But if we somehow gain this access without relying on the epistemic instruments the whole project of establishing these instruments seems futile, since it is precisely the justification of our instruments used in gaining knowledge of the world that we have set out to scrutinize. We will therefore need a different argumentative strategy to argue for the mutual establishment of objects known and epistemic instruments, and in particular for the establishment of the latter by the former. One way of going about this (which does not commit us to the viciously circular mutual establishment criticized by Nāgārjuna) is to argue that because the epistemic object is perceived, there must be something bringing about such a perception, and this is the epistemic instrument. In this case the apple establishes the existence of the epistemic instrument by which it is known. An essential prerequisite for this latter direction of establishment is of course success. Because we successfully apprehend an apple our means of apprehension is regarded as an epistemic instrument. If we were susceptible to frequent apple-hallucinations that disappeared once we tried to touch them we would not regard perception as a reliable apple-detector, that is, as an epistemic instrument. But since we are generally successful in our cognitive interactions with the world and normally only perceive the existence of apples that are indeed there the very fact that we successfully apprehend a world of outside objects serves as an argument for regarding the successful means of apprehension as epistemic instruments. An immediate difficulty with this procedure is that we also need an epistemic instrument for establishing the success of our cognitive actions, that is to ascertain whether we really are perceiving the apple or just an apple-hallucination.
Nothing seems to rule out that some epistemic instrument first deceives us about what we see, and later deceives us about the outcome of whatever procedure we use to establish whether the first cognition was successful. But this need not rule out any attempts of mutually establishing the epistemic instruments and objects if we do not use epistemically suspect procedures (which we know to have lead to unsuccessful cognitions in the past) to establish the success of our cognitive actions. A more worrying question is whether the mutual establishment of instruments and objects – if successful – actually delivers the account of epistemic instruments Nāgārjuna’s opponent wants to defend. In order to see this we have to note first that the notion of ‘successful cognitive apprehension’ referred to above cannot just be an act of cognition that leads to a successful action, as many of our cognitions (and many of the beliefs subsequently acquired) are never acted upon. We therefore also have to include coherence with other cognitions or beliefs as a criterion for the success of some epistemic instruments as well. Our cognition of the apple on the table might therefore be deemed successful if it either leads to a successful action (we reach out, grasp the apple, and eat it) or if it coheres with other epistemic instruments (for example with my memory of buying a bag of apples and putting them on the table). However, the difficulty with employing coherence in this way is that we have to select a certain set of cognitions or beliefs that we hold fixed, so that we can then evaluate the status of other cognitions relative to them. One problem now is of course how to assure the accuracy of this selected set: if they are not accurate themselves coherence with them has very little argumentative weight.
Nāgārjuna’s account of epistemology is supposed to fulfill a purpose both at the object- as well as at the meta-level. At the object-level epistemic instruments and objects are just another set of central concepts that have to be investigated as entities potentially existing with svabhāva. Nāgārjuna argues that the various ways in which the epistemic instruments and objects could be established are either not satisfactory or fail to show that they exist with svabhāva. At the meta-level Nāgārjuna’s theory of epistemology is supposed to provide the theoretical background of his own account of emptiness. As the theory of emptiness is something we are supposed to acquire knowledge of it is essential to get clear about the means by which we are supposed to do so, and indeed about what our epistemic object consists of in this case. These two projects are inherently interconnected. For according to the standard Nyāya theory of epistemology Nāgārjuna encountered, knowledge is acquired by using a set of procedures (such as perception or inference) the nature of which it is to produce knowledge and which convey information about a set of objective, mind-independent set of individuals that are the bearers of specific qualities. But a theory that thus presupposes the existence of objects of knowledge with distinct natures which the means of knowledge could adequately represent could hardly be used as a basis for knowing emptiness, for it presupposes exactly what the theory of emptiness denies. A substantial part of Nāgārjuna’s epistemological discussion is therefore dedicated to a criticism of the standard Nyāya theory of knowledge. Nāgārjuna sets out to establish that nothing can be regarded as intrinsically an epistemic instrument or object. The two have to be mutually established: the instrument establishes the object by giving us cognitive access to it, our successful interaction with the object establishes the instrument as a trustworthy route to the object. Something will therefore be classified as an epistemic instrument or object not because this is a reflection of its intrinsic nature, but because it is regarded as such once a reflective equilibrium has been reached. We use beliefs about the nature of the object in order to test our hypotheses concerning the instruments of acquiring such beliefs, these hypotheses are then in turn used to assess our view of the nature of the object. Such mutual establishment of epistemic instruments and epistemic objects then also entails that neither of them can exist by svabhāva.
3.5 Language and truth
Language is not a topic that is given much explicit discussion in Nāgārjuna’s works. This does not mean that such matters were not important to him, but merely that his extant writings do not contain an extended connected discussion of the impact of his theory of emptiness on his view of language.
Nevertheless it is possible to extract some of Nāgārjuna’s views on this philosophically highly interesting issue from remarks found at different places in his works.
Most importantly it is apparent that the Madhyamaka theory of emptiness is not compatible with a the idea of a ‘ready-made world’, that is of a world that exists independently of human interests and concerns and already shows a particular kind of structuring that our structured language could then set out to reflect. If nothing exists with svabhāva nothing in the world could exist from its own side and nothing could bear a structure that is intrinsic to it, rather than something ascribed to it from the outside. Moreover, the Mādhyamika will reject the classic correspondence theory of truth, according to which the truth of a statement is grounded in the identity of structure between a statement and the bit of the world it refers to. This also entails a rejection of the associated view of how language works, namely that our sentences manage to connect up with the world via a set of objectively existent structural similarities. The main reason for this rejection is that the Mādhyamika cannot find any sufficiently substantial relation that would allow us to bind together world and word at the most fundamental level. The most plausible candidate for linking words and their referents is the causal relation, for example by using it to construct a causal chain from an ‘initial baptism’ to our present use of the term. But as we have seen, Nāgārjuna has argued that the causal relation itself is conceptually constructed. If causation cannot be regarded as a relation that functions objectively, independent of the concepts we employ then it can hardly be regarded as a mind-independent way of grounding the relationship between language and the world.
An alternative account which the Mādhyamika might want to adopt is one which does not conceive of truth in terms of correspondence with an exterior reality but rather in terms of assertability conditions. In this case a statement is regarded as true if conditions obtain that warrant our asserting the statement. What makes the statement that water is wet true is not a structural correspondence between it and a state of affairs involving water, but that we have something that justifies us in making this statement. What this justification consists in depends on the further details of our theory of truth; it might be based on facts about empirical observation, about coherence with other beliefs, about pragmatic success and so forth. This view of course implies that there could not be any truths that are in principle beyond our ability to know them. This is because we could never have a warrant for asserting such statements, and the existence of such a warrant is precisely what we consider the truth of the statements to consist in. Such statements would have to be regarded as lacking a truth-value. This kind of denial of verification-transcendent truths in turn agrees very well with Nāgārjuna’s contextualist epistemology. For if nothing is intrinsically an epistemic instrument nothing can be intrinsically beyond the grasp of such instruments either. As what constitutes an epistemic instrument is context-dependent, that a certain truth cannot be accessed by some instrument is context-dependent too. There is no context-independent concept of knowledge we could use to form the idea of a truth that lies beyond all epistemic contexts.
According to the Madhyamaka view of truth there can be no such thing as ultimate truth, a theory describing how things really are, independent of our interests and conceptual resources employed in describing it. All one is left with is conventional truth, truth which consists in agreement with commonly accepted practices and conventions. These are the truths that are arrived at when viewing the world through our linguistically formed conceptual framework. But we should be wary of denigrating these conventions as a distorting device that incorporates our specific interests and concerns. The very notion of ‘distortion’ presupposes that there is a world untainted by conceptuality out there (even if our minds can never reach it) that is twisted and bent to fit our cognitive grasp. But the very notion of such a ‘way things really are’ is argued by the Mādhyamika to be incoherent. There is no way of investigating the world apart from our linguistic and conceptual practices, if only because these practices generate the notion of the ‘world’ and of the ‘objects’ in it in the first place. To speak of conventional reality as distorted is therefore highly misleading, unless all we want to say is that our way of investigating the world is inextricably bound up with the linguistic and conceptual framework we happen to employ.
There are two worries one might have about the rejection of the notion of an ultimate truth. First of all one might think that progress in human inquiry makes it necessary that we question what we now believe to be truths and perhaps replace them with other beliefs. Even a cursory acquaintance with the history of science will show that we are where we are now only through a persistent process of replacing beliefs we once held to be true, but no longer hold to be true. But it seems hard to explain what our justification for this is if it is not trying to bring our beliefs into greater accordance with the way things are. All we ever seem to be dealing with according to the Madhyamaka view is a purely immanent notion of truth where the only kind of truth we have access to is a reflection of conventional human practices and agreements. In response to this the Mādhyamika might want to make the point that it is at least sometimes advantageous to treat truths as if they had a more than conventional grounding, that is as if they were not just the product of agreement with commonly accepted practices and conventions. This is precisely because such practices need improvement from time to time, and since a spirit of inquiry is facilitated better by the idea that there is a mind-independent truth waiting to be discovered. The Mādhyamika could thus argue that for pragmatic reasons we should conceive of truths as reflections of an objective, external reality even though we do not think that there are any such truths in fact. We might object at this point that if the notion of the existence of at least some verification-transcendent truths is pragmatically useful, whoever believes in truth as warranted assertability then has to believe that some truths are not conventional, since asserting this is now supported by a warrant. But this will not just turn the anti-realist into a realist against his will, since his embracing of non-conventional truths is dictated by purely practical concerns: we are considerably better off if we build our inquiries on the convenient fiction of non-conventional truths. But they remain just that, namely convenient fictions; the anti-realist does not think, as the realist does, that the existence of such truths is in any way grounded by the way the world is independent of our interests and concerns.
Another worry with the Mādhyamika’s rejection of an ultimate truth is that emptiness cannot then be regarded as the ultimate truth either. But surely, one will argue, for the Mādhyamika emptiness is the end-product of the correct analysis of phenomena, and thereby indicative of the way things really are. However, emptiness is not to be understood as a description of reality as it is independent of human conceptual conventions, as its main purpose it to combat the wrong ascription of svabhāva to things. The absence of svabhāva or emptiness is nothing phenomena have within themselves, but only something which is projected onto them from the outside in an attempt to rectify a mistaken cognition. Therefore the theory of emptiness is not to be regarded as an ultimately true theory either. Such a theory would describe things as they are independent of human interests and concerns. But the theory of emptiness is intricately bound up with such interests and concerns: if there were no human minds who mistakenly read the existence of svabhāva into phenomena which lack it there would be no point in having a theory to correct this. It is only due to our erroneous view of things that the theory of emptiness is required as a corrective.
The preceding discussion has discussed some of the main topics Nāgārjuna addresses in order to refute their existence by svabhāva: causation, change, the self, knowledge, language, and truth. This is not a comprehensive exposition of the Madhyamaka view, however, not just because there are aspects of Nāgārjuna’s thought we have not mentioned here (such has his discussion of time and his account of ethics), but because Madhyamaka thought regards itself as a philosophical antidote against superimpositions of svabhāva wherever they arise. It is therefore by necessity more comprehensive than the arguments found in Nāgārjuna’s works. They provide examples of argumentative procedures and discussions of putative examples of svabhāva prominent amongst Nāgārjuna’s opponents. But the Madhyamaka project consists not just in the explanation and defense of these arguments (even though most of the positions Nāgārjuna argues against are of more than historical importance) but has to be continued in the debate with the defenders of svabhāva in the contemporary philosophical discussion. It is apparent that Madhyamaka philosophy is opposed to the brand of realism currently found in much of contemporary analytic philosophy (Michael Devitt (1997: 41) characterizes this succinctly as the claim that ‘most current common-sense and scientific physical existence statements are objectively and mind-independently (deflationary) true’). Things that exist in a mind-independent manner exist with svabhāva, even though they might be dependent in all other kinds of ways. (Even if everything out there depended on every other thing, as long as the entire network of dependence-relations was mind-independent it would exist with svabhāva). Of course the Mādhyamika’s talk of “mind-dependence” does not refer to dependence on any individual mind, as a solipsist would assume, but to collective dependence on all the minds there are. This view raises a variety of interesting questions that Madhyamaka philosophy has to address.
First of all there is the question of how to make sense of objects like Mt Everest depending on all our minds collectively. It is clear how we could say something like this about things existing merely by the force of convention, such as some objects traded on the stock market. But how could something like a mountain be merely conventionally existent?
Secondly, given the Madhyamaka rejection of a correspondence-theoretic account of truth, how can it come up with a theory of meaning and truth that is not committed to some sort of structural isomorphism between word and world but still gives us a robust account of what distinguishes true from false sentences?
Thirdly, if it is not facts out there that settle what is true how can the Mādhyamika avoid the unacceptable relativistic conclusion that we cannot criticize epistemic or ethical practices which differ from ours?
Fourthly, how can we make sense of an ontology without foundations in which there are no substantially existent objects on which everything else depends? (For an interesting formal model of such an ontology see Priest 2009, 2014. This question has obvious systematics connections with the current discussion of grounding.)
Many aspects of these questions have been addressed in vast body of commentarial literature that was written in the nearly two millennia since Nāgārjuna composed his key philosophical works. Other still remain to be addressed. (For some development of contemporary Madhyamaka ideas in relation to contemporary Western philosophy see Garfield 2015, Westerhoff 2020.) One of these is the question to which extent Madhyamaka thought is essentially linked to Buddhism. This is a question that has attracted more interest recently especially from researchers that study Madhyamaka primarily as a philosophical, rather than as a religious tradition. (For some interesting reflections on matter this see McGuire 2017). If we consider the lively status of Madhyamaka studies today it seems evident that the questions Nāgārjuna asked and the system of philosophy he founded in the second century remain very much alive in the twenty-first.
[NB. Of the many different translations of Nāgārjuna’s works this list gives those English versions (often accompanied by a traditional or modern commentary) that are particularly accessible to philosophers without specialized training in Indology.]
- Jay Garfield, The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way. Translation and Commentary of Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārikā, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
- Siderits, Mark and Shōryū Katsura: Nāgārjuna’s Middle Way. Mūlamadhyamakakārikā, Boston: Wisdom Publications, 2013.
- Jay Garfield, Geshe Ngawang Samten, Ocean of Reasoning. A Great Commentary on Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārikā by rJe Tshong Khapa, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
- Mabja Jangchub Tsöndrü, Ornament of Reason. The Great Commentary to Nāgārjuna’s Root of the Middle Way, Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion, 2011.
- Ian Coghlan, Buddhapālita’s Commentary on Nāgārjuna’s Middle Way: Buddhapālita-Mūlamadhyamaka-Vṛtti, Boston, Wisdom, 2022.
- Joseph Loizzo, Nāgārjuna’s Reason Sixty (Yuktiṣaṣṭikā) with Chandrakīrti’s Commentary, New York: American Institute of Buddhist Studies, 2007.
- Peter Della Santina, Causality and Emptiness: The Wisdom of Nāgārjuna, Singapore: Buddha Dharma Education Association, 2002. Includes a translation of the Śūnyatāsaptati. [Available online].
- Jan Westerhoff, The Dispeller of Disputes: Nāgārjuna’s Vigrahavyāvartanī, New York, Boston: American Institute of Buddhist Studies, Wisdom Publications, 2010.
- Fernando Tola and Carmen Dragonetti, Nāgārjuna’s Refutation of Logic (Vaidalyaprakaraṇa), Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1995.
- Jan Westerhoff, Crushing the Categories. Vaidalyaprakaraṇa by Nāgārjuna, New York, Boston: American Institute of Buddhist Studies, Wisdom Publications, 2018.
- Jeffrey Hopkins, Buddhist Advice for Living and Liberation: Nāgārjuna’s Precious Garland, Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion, 1998.
- Khensur Jampa Tegchok, Practical Ethics and Profound Emptiness. A Commentary on Nāgārjuna’s Precious Garland, Boston: Wisdom, 2017.
- Christian Lindtner: Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nāgārjuna, Copenhagen: Akademisk Forlag, 1982.
- Ames, William, 1982. “The notion of svabhāva in the thought of Candrakīrti”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 10: 161–177.
- Burton, David, 1999. Emptiness Appraised: A Critical Study of Nāgārjuna’s Philosophy, Richmond: Curzon.
- Devitt, Michael, 1997. Realism and Truth, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, second edition.
- Garfield, Jay, 1994. “Dependent co-origination and the emptiness of emptiness: why did Nāgārjuna begin with causation?”, Philosophy East and West, 44: 219–250.
- –––, 2001. “Nāgārjuna’s theory of causation: implications sacred and profane”, Philosophy East and West, 51(4): 507–524.
- –––, 2015. Engaging Buddhism. Why It Matters to Philosophy, Oxford University Press: New York.
- Goodman, Charles, 2004. “The Treasury of Metaphysics and the Physical World”, Philosophical Quarterly, 54 (216): 389–401.
- Huntington, C.W., 1989. The Emptiness of Emptiness. A Study of Early Indian Mādhyamika, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
- Lindtner, Christian, 1982. Nagarjuniana. Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nāgārjuna, Copenhagen: Akademisk Forlag.
- Mabbett, Ian, 1998. “The problem of the historical Nagarjuna revisited”, Journal of the American Oriental Society, 118(3): 332–346.
- McGuire, Robert, 2017. “An all-new timeless truth”, Contemporary Buddhism, 18(2): 385–401.
- Oetke, Claus, 2003. “Some remarks on theses and philosophical positions in early Madhyamaka”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 31: 449–478.
- –––, 1989. “Rationalismus und Mystik in der Philosophie Nāgārjunas”, Studien zur Indologie und Iranistik, 15: 1–39.
- Priest, Graham, 2009. The structure of emptiness, Philosophy East and West, 59(4): 467–480
- –––, 2014. One, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Priest, Graham and Jay Garfield, 2002. “Nāgārjuna and the limits of thought”, in Beyond the Limits of Thought, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 249–270.
- Ruegg, David Seyfort, 1977. “The use of the four positions of the catuṣkoṭi and the problem of the description of reality in Mahāyāna Buddhism”. Journal of Indian Philosophy, 5: 1–171.
- –––, 1981. The Literature of the Madhyamaka School of Philosophy in India, Wiesbaden: Harassowitz.
- –––, 1986. “Does the Mādhyamika have a thesis and philosophical position?”, in Bimal Krishna Matilal (ed.), Buddhist Logic and Epistemology, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 229–237.
- Siderits, Mark, 2004. “Causation and emptiness in early Madhyamika”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 32: 393–419.
- –––, 2003. Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy, Aldershot: Ashgate.
- –––, 2000. “Nyāya realism, Buddhist critique”, in Bina Gupta (ed.), The Empirical and the Transcendental, Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield, 219–231.
- –––, 1989. “Thinking on empty: Madhyamaka anti-realism and canons of rationality”, in Shlomo Biderman and Ben-Ami Scharfenstein (eds.), Rationality in Question, Leiden: E.J. Brill, pp. 231–249.
- –––, 1980. “The Madhyamaka critique of epistemology”. Journal of Indian Philosophy, 8: 307–335.
- –––, 2014. “Causation, ‘Humean’ causation and emptiness”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 42: 433–449.
- –––, 2016. Studies in Buddhist Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2022. How Things Are. An Introduction to Buddhist Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Siderits, Mark and J. Dervin O’Brien, 1976. “Zeno and Nāgārjuna on Motion”, Philosophy East and West, 26(3): 281–299.
- Jonathan Stoltz, 2021: Illuminating the Mind. An Introduction to Buddhist Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Spackman, John, 2014. Between nihilism and anti-essentialism: a conceptualist interpretation of Nāgārjuna, Philosophy East and West, 61(1): 151–173.
- Tillemans, Tom, 2001. “Trying to be fair to Mādhyamika Buddhism”, The Numata Yehan Lecture in Buddhism, University of Calgary, Canada.
- –––, 2003. “Metaphysics for Mādhyamikas”, in Georges Dreyfus and Sara McClintock (eds.), The Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Distinction: What Difference does a Difference make?, Boston: Wisdom, pp. 93–123.
- Tuck, Andrew P., 1990. Comparative Philosophy and the Philosophy of Scholarship: on the Western Interpretation of Nāgārjuna, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Walser, Joseph, 2005. Nāgārjuna in Context. Mahāyāna Buddhism and Early Indian Culture, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Westerhoff, Jan, 2009. Nāgārjuna’s Madhyamaka. A Philosophical Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2016: “On the nihilist interpretation of Madhyamaka”. Journal of Indian Philosophy, 44: 337–376.
- –––, 2017: “Nāgārjuna on emptiness: a comprehensive critique of foundationalism”, in Jonardon Ganeri (ed.): The Oxford Handbook of Indian Philosophy, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
- –––, 2020: The Non-Existence of the Real World, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2021: “An argument for ontological nihilism”. Inquiry, doi.org/10.1080/0020174X.2021.1934268
- Wood, Thomas E., 1994. Nāgārjunian Disputations. A Philosophical Journey through an Indian Looking-glass, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
- Ye, Shaoyong, 2011. Mūlamadhyamakakārikā, Research Institute of Sanskrit Manuscripts & Buddhist Literature, Beijing.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies. This is an excellent online bibliography of Indian Philosophy. The section on Madhyamaka is in part IV.
- Further bibliographical information on Nāgārjuna’s works, including references to secondary literature can be found at panditproject.org.
- A multi-lingual presentation (including English translations) of some of Nāgārjuna’s works can be found in the Thesaurus Litteraturae Buddhicae.
- For those interested to learn how Nāgārjuna’s main work sounds in Sanskrit, bodhisvara.com gives a recording of a recitation of the entire text.
The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) for notifying us about several typographical errors in this entry.