Notes to Natural Properties

1. As Lewis (1986b, 61) puts it: “A property is natural or unnatural simpliciter, not relative to one or another world”. Cameron (2010) is, unusually, open to its being contingent which properties are more natural than which.

2. This is not to say that there will be no work for philosophers to do: even with a “final theory” in hand, it may be far from obvious how to use it to settle questions about perfect naturalness.

3. The decision which methods of constructing complex predicates to allow may make a significant difference to the final ranking.

4. Sider (2011, §7.11.1), by contrast, is optimistic about the finite definability of the properties we are interested in, although he also suggests that an adequate account of relative naturalness will need to appeal to other factors besides length of definition. It is worth noting that many of the other factors he considers, such as whether a property “figures into simple and strong generalizations”, will apparently make it a contingent matter whether one property is more or less natural than another.

5. A terminological complexity in this domain is that philosophers sometimes adopt policies of using certain grammatically singular words as a shorthand for saying things that are officially to be cashed out using plurals. The words ‘plurality’ and ‘collection’ often play this role: for example, ‘Some pluralities are more natural than the plurality of dogs’ would be a shorthand for ‘There are some things that are more natural than the dogs’. Lewis uses ‘class’ in this way in some of his works (Lewis 1986b, 51, n. 37), although not in others (Lewis 1991).

6. Jenkins 2013 (100–103) defends the intelligibility of naturalness for propositions, and explores its potential relevance to epistemology.

7. In a standard higher-order setting, variable-binders make complex predicates: \((λv_1\ldots v_n.φ)\) is an expression of type \(⟨α_1,\ldots ,α_n⟩\) when \(φ\) is a sentence and \(v_1,\ldots,v_n\) are variables of types \(α_1,\ldots ,α_n\). The letter lambda here is just a piece of punctuation, not an expression of some type.

8. Sider suggests an alternative formalism where “dummy variables” of different syntactic types are deployed so that the argument of ‘structural’ is always grammatically a sentence. For example, instead of ‘Structural(and)’, one would write ‘Structural(\(\mathsf{p}\) and \(\mathsf{q}\))’, where ‘\(\mathsf{p}\)’ and ‘\(\mathsf{q}\)’ are dummy sentential variables. One can then, interestingly, formulate claims where the argument of Structural is built entirely from dummy variables, like ‘Structural(\(\mathsf{F} \mathsf{a}\))’ and ‘Structural(\(\mathsf{p}\))’.

9. In fact, Weatherson’s main conclusion is that some quantities are fundamental: he also argues that fundamentality (which he equates with ungroundedness) is distinct from perfect naturalness (which he defines in terms of the grounding of similarity facts).

10. Rodriguez-Pereyra also needs to allow the arguments of his resemblance predicate to be sets, and to appeal to Lewis-style modal-realism (see Dorr 2005). Paseau (2012) develops a similar view, without the numerical primitive. Lewis (1983, n. 9) contemplates analysing perfect naturalness in terms of a “contrastive and variably polyadic” resemblance-theoretic predicate, which one class (or plurality) bears to another just in case some perfectly natural property is instantiated by every member of the former and no member of the latter.

11. Oddie (2005), inspired by Gärdenfors (2000), proposes that a predicate “stands for a property” just in case it corresponds to a convex region in a “quality space” in which distances correspond to degrees of dissimilarity.

12. Lewis (2001) adopts a model in which two gradable factors detract from a property’s degree of naturalness: “spread” (“the maximum dissimilarity distance between instances”) and “scatter” (“the way non-instances are interspersed with instances”). He denies however that this constitutes the ‘whole story about naturalness’.

13. A variant of this definition sums the degrees of naturalness of all the classes that contain exactly one of \(x\) and \(y\). This may give different results, unless we identify a class’s degree of naturalness with the sum of the degrees of naturalness of all the properties whose extension it is.

14. However it is not hopeless. The simplicity-of-definition criterion for relative naturalness suggests that that, so long as there are only countably many instantiated perfectly natural properties, all but countably many of the instantiated properties have infinite complexity. If these are given a score of 0, one could score the remainder in such a way that the relevant sums converge.

15. Note however that actual-world physics provides some reason to deny that determinate mass-properties are equally natural, since a unique choice of units (the “Planck units”) for mass (along with length and duration) is determined by requiring the speed of light, Newton’s gravitational constant, and Planck’s constant all to be 1.

16. If being part of is perfectly natural, reflexive, and antisymmetric, we must have \(f(x)=y\) whenever \(f\) witnesses the existential quantification in Duplication: \(x\) is the one and only part of \(x\) with every part of \(x\) as a part, so \(f(x)\) must be a part of \(y\) with every part of \(y\) as a part, hence identical to \(y\). (For more on reflexivity and antisymmetry, see the entry on mereology). Bricker (1996) and Eddon (2007) argue that parthood (and kindred mereological relations) should not be counted as perfectly natural: however, in this setting there is pressure to add a clause to Duplication explicitly requiring \(f\) to preserve parthood, as Bricker (1996) in fact does. (As Schwarz (2014) notes, ‘being part of’ occurs alongside ‘grue’ on Lewis’s list illustrating how Armstrong’s theory does not posit universals corresponding to arbitrary predicates (Lewis 1983, 345); given his enthusiasm about this aspect of Armstrong’s view, this provides some reason to think that Lewis would agree with Bricker and Eddon that parthood (and identity) are not perfectly natural.)

17. Note that Lewis accepted both definitions.

18. As explained in note 16, this will follow if parthood is perfectly natural, reflexive, and antisymmetric. Those who deny this might well want to modify Duplication by adding \(`f(x) = y\rsquo\) as an extra conjunct on the right hand side; the claim that duplicate objects have the same perfectly natural properties follows immediately from this revised version.

19. The former thought is a natural way of cashing out the view that “space-time points are properties”, defended by Teller (1987), and discussed (under the name ‘Monadicism’) by Field (1984). Weatherson (2006) draws out the counterintuitive results of counting specific vector properties as perfectly natural in applying Duplication, e.g. that oppositely oriented magnets cannot be duplicates. For one response see Marshall 2016 (n. 21).

20. Taken literally, Cross-world Duplication will be unacceptable to those who hold there could be new objects, distinct from everything there actually is. Consider an object \(x\) with three parts. For \(x\) as is at the actual world to be a duplicate of \(y\) as it is at \(w\), \(y\) must have three parts at \(w\), but that does not mean that there are three things that are part of \(y\) at \(w\). Providing a non-face-value interpretation of quantification over “mere possibilia” that avoids this issue is a challenging task: see Fine (2003), Williamson (2013), Fritz and Goodman (2017).

21. Marshall (2012) considers a fix where the function \(f\) in Cross-world Duplication is required to be the identity function on its domain. However (as Marshall points out) given the necessity of distinctness, this definition counts properties like not being identical to Obama as intrinsic, which may be unwelcome.

22. Plate (2018) develops an analysis of intrinsicality using the resources of a fine-grained theory of properties.

23. Duplication is subject to the same worry when applied to objects whose parts do not form a set, if there are such things.

24. Alternatively, one could understand ‘object’ to exclude sets, and define an extended notion of “mapping” whereby each function from objects to objects counts as “mapping” any set to the set of things to which it maps its members. This technique may also help with a related worry, which arises if properties are not counted as “objects”, or if property-talk is understood as a surrogate for higher-order quantification. For example, if contemplation is a perfectly natural relation between objects and properties and loving is a perfectly natural relation between objects, an adequate definition of qualitative indiscernibility should presumably imply that if \(x\) and \(y\) are qualitatively indiscernible and \(x\) is contemplating loving \(x\), \(y\) is contemplating loving \(y\).

25. This may be the only suggestion that Lewis takes there to be a minimum as well as a maximum degree of naturalness.

26. Given the world-relativised relation, we can say that \(F\) is qualitative if and only if whenever \(x\) as it is at \(w\) is qualitatively indiscernible from \(y\) as it is at \(w'\), \(x\) is \(F\) at \(w\) just in case \(y\) is \(F\) at \(w'\).

27. It is also true however that some fine-grained theories of properties suggest analyses of qualitativeness which require no mention of naturalness. For example, Khamara (1988) and Dorr (2016) suggest that a monadic property \(F\) is qualitative just in case there there is no object \(x\) and binary relation \(R\) such that \(F\) is the property of bearing \(R\) to \(x\).

28. Depending on our view about the issues discussed in note 20, we might be able to get away with restricting the domain of \(f\) to the set of things that exist at the world \(w_1\). The result will be a claim of strong global supervenience, if we extend the standard definition of that notion in the obvious way to allow for sets containing both monadic and polyadic properties (see the entry on supervenience).

29. However the case is not so simple, as Dasgupta also suggests that there may be different senses of ‘possible’ in play, and for the relevant sense adopts a non-standard account (inspired by Lewis’s counterpart theory) of the relation between claims about possibility and necessity and claims about possible worlds.

30. In the posthumously published Lewis 2009 (note 3), Lewis seems to change his mind about TSB. Influenced by an influential argument of Armstrong’s (Armstrong 1978, 67–8), Lewis takes “an infinitely complex world of ‘structures all the way down’…to be a genuine possibility, though a far-fetched one… [I]n such a world no perfectly fundamental properties are instantiated, but only near-enough fundamental properties.” TSB as stated would entail that any two such worlds which agree as regards what things there are agree about everything. In response, Lewis suggests revising TSB in such a way that the relevant properties are not just the perfectly natural ones, but also the “near-enough fundamental’ properties that are instantiated in infinitely complex worlds. Other principles, such as Duplication and Indiscernibility would require similar revision. This seems like a major shift from Lewis’s usual picture. (As Lewis (1986a, 30) remarks, concerning the related argument from the possibility of infinitely complex worlds to the existence of “structural” universals: “It is unseemly that so far-fetched a possibility, as I take it to be, should do so much to constrain our theory of the constitution of this world.”) Schaffer (2003) argues that we have good (though not conclusive) reason to take the actual world to be infinitely complex in the relevant way. Williams (2007b) argues that the kind of “infinite complexity” in whose possibility there is good reason to believe is compatible with there being many instantiated perfectly natural properties, with contingent laws of nature providing for each such property a necessary and sufficient condition involving the perfectly natural properties of and relations among an object’s parts.

31. Necessitism, the view that necessarily everything is identical to something (Williamson 2013) makes clause (b) redundant, and also makes clause (c) redundant when combined with the view that metaphysical necessity obeys an S5 modal logic. Contingentists (opponents of necessitism) have reason to prefer the present modal formulation of TSB to the previous formulation in terms of possible worlds, which will require some non-literal interpretation (of the sort mentioned in note 20) in order to avoid bizarre results when applied to possible worlds at which there are new things beyond those there in fact are.

32. It is not entirely clear that Lewis was committed to either of these minimality claims. Each rules out the claim that the conjunction of two perfectly natural properties is itself perfectly natural. But Lewis was in fact initially open to a package combining the analysis of perfect naturalness as “correspondence to a universal” with a theory positing conjunctions of universals, and as a result, he explicitly declines to rule out perfectly natural properties that are conjunctions of others (Lewis 1983, 364). To render Minimality consistent with this option, we could replace ‘distinct from \(R\)’ with ‘sharing no perfectly natural conjuncts with \(R\)’. Later, however, Lewis (2009, 204) affirms that perfectly natural properties are “not conjunctive or structural”.

33. Dorr uses the word ‘fundamental’ rather than ‘perfectly natural’, and Plate uses ‘logically simple’. Moreover Plate seems to regard the claim that negations of perfectly natural properties are not perfectly natural as somehow built into the concept of perfect naturalness, which he takes to be distinct from and more obscure than that of logical simplicity. He suggests that we should either simply stop talking about perfect naturalness, or attempt to analyse it as the conjunction of logical simplicity and some difficult notion of “positiveness“.

34. Similarly, Schaffer (2004) defends a view on which predicates of scientific theories at all levels denote what he calls “sparse properties”, rejecting the idea that there is any metaphysically interesting status that predicates of physics have that predicates of biology lack: one of his reasons is the view that the world may be infinitely complex in such a way that there is no “fundamental level” (Schaffer 2003). Wilson (2012) argues that the perfectly natural properties include both determinables and determinates (e.g. being red and being scarlet) despite the supervenience of the former on the latter.

35. Efird and Stoneham (2008) explore several possible precisifications of Lewis’s recombination principle.

36. A source for combinatorialism is Armstrong 1989, although Armstrong’s own version of the view requires making exceptions for some special universals, such as a nomic “necessitation” relation that can only be instantiated by universals \(F\) and \(G\) when everything that instantiates \(F\) instantiates \(G\).

37. For ways in which the idea that “any pattern of instantiation of any fundamental properties and relations is metaphysically possible” might be formulated using tools from model theory, and some potential conflicts formulations of this idea and formulations of the “cut-and-paste“ idea behind the principle of recombination, see Hawthorne and Russell 2018. Bacon (forthcoming: see Other Internet Resources) develops a form of combinatorialism that is in one way stronger and in another way weaker than the view just discussed. It is weaker in that it concerns a notion of possibility that Bacon takes to be more permissive than metaphysical possibility (Bacon 2018). It is stronger in that the patterns which perfectly natural (“fundamental”) properties can realise aren’t just a matter of their extensions: for example, if there are two fundamental binary relations \(R\) and \(S\), then it is (broadly) possible for \(R\) to be the converse of \(S\) (i.e. to be identical to \(\lambda xy.S(y,x)\)). Since the proposition that \(R\) is the converse of \(S\) cannot be true without being (broadly) necessary, Bacon’s combinatorialism involves a failure of the principle that whatever is (broadly) possibly necessary is true.

38. Lewis often seems to take for granted that some such “fully determinate” properties are perfectly natural: e.g. he characterises the perfectly natural properties as “highly specific” (Lewis 1986b, 60) and “not at all…determinable” (Lewis 2009, 204). Moreover, his doctrine of “Humean Supervenience” seems to rule out the hypothesis that any of (iii)–(viii) are perfectly natural, since it says that the only actually instantiated perfectly natural properties are monadic properties of points or other point-sized objects, and spatiotemporal distance relations (presumably binary). (See the introduction to Lewis 1986c and §5 of the entry on David Lewis.) Hawthorne (2006) argues that Lewis’s commitments here lead to some dilemmas, best resolved either by admitting some polyadic perfectly natural mass-theoretic relations such as those in (vi), or sticking with (i) while giving up on the “simplicity of definition” criterion of relative naturalness. (See also Dorr and Hawthorne 2013, §3.4.) Nanay (2014) argues that Lewis needs to hold that only “super-determinate” properties are perfectly natural, but that it is possible that the world is infinitely complex in such a way that there are no super-determinate properties, and concludes that we should “dispose of the natural/unnatural distinction” altogether: he does not however consider options such as (iii)–(viii).

39. In the terminology of Dasgupta (2013), views on which properties in families (i)–(iii) are perfectly natural would be classed as “absolutist”, while views on which properties in families (iv)–(viii) are perfectly natural are “comparativist”. Note however that Dasgupta defines these labels in terms of the fundamentality of facts as opposed to properties.

40. Wang (2013) uses the incompatibility of determinate masses and related considerations of this kind to argue against combinatorialism. By contrast, other authors appeal to combinatorialism to argue for certain surprising possibility claims: e.g. Saucedo (2011) uses combinatorialism to argue that it is possible for an object’s location to be disjoint from that of one of its parts, and McDaniel (2007) uses a more restricted combinatorialist premise to argue that mereologically simple objects could be spatially extended. For an example of combinatorialism being used together with premises about modality to argue against claims of naturalness, see Dorr 2004 (substituting ‘perfectly natural’ for ‘primitive’.)

41. Or at least necessarily equivalent to a perfectly natural property. A very fine-grained theory of properties might distinguish the property instantiating \(u_1\) and instantiating \(u_2\) from the necessarily coextensive property instantiating \(u_3\), where \(u_3\) is the conjunction of \(u_1\) and \(u_2\).

42. For similar reasons, Sider (1995) suggests that the friend of universals should identify the perfectly natural properties with those corresponding to non-conjunctive, non-structural universals. As we saw in note 32, Lewis was initially open to the view that conjunctions of perfectly natural properties are perfectly natural, though he seems to have changed his mind about this later.

43. This is slightly simplified. Lewis also requires that the proposition that \(P\) is a regularity, which plausibly amounts being qualitative. A slight variant theory counts a proposition as a law of nature just in case it belongs to some best system (and is a regularity); these views diverge only in the very special case where several systems are exactly tied for first place. In the literature, “systems” are often identified with sets of interpreted sentences rather than sets of propositions.

44. Naturalness may also help for the task of finding an appropriate measure of strength, but Lewis says less about this.

45. On Lewis’s view lawhood (for regularities) is closed under necessitation: if it is a law that nothing goes faster than light, it is a law that no banana goes faster than light. Some would prefer a more discriminating conception of lawhood where the latter proposition does not count as a law. A “best system” analysis of lawhood suited to this conception could identify laws with the propositions expressed by the axioms of some maximally simple axiomatisation of the best system.

46. Note that in much of the literature on laws of nature, laws of nature are taken to be interpreted sentences (perhaps in some language that no-one actually speaks) rather than propositions. This allows for a simple identification of “figuring in” with “being expressed by one of the constituent words of”, but raises many problems. Lawhood for sentence cries out for explanation far more obviously than lawhood for propositions; and it is hard to imagine an explanation that allows a sentence that is a law to express the same proposition as a sentence that is not a law but does not invoke the concept of naturalness, or something like it.

47. Hicks and Schaffer consider the suggestion that it is \(F = m\frac{dv}{dt}\) rather than \(F=ma\) that is the basic law, but regard this as a piece of revisionary metaphysics, at odds with scientific practice. They argue that acceleration is not perfectly natural on the grounds that it is “defined”: §4.10 below will consider some principles that might vindicate that inference.

48. Some authors, e.g. Weatherson (2003a; but not 2003b) and Cameron (2010), work with a variant of the toy theory in which “use” is treated as lexically prior to “eligibility”, so that the role of “eligibility” is merely to narrow down the class of interpretations not disqualified by “use”. But this version of the theory is subject to the same objection as the “use only” theory that Lewis attributes to Putnam, namely that it incorrectly rules out the possibility of an entire population being systematically and robustly mistaken.

49. See Schwarz 2014 for more on the deficiencies of this toy theory (which Schwarz calls “magnetism”, the reasons for taking Lewis not to have endorsed it, and his dialectical reasons for discussing it.

50. Lewis’s reasons for taking the domains of credence and value functions to consist of properties rather than propositions are explained in 1979. But the overall shape of the theory would be the same either way.

51. Dorr and Hawthorne (2013) suggest a revision where the “best system” competition takes place once per “species” or “kind”. Scores are assigned not to particular \(⟨C,V⟩\) pairs, but to relations that map between members of the species to such pairs. The “fit” score of such a relation is a matter of how strongly members of the species are disposed to perform actions that maximise the expected value of the \(V\)-function they are related to in the \(C\)-function they are related to, while its ‘eligibility’ score is simply a matter of how natural it (the relation) is. For an individual thinker \(a\) to have credence function \(C\) and value function \(V\) is for \(a\) to be mapped to \(\langle C,V\rangle\) by the relation that achieves the optimal balance for \(a\)’s species. This modification of the view does without Lewis’s invocation of the concept of evidence: one’s \(C\)-function is supposed to be one’s actual credence function, not one’s hypothetical prior credence function.

52. As Schwarz (2014, 26) points out, Lewis (1992) does not use the word ‘natural’, but speaks instead of “the bent-straight distinction”. But given the context and Lewis’s citation of his 1983 paper, it is clear that “the bent-straight distinction” is meant to be either identified with or explained in terms of the natural-unnatural distinction. Schwarz’s assertion (2014, 21) that “objective naturalness plays essentially no role in Lewis’s theory of language” thus seems seriously overstated, although there is a case to be made that its role there is less central than its role in his theory of mind (the first stage).

53. The final package seems, however, less apt than the toy theory to support proposals, like that of Weatherson (2003b), where we are systematically mistaken in applying some word because some natural meaning in the vicinity wins out overall despite a relatively low “use” score: see Schwarz 2014, §7.

54. For a battery of arguments against the general program of deriving linguistic content from mental content, see Schiffer 1989.

55. Without such supervenience, it is doubtful whether the physical notion of chance even applies to propositions about mental and semantic matters. For some arguments against the supervenience of the mental/semantic on the physical which might even extend to nomic supervenience, see Kearns and Magidor (2012).

56. Other related contrasts include a normative contrast (after making such observations, one ought to become confident that all emeralds are green, and ought not to become confident that all emeralds are grue), and a knowledge-theoretic contrast (if in fact all emeralds are green, one could come to know that this is the case just by coming to believe it on the basis of these observations, whereas if in fact all emeralds are grue, one could not come to know this just by coming to believe it on the basis of such observations.) Goodman himself focuses on a contrast described in terms of “confirmation”: the observations in question would confirm the hypothesis that all emeralds are green but not the hypothesis that all emeralds are grue. It is hard to say whether this is supposed to be an evaluative claim like the rationality-theoretic contrast, or merely a sociological claim about the inferences people would in fact draw.

57. Jenkins (2013) considers the related idea that more natural propositions are ipso facto “better justified”, ceteris paribus, than less natural ones. A worry about this (which Jenkins attributes to Aidan McGlynn) stems from the combination of the following plausible thoughts: (i) when \(p\) is more natural than \(q\), the negation of \(p\) is more natural than the negation of \(q\); (ii) when \(p\) is better justified than \(q\), the negation of \(p\) is worse justified than the negation of \(q\). Unless we can fill in the “ceteris paribus” clause more informatively, this leaves it unclear how considerations of naturalness are supposed to be relevant to degrees of justification. A similar issue arises for attempts to relate naturalness to the notion of “goodness” used in theories of inference to the best explanation. It might prompt a less straightforward account of the relation between simplicity and naturalness, on which a proposition and its negation can differ greatly in simplicity without differing much in naturalness. Alternatively, we could assign the job of distinguishing propositions from their negations to some “theoretical virtue” other than simplicity, perhaps along the lines of “specificity” or “strength”. (Naturalness might have a further role to play in the theory of this other factor.)

58. This will require extending the notion of naturalness from propositions to functions mapping propositions to real numbers; this should not be problematic if one is willing to apply ‘natural’ both to propositions and to mathematical entities.

59. Hirsch (1993) provides a searching and ultimately pessimistic investigation of attempts to justify such value-judgments.

60. It will not help to deny the transitivity of partial definability: trivialisation also results if every binary relation is connected to itself by two steps of partial definability.

61. Note that (8) follows from the combination of (5) and (6): Suppose \(p\) is partly definable from \(q\) and \(p\) is perfectly natural. Suppose further that \(q\) is partly definable from \(r\). Then \(p\) is partly definable from \(r\) by transitivity, so \(r\) is partly definable from \(p\) by (5) and the fact that \(p\) is perfectly natural, and so by transitivity again, \(r\) is partly definable from \(q\). Generalising, everything from which \(q\) is partly definable is partly definable from \(q\); so by (6), \(q\) is perfectly natural. It is also worth noting that on the assumption that every relation is identical to the converse of its converse and partially definable from its converse, (8) entails that the converse of a perfectly natural relation is itself perfectly natural, making trouble for certain ‘minimality’ theses as discussed in §4.4

62. This claim also follows from the weaker doctrine of “Booleanism” (Dorr 2016, §7), according to which properties form a Boolean algebra (see the entry on the mathematics of boolean algebra, section 1) with respect to the operations of negation, conjunction, and disjunction. Bacon (2018) endorses Booleanism but rejects intensionalism.

63. A subtler worry about (5) and (6) arises in Dorr’s theory. On that theory, every property is partially definable from a higher-order instantiation relation (\(λXy.X(y)\)), since it is the result of saturating one of argument of that relation with itself: for example, being charged is identical to instantiating charge: \[\operatorname{Charged} = \lambda\,x.(\lambda\,Xy.X(y))(\operatorname{Charged},x). \] Since the only properties from which the instantiation relation is partially definable are other “logical” properties of a similar sort, the upshot is that these are the only properties that are not strictly partially defined from any properties. To address this worry, Dorr suggests, in effect, modifying (5) and (6) by restricting the variable \(q\) to “non-logical” (or “impure”) properties.

64. ‘And some objects’ is added on the assumption that loving Socrates is fully definable from loving and Socrates, but only partly definable from loving. Perhaps we should strengthen this to ‘…and some perfectly natural objects’, if we take the notion of perfect naturalness to apply to objects as well as properties.

65. Even if they can make sense of full definability, those who have been treating talk of properties as shorthand for higher-order quantification will have trouble with the type-neutral generalisation in ‘some perfectly natural properties’. However, even those in this position should be able to make sense of strengthenings of Definability where the defining perfectly natural properties are required to belong to some finite collection of types, and perhaps too of the infinite disjunction of all these strengthenings.

66. See Fine 2012 (53–4) for some alternative ways of thinking of partial ground.

67. Similarly, if we identify the fact that \(R(x,y)\) with the fact that \(x\) has the property bearing \(R\) to \(y,\) (5) will have the even more bizarre consequence that when \(R(x,y)\) is ungrounded, not only \(R\) but bearing \(R\) to \(y\) is perfectly natural. However, we might try to avoid this particular bad result by restricting (5) to qualitative properties.

68. Bricker (2006, 271) is optimistic about defining “ontological determination” (a notion he takes to be expressed by ‘in virtue of’) using modality together with naturalness, but he only suggests a sufficient condition: a proposition is ontologically determined by a class of propositions whenever it supervenes on that class, and every proposition in the class is the predication of a perfectly natural property. McDaniel (2017a, ch. 8) proposes that grounding is either identical to the more real than relation (which he takes to be necessarily coextensive with more natural than), or a disjunction in which each disjunct is the conjunction of more real than with some other relation, suggesting that entailment (metaphysical necessitatation) might be one of those other relations.

69. This reason for dissatisfaction applies even more strongly to formulas like “Metaphysically speaking, all [properties] are equal” (Nanay 2014). If we affirm or deny that certain things are “equal” we naturally invite the clarificatory question “Equal in what respect?”. It is quite unclear how “metaphysically equal” could be a helpful answer to that question, unless it is just synonymous with “equally natural”.

70. For the notion of vagueness at work here, see the entry on vagueness. Lewis does not explicitly address the question of vagueness but is most naturally interpreted as holding that ‘perfectly natural’ is precise while ‘more natural than’ is somewhat vague. On standard ways of developing the connection between naturalness and reference, one would expect that insofar as we can refer to a perfectly natural property at all we are normally in a position to do so precisely; those who agree with Sider (2011) that perfect naturalness is perfectly natural (“structure is structural”) will then likely think that precision for ‘perfectly natural’ is at least within our reach. Sud (2018), however, while defending a view on which ‘perfectly natural’ is irremediably vague, rejects the argument from this view to the claim that perfect naturalness is not perfectly natural.

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