Towards the end of his life, Aimé Césaire has declared that the question he and his friend Léopold Sédar Senghor came to raise after they first met was: “Who am I? Who are we? What are we in this white world?” And he commented: “That’s quite a problem” (Césaire 2005, 23). “Who am I?” is a question Descartes posed, and a reader of the French philosopher naturally understands such a question to be universal, and the subject who says “I” here to stand for any human being. But when “who am I?” has to be translated as “who are we?” everything changes especially when the “we” have to define themselves against a world which leaves no room for who and what they are because they are black folks in a world where “universal” seems to naturally mean “white”.
“Négritude”, or the self-affirmation of black peoples, or the affirmation of the values of civilization of something defined as “the black world” as an answer to the question “what are we in this white world?” is indeed “quite a problem”: it poses many questions that will be examined here through the following headings:
- 1. The genesis of the concept
- 2. Négritude as revolt / Négritude as philosophy
- 3. Manifestos for Négritude
- 4. The inescapable disappearance of Eurydice
- 5. Négritude as ontology
- 6. Négritude as aesthetics
- 7. Négritude as epistemology
- 8. Négritude as politics
- 9. Négritude beyond Négritude
- Academic Tools
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The concept of Négritude emerged as the expression of a revolt against the historical situation of French colonialism and racism. The particular form taken by that revolt was the product of the encounter, in Paris, in the late 1920s, of three black students coming from different French colonies: Aimé Césaire (1913–2008) from Martinique, Léon Gontran Damas (1912–1978) from Guiana and Léopold Sédar Senghor (1906–2001) from Senegal. Being colonial subjects meant that they all belonged to people considered uncivilized, naturally in need of education and guidance from Europe, namely France. In addition, the memory of slavery was very vivid in Guiana and Martinique. Aimé Césaire and Léon Damas were already friends before they came to Paris in 1931. They were classmates in Fort-de-France, Martinique, where they both graduated from Victor Schoelcher High School. Damas came to Paris to study Law while Césaire had been accepted at Lycée Louis Le Grand to study for the highly selective test for admission to the prestigious École Normale Supérieure on rue d’Ulm. Upon his arrival at the Lycée on the first day of classes he met Senghor who had already been a student at Louis le Grand for three years.
Césaire has described his first encounter with Senghor as friendship at first sight which would last for the rest of their fairly long lives. He has also added that their personal friendship meant the encounter between Africa and the African Diaspora. Césaire, Damas and Senghor had individual lived experiences of their feeling of revolt against a world of racism and colonial domination. In the case of Césaire that feeling was expressed in his detestation of Martinique which, as he confessed in an interview with French author Françoise Vergès, he was happy to leave after high school: he hated the “colored petit-bourgeois” of the island because of their “fundamental tendency to ape Europe” (Césaire 2005, 19). As for Senghor, he has written that in his revolt against his teachers at College Libermann high school in Dakar, he had discovered “négritude” before having the concept: he refused to accept their claim that through their education they were building Christianity and civilization in his soul where there was nothing but paganism and barbarism before. Now their encounter as people of African descent regardless of where they were from would lead to the transformation of their individual feelings of revolt into a concept that would also unify all Black people and overcome the separation created by slavery but also by the prejudices born out of the different paths taken. Césaire has often evoked the embarrassment felt by people from the Caribbean at the idea of being associated with Africans as they shared Europe’s ideas that they were now living in the lands of the civilized. He quotes as an example a “snobbish” young Antillean who came to him protesting that he talked too much about Africa, claiming that they had nothing in common with that continent and its peoples: “they are savages, we are different” (Césaire 2005, 28).
Beyond the encounter between Africa and the French Caribbean Césaire, Senghor and Damas also discovered together the American movement of Harlem Renaissance. At the “salon”, in Paris, hosted by sisters from Martinique, Jane, Paulette and Andrée Nardal, they met many Black American writers, such as Langston Hughes or Claude McKay. With the writers of the Harlem Renaissance movement they found an expression of black pride, a consciousness of a culture, an affirmation of a distinct identity that was in sharp contrast to French assimilationism. In a word they were ready to proclaim the négritude of the “new Negro” to quote the title of the anthology of Harlem writers by Alain Locke which very much impressed Senghor and his friends (Vaillant 1990, 93–94).
An important precision needs to be made here about the space created by the Nardal sisters for Negritude. Thus, T. Deanan Sharpley-Whiting calls attention to the fact that a “masculinist genealogy constructed by the poets and shored up by literary historians, critics, and Africanist philosophers continues to elide and minimize the presence and contributions of black women, namely their francophone counterparts, to the movement’s evolution” (Sharpley-Whiting, 2000, 10). And she quotes a letter from Paulette Nardal, written in 1960, in which she “‘bitterly complained’ of the erasure of her and Jane Nardal’s roles in the promulgation of the ideas that would later become the hallmarks of Césaire, Damas, and Senghor” (Sharpley-Whiting, 2000, 10). It must be recalled, in particular, concerning the “genealogy” of the movement, that an article by Jane Nardal, entitled “Internationalisme noir”, published in 1928, predated by more than ten years the first important theoretical article published by Senghor: “What the Black Man Contributes” (published in 1939). What Jane Nardal says in her short article about a “Negro sprit” transcending the differences inevitably created by the course of history, about the importance of “turning back toward Africa (…) in remembering a common origin”, or about the significance, first and foremost for the Africans themselves, of the discovery by Europeans (first the “snobs and artists” among them) of “Negro art” and, more generally, “the centers of African civilizations, their religious systems, their forms of government, their artistic wealth” (Nardal, 2002, 105–107), are all notions and themes that will be developed by Senghor, Césaire, and Damas.
Conventionally, the founding moment of the Negritude movement was the creation, in 1934–1935, of the journal L’Etudiant noir (The Black Student), to take the place of another periodical, L’Etudiant martiniquais (The Martiniquan Student), a move from the consideration of a regional origin to the affirmation of the call made by Jane Nardal for a “black internationalism”. That is when Aimé Césaire coined for that conscience of a global blackness the concept of “negritude”. It was meant to be aggressive, provocative, disturbing, as it turned around, reclaimed, and appropriated the French word “nègre” which, from its etymological meaning as “black”, had become a racist slur. The philosophers of Negritude have often said that they too were sensitive to the provocative nature of the word. But they were also conscious of the force of a concept constructed to be an irritant about which Césaire has declared at the beginning of a lecture he gave on February 26, 1987, at the International University of Florida in Miami: “…I confess that I do not always like the word Négritude even if I am the one, with the complicity of a few others, who contributed to its invention and its launching” adding that, still, “it corresponds to an evident reality and, in any case to a need that appears to be a deep one” (Césaire 2004, 80). “What is that reality?” Césaire proceeded then asking. Indeed, that is the question: is there a content and a substance of the concept of Négritude beyond the revolt and the proclamation? In other words, is Négritude mainly a posture of revolt against oppression the manifestation of which is primarily the poetry it has produced, or does it have the substantial significance of a philosophy that gives different expressions to an African presence, to a distinctive black way of being-in-the-world? The answer oscillates between the two terms of the alternative. Negritude as both a resounding poetic scream and the philosophical project to retrieve and explore an identity found the most eloquent expression in an address Aimé Césaire gave in Geneva on June 2nd 1978 on the occasion of the creation by Robert Cornman of a cantata entitled Retour and inspired by the Notebooks of a Return to the Native Land. In that address reproduced in Aimé Césaire, pour regarder le siècle en face, the poet from Martinique declares:
… when it appeared the literature of Négritude created a revolution: in the darkness of the great silence, a voice was raising up, with no interpreter, no alteration, and no complacency, a violent and staccato voice, and it said for the first time: “I, Nègre.”
A voice of revolt
A voice of resentment
But also of fidelity, a voice of freedom, and first and foremost, a voice for the retrieved identity. (Thébia-Melsan 2000, 28)
In fact both answers have been given to that question of posture of revolt vs. philosophical substance, at different moments and in different circumstances by Négritude writers. Nevertheless, it can be said that Césaire and Damas have put more emphasis on the dimension of poetic revolt while Senghor has insisted more on articulating Négritude as a philosophical content, as “the sum total of the values of civilization of the Black World”, thus implying that it is an ontology, an aesthetics, an epistemology, or a politics.
Following the example of Alain Locke, Leon Damas in 1947 and Léopold Sédar Senghor a year later published Anthologies of poetry to manifest the existence of Négritude as an aesthetics and as a literary movement.
In the “Introduction” to his Poètes d’expression française 1900–1945, Damas proclaimed that “the time of blocking out and inhibition” had now given place to “another age: that in which the colonized man becomes aware of his rights and of his duties as a writer, as a novelist or a story-teller, an essayist or a poet.” And he stated the literary and political significance of his Anthology in non ambiguous terms: “Poverty, illiteracy, exploitation of man by man, social and political racism suffered by the black or the yellow, forced labor, inequalities, lies, resignation, swindles, prejudices, complacencies, cowardice, failures, crimes committed in the name of liberty, of equality, of fraternity, that is the theme of this indigenous poetry in French” (Damas 1947, 10). It is important to notice that he meant his anthology to be a manifesto, not so much for Négritude, than for the Colonized in general, as he insisted that the sufferings of colonialism were the burden of “the black and the yellow” and as he featured in the selection poets from Indochina and Madagascar. Or rather Damas understood the concept of Négritude (in fact the word does not appear in the “Introduction” to the anthology) to encompass people of color in general as they were under the domination of European colonialism. This is a broader meaning of Négritude that the “fathers” of the movement always kept in mind. Damas’ view about the substance of the poetry he was presenting, about what the poets gathered in his book had in common besides living the same colonial situation, is generally the same as Etienne Léro’s, whose “Misère d’une poésie” (“Poverty of a Poetry”) he quotes abundantly. In a vitalistic language that characterizes Négritude Léon Damas opposes, using Léro’s language, the vitality of this “new poetry” to what he denounced as “white literary decadence” (to be contrasted with the revolutionary nature of surrealist philosophy and literature). He quoted in particular Léro’s denunciation of writers from the Caribbean “mulatto society, intellectually … corrupt and literarily nourished with white decadence” to the point that some of them would make it a matter of pride that a white person could read their whole book without being able to tell “what their actual complexion was” (Damas 1947, 13). The “Introduction” was indeed a manifesto for Négritude as a vital poetic force that Damas (and Léro) identified as “the wind rising from Black America” which in turn expresses “the African love for life, the African joy in love, the African dream of death” (Damas 1947, 13).
Senghor’s Anthologie de la nouvelle poésie nègre et malgache de langue française, (An Anthology of the New Negro and Malagasy Poetry in French), published in 1948, would eventually overshadow Damas’ anthology and his “Introduction” to it as a manifesto for the Négritude movement. Senghor’s own “Introduction” is just five short paragraphs as it devoted only to the technicalities of selecting the poets gathered in the book (interestingly, unlike Damas, his choice is restricted to the “Blacks”, the Malagasies being according to him “mélaniens” (Senghor 1948, 2)). But what contributed greatly to the fame of the Anthology and propelled Négritude into the broad intellectual conversation was the “Preface” written for it by French philosopher and public intellectual Jean-Paul Sartre (1906–1980). The title of the “preface”, Black Orpheus, referring to the Greek myth about the evocative force of poetry but also about its eventual impotence in front of fate and death, fully expresses what can be called the kiss of death the existentialist philosopher gave to the movement.
By writing Black Orpheus as an account of the ultimate meaning of the black poetry gathered in the Anthology Sartre transformed Négritude into an illustration of his own philosophical theses and durably set the terms in which the concept was to be discussed from then on.
One important point made by Sartre was that Négritude was first and foremost a black poetic appropriation of the French language. Unlike other nationalisms, he explained, which reclaimed the tongue of the people against the imperialist imposition of the language by which they were governed, black people had to use the language of domination imposed by French colonialism as cement for their shared Négritude and as “miraculous weapons” against that same domination. In so doing they radically transformed it, manifesting through their poetry that there was nothing natural and unquestionable in the way in which the language would identify Being with Good, Beautiful, Right and White. The simple song of a black poet chanting in French the beauty of the naked blackness of the woman he loved, Sartre wrote, would then appear to the ears of French people a fundamental violence against their linguistic and indeed ontological self assurance; in spite of the fact that the poem was not even meant for them, or rather because of that. In the poetry of Négritude they would be struck by the discovery of their own language as unfamiliar and hitherto unheard of, especially when that poetry makes the best of surrealist writing as it “smashes [the words] together, breaks their customary associations, and couples them by force” (Sartre 1976, 26). But then again one knows that such an unsettling of language and indeed its “auto destruction” is the “profound aim of French poetry … from Mallarmé to the Surrealists” (1976, 25). Therefore, Sartre concludes, Négritude has achieved that goal: the poets of Négritude have taken to its end what surrealist writers had been calling for.
So while he praised Négritude as the revolutionary poetry of the time, Sartre maintained the traditional Marxist view about the proletariat being the sole true revolutionary class and actor of history. Just as Eurydice was the creation of Orpheus’ power of evocation, Négritude was a creation of poetry, a “Myth dolorous and full of hope” and like “a woman who is born to die” (Sartre 1976, 63). History and its laws had already condemned Négritude to be just a Poem, indeed a swan song: the future of liberation was in the hand of the proletariat, the universal class who was going to bring effective revolution and liberation from all oppressions. When all is said and done and Négritude has permitted the blacks to “raise relentlessly the great negro cry until the foundations of the world shall tremble” (Césaire’s Les armes miraculeuses quoted by Sartre as the last words of Black Orpheus), it will have to be shed “to the profit of the Revolution” (1976, 65) by the only true actor of history which is the proletariat. In other words the “being-in-the-world of the Negro” as Sartre defined Négritude using Heideggerian language is “subjective” while class is “objective”: the notion of race is concrete and particular, Sartre writes, while that of class is universal and abstract; in the terminology of Karl Jaspers the first resorts to “comprehension” while the latter resorts to “intellection” (1976, 59).
Again, Sartre’s preface was a real kiss of death as it played an immense role in popularizing the Négritude movement and contributed to establishing Senghor’s Anthology as its manifesto, but at the same time dismissed its historical significance by emphasizing that its being was ultimately only poetic, without real substance. And in fact, ironically, Black Orpheus contained and announced most of the criticisms that would be directed at Négritude afterwards. First the criticism which very quickly came from certain Marxists who accused Négritude of creating the distraction of “race” where there should be only a focus on objective social contradictions in the historic phase of the struggle of the Proletariat to bring authentic liberation to the oppressed workers in Europe and the dominated peoples in the world. To that criticism some would add that by emphasizing the particular and the concrete of race over the objective and the universal of the struggle against capitalism and imperialism, the “fathers” of Négritude, Senghor more specifically (since he led his country to independence and became its president for twenty years), seemed to imply that some cultural recognition and reconciliation was all that was needed: they accused Négritude of being, for that reason, an ideology for neocolonialism. Sartre’s “preface” also foreshadowed the accusation of being an unfounded essentialism promoting the notion that black people shared a common identity, partaking in some enduring African-ness that defines them beyond differences in historical trajectories and circumstances, personal or collective.
The paradox of Sartre’s preface to the Anthology by Senghor is that in many respects the Négritude movement had, after Black Orpheus, to define itself against Sartre’s positioning of its philosophical meaning. It did so (1) by insisting that it was not a mere particularism defined as the antithesis to a white supremacist view (with black self affirmation using the figure of inversion that Sartre characterized as an anti-racist racism (1976, 59)), before some dialectical post-racial synthesis; (2) by showing that there was something substantial (and not just poetic) in the reference to African values of civilization by which Senghor had defined Négritude: that Négritude was indeed an ontology, an epistemology, an aesthetics and a politics.
When it comes to defining the substance of Négritude, there is an important difference between the three main heralds of the movement. Damas, a poet more than a theorist, spoke of it in the “introduction” of his anthology as the vital force behind any new and true—that is liberating—poetry. As to Césaire, he has often insisted that Négritude was primarily the reclaiming of a heritage in order to regain initiative. He declared:
Négritude, in my eyes, is not a philosophy. Négritude is not a metaphysics. Négritude is not a pretentious conception of the universe. It is a way of living history within history: the history of a community whose experience appears to be … unique, with its deportation of populations, its transfer of people from one continent to another, its distant memories of old beliefs, its fragments of murdered cultures. How can we not believe that all this, which has its own coherence, constitutes a heritage? (2004, 82)
Unlike Damas and Césaire, Senghor affirmed that Négritude was also the expression of a philosophy to be read in the cultural products of Africa; and above all in African religions. Different as they are from one region to another, from one culture to another, there is still ethnographical evidence that many of them share to be founded on an ontology of life forces. “The whole system”, Senghor declares, in a lecture “On Négritude” delivered at Lovanium University in Kinshasa, “is founded on the notion of vital force. Pre-existing, anterior to being, it constitutes being. God has given vital force not only to men, but also to animals, vegetables, even minerals. By which they are. But it is the purpose of this force to increase” (1993, 19). Senghor then explains that in the human being the increase of the force is the process of her becoming a person “by being freer and freer within an interdependent community” (1993, 19). He adds that the ultimate meaning of religion is to assure the continuous increase of the vital force of the living, in particular through the main ritual of the sacrifice of an animal. This ontology of life forces has been summarized by Belgian philosopher Leo Apostel in the following propositions:
- To say that something exists is to say that it exercises a specific force. To be is to be a force.
- Every force is specific (as against a pantheistic interpretation, since what is asserted here is the existence of monadic, individual forces).
- Different types of beings are characterized by different intensities and types of forces.
- Each force can be strengthened or weakened [rein-forced or de-forced, as Senghor puts it].
- Forces can influence and act upon each other in virtue of their internal natures.
- The universe is a hierarchy of forces organized according to their strengths, starting from God and going all the way down to the mineral through the founding ancestors, the important dead, living humans, animals and plants.
- Direct causal action involves the influence of more-being or stronger force, on less-being, weaker force. (Apostel 1981, 26–29)
Point 6 in particular constitutes a good summary of the view shared by many African religions characterized as “animism” while the other points help understand the particular type of causality that has been labeled magical thinking. As early as in 1939, at a time when Leon Damas had already published his first collection of poems, Pigments (1937) and Césaire had just finished a version of his Cahier d’un retour au pays natal (“Notebook of a return to my Native Land” (Césaire 2000a)), Senghor had published an essay on the philosophy of Négritude entitled “Ce que l’homme noir apporte” (“What the Black Man Contributes”). As he explored in that essay the notion of rhythm as constitutive of what he called “the negro style”, Senghor was trying to say that the productions of African art were to be understood first and foremost as the language of an ontology of vital forces.
So it is not surprising that he was so enthusiastic when, six years later, he discovered a book by Reverend Father Placide Tempels diving a clear exposition of Bantu Philosophy as resting upon such an ontology (Tempels 1945). Tempels was a Belgian Franciscan priest who went to the Congo as a missionary. He had the view that in order to be more efficient preaching the Gospel to the Bantu people he had first to understand the principles underlying their belief system, their customary law, their cultural habits, and so on. He explained that he came to realize that one could and should go beyond mere ethnographical description of those characteristics of the people’s lives and dig out a set of ontological principles on which they were founded. In other words that there existed a Bantu philosophy of being underlying their laws, behaviors, beliefs, politics, etc. The book, first written in Flemish then published in French in 1945 by Présence africaine under the title La philosophie bantoue, became quite an event: it was one of the very first times that an African people was associated with philosophy, an intellectual pursuit considered at least since Hegel to be the unique telos of Western civilization.
Nothing probably is more indicative of the difference between Léopold Sédar Senghor and his friend Aimé Césaire than their respective reactions to the widely celebrated book by Father Tempels. While Senghor embraced it as going along the same lines he was exploring in his 1939 essay, Césaire’s reaction was one of rejection. It is not that Césaire did not accept the substance of Tempels’ theses. In fact the summary he makes of them is perfectly adequate: “Now then, know that Bantu thought is essentially ontological”, he writes in his 1955 Discours sur le colonialisme ,“that Bantu ontology is based on the truly fundamental notions of a life force and a hierarchy of life forces; and that for the Bantu the ontological order which defines the world comes from God and, as a divine decree, must be respected” (Césaire 2000b, 58). In fact what provoked Césaire’s skepticism and sarcasm vis-à-vis Tempels’ work was its implications as a tool to justify and perpetuate the colonial order. “Since Bantu thought is ontological”, he tittered, “the Bantu only ask for satisfaction of an ontological nature. Decent wages! Comfortable housing! Food! These Bantu are pure spirits, I tell you …” (Césaire 2000b, 58) Above all, there is for Césaire, the way in which the colonial order is made by Tempels a new part of Bantu ontology and therefore legitimized and even sanctified in the eyes of the Bantu themselves: “As for the government, why should it complain?” Since the Rev. Tempels notes with obvious satisfaction, “from their first contact with the white man, the Bantu considered us from the only point of view that was possible to them, the point of view of their Bantu philosophy” and “integrated us into their hierarchy of life forces at a very high level” (Césaire 2000b, 58). The final result being then that “the Bantu god will take responsibility for the Belgian colonialist order, and any Bantu who dare to raise his hand against it will be guilty of sacrilege” (Césaire 2000b, 58).
In sum, in the eyes of Senghor, Tempels’ Bantu philosophy, along with Bergson’s philosophy of élan vital, provided the language of life philosophy which he considered characteristic of the cultures of Africa and those of African origin. For him Négritude is an ontology of life forces to be described as a vitalism. Césaire who was more skeptical about a philosophical content of the word dismissed Tempels’ enterprise not on the basis of its substance but because of what he considered the intention behind the text of Bantu philosophy: an attempt to reform colonialism in order to perpetuate it.
The aspect on which Senghor insists the most is that of Négritude as a philosophy of African art. One of the main activities of Senghor when he first arrived in Paris at the end of the 1920s was to visit the ethnographical museum at Place Trocadéro in Paris. By then the vogue of art nègre (black art) had already produced its effects on modern European art. Pablo Picasso, in particular, in 1906 had made the turn of making African sculptures and masks part of his artistic pursuit: his Demoiselles d’Avignon, painted in 1906, manifested that move. The 1930s, the years when Senghor, Césaire and Damas started writing, is the time when what was labeled “primitive objects” were now more widely perceived as art, beyond the circles of the artistic avant-garde. The Universal Exposition in Paris in 1931 showed that new “sensibility”.
Senghor wanted Négritude to be the philosophy of the geometrical forms so characteristic of African masks and sculptures across different regions and cultures. He would often explain that the raison d’être of art in Africa is not to reproduce or embellish reality but to establish the connection with what he labeled the sub-reality that is the universe of vital forces. What modern art understood from the consideration of art nègre is that the issue was not anymore to simply reproduce sensible appearances but to deal with the forces hidden beneath the surface of things. That is why the African objects at the Trocadéro museum were at once religious and artistic artifacts.
Plastic forms are life forces, they are rhythms. So objects such as masks or sculptures are to be read as combinations of rhythms as we can see in the following aesthetic analysis by Senghor of a feminine statuette from Baule culture (in today Ivory Coast): “In it, two themes of sweetness sing an alternating song. The breasts are ripe fruits. The chin and the knees, the rump and the calves are also fruits or breasts. The neck, the arms and the thighs are columns of black honey.” This reading establishes the object as a composition of two rhythmic series (what is referred to here, poetically, as two themes of sweetness): the concave forms of the breasts, chin, knees, rump and calves, on the one hand; on the other hand, the cylindrical forms that are the neck, the arms and the thighs. This example indicates what Senghor understands by “rhythm” and illustrates what he sees as its omnipresence in Black aesthetic products, as he certainly remembers here the notion expressed, ten years before by Jane Nardal, of a “rule of rhythm, the sovereign master of [black] bodies” (Nardal, 2002, 105). In his first essay on Négritude, “What the Black Man Contributes”, Senghor wrote:
This ordering force that constitutes Negro style is rhythm. It is the most sensible and the least material thing. It is the vital element par excellence. It is the primary condition for, and sign of, art, as respiration is of life – respiration that rushes or slows down, becomes regular or spasmodic, depending on the being’s tension, the degree and quality of the emotion. Such is rhythm, originally, in its purity, such is it in the masterpieces of Negro art, particularly in sculpture. It is composed of one theme – sculptural form – that is opposed to a brother theme, like inhalation is opposed to exhalation, and that is reprised. It is not a symmetry that engenders monotony; rhythm is alive, it is free. For reprise is not redundancy, or repetition. The theme is reprised at another place, on another level, in another combination, in a variation. And it produces something like another tone, another timbre, another accent. And the general effect is intensified by this, not without nuances. This is how rhythm acts, despotically, on what is least intellectual in us, to make us enter into the spirituality of the object; and this attitude of abandon that we have is itself rhythmic. (Senghor 1964, 296)
Seventeen years later he would reiterate the same credo:
What is rhythm? It is the architecture of being, the internal dynamism that gives it form, the system of waves it emanates toward the Others, the pure expression of vital force. Rhythm is the vibrating shock, the force that, through the senses, seizes us at the root of being. It expresses itself through the most material and sensual means: lines, surfaces, colors, and volumes in architecture, sculpture and painting; accents in poetry and music; movements in dance. But, in doing so, it organizes all this concreteness toward the light of the Spirit. For the Negro African, it is insofar as it is incarnate in sensuality that rhythm illuminates the Spirit.
In 1966, L.S. Senghor, then the President of Senegal since the country became independent in 1960, organized in Dakar an international event that he obviously intended to be a great moment of celebration of what he had been pursuing his whole life: the World Festival of Black Arts, meant to be the concrete manifestation of black aesthetics in all its dimensions. Aimé Césaire, one of the most celebrated guests of honor at the Festival, was invited to give a “Lecture on African Art” (“Discours sur l’art africain”). He first insisted on the question of the role and significance of art in general in the modern world, quoting the poet Saint-John Perse: “When mythology falls apart, it is in poetry that the divine finds refuge … it is from poetic imagination that the fierce passion of people seeking light gets its flame” (Thébia-Melsan 2000, 22). What Négritude poets did even if he does not like the word Négritude at all, declares Césaire, and in spite of their failings, was just that: to be light bearers for Africa. Then he proceeded to ask whether African art of the past will be a catalyst for African art in the present and the future the way it had been for European art at the beginning of the twentieth century. That was a way for him of calling the attention on the questions at the core of his thinking about aesthetics (but also politics): how to regain initiative? How to avoid the lack of authenticity of sheer imitation or mimesis: mimesis of Europe as well as mimesis of one’s own artistic tradition.
As to his philosophy of art as such, Césaire’s views follow consistently from his surrealist poetics and eventually converge with his friend Senghor’s. Césaire’s notion of the primordial role that should be played by the Dionysian in art versus the Apollonian. These are categories that Césaire and Senghor adopted from Nietzsche’s philosophy (Nietzsche’s Birth of Tragedy) to express the opposition between the primal, obscure force of life considered as an organic whole (the Dionysian) on the one hand, and on the other hand the plastic beauty or the form which brings into light the individuality of the object (the Apollonian): the Dionysian speaks to our emotion while the Apollonian speaks to our intellectuality. Césaire evokes such a contrast when he states that: “The poetically beautiful is not merely beauty of expression or muscular euphoria. A too Apollonian or gymnastic idea of beauty paradoxically runs the risk of skinning, stuffing, and hardening it.” This is the seventh and final thesis of the propositions summarizing his views about Poetry and Knowledge and it is in perfect resonance with Senghor’s view of African art as the language of the ontology of vital forces.
In conclusion, Négritude as aesthetics is predicated on such oppositions as those between sub-reality (or sur-reality) and appearance, force and form, emotion and intellect, Dionysian and Apollonian. Césaire, Damas (as shown in the preface of his anthology) and Senghor all agreed that art was a vital response to the mechanistic and de-humanizing philosophy that produced (and was produced by) modern Europe. And like Nietzsche, they believed that art was another approach by which a sense of the world as totality would be restored. These lines from Césaire’s “Discourse on African Art” delivered in Dakar on April 6, 1966, at the opening of the “World Festival of Negro Arts” summarize Négritude philosophy of the significance of art, especially black art: “Through art, the reified world becomes again the human world, the world of living realities, the world of communication and participation. From a collection of things, poetry and art remake the world, a world which is whole, which is total and harmonious. And that is why poetry is youth. It is the force that gives back to the world its prime vitality, which gives back to everything its aura of marvelous by replacing it within the original totality” (Thébia-Melsan, 2000, 21).
And it can be argued that it is because of that significance of art that Négritude also presented itself as another type of knowledge or epistemology and as another politics.
In the same 1939 essay in which he explored what he called the “rhythmic attitude” by which we enter in profound connection with the object of art, its reality or its sub-reality, Senghor wrote the statement which is probably the most controversial of all his formulations of the philosophy of Négritude: “Emotion is Negro, as reason is Hellenic” (“L’émotion est nègre, comme la raison héllène”). (Senghor 1964, 288) The criticism was that the formula was an acceptance of the ethnological discourse of the Levy-Bruhlian type making a distinction between western societies suffused with rationality and the colonized world of what he labeled “inferior societies”, under the rule of “primitive mentality”. While rationality is defined by the use of the logical principles of identity, contradiction and excluded middle and the empirical notion of causality, primitive mentality functions according to a law of “participation” and magical thinking. The law means that a person can be herself and at the same time be –or rather participate in the being of—her totem animal ignoring (or rather indifferent to) the principle of contradiction, and magical thinking, superposing a supernatural world to reality, allows for example action from distance in the absence of any causal link between two phenomena. (Levy-Bruhl 1926) For his critics, Senghor’s formula did ratify the view of Lucien Levy-Bruhl, while the ethnologist himself eventually recanted them in his Notebooks of Lucien Levy-Bruhl posthumously published ten years after his death in 1939. Aimé Césaire’s famous lines from The Notebook for a Return to the Native Land echo Senghor’s formula:
Those who have invented neither powder nor the compass
Those who have tamed neither gas nor electricity
Those who have explored neither the seas nor the skies
But they abandon themselves, possessed, to the essence of all things
Ignoring surfaces but possessed by the movement of all things
Heedless, taking no account, but playing the game of the world.
Truly the elder sons of the world
Porous to every breath of the world
Flesh of the flesh of the world throbbing with the very movement of the world.
Jean-Paul Sartre who quoted these verses in Black Orpheus, (1976, 43–44) immediately after made this remark: “Upon reading this poem, one cannot help but think of the famous distinction which Bergson established between intelligence and intuition” (1976, 44). That remark makes an important point: “emotion” and “intuition” as approaches to reality in Négritude philosophy have more to do with Bergsonian philosophy than with Levy-Bruhlian ethnology. Donna Jones rightly speaks of Negritude as an “Afro-Bergsonian epistemology”. (Jones, 2010) Senghor did use the language of the author of Primitive Mentality, (Levy-Bruhl 1923) for example when he wrote in his 1956 article on “Negro African Aesthetics” that “European reason is analytical by utilization, Negro reason is intuitive by participation” (1964, 203). But he also stated clearly, as early as in 1945, six years after the essay in which the (in)famous formula was written: “But are the differences not in the ratio between elements more than in their nature? Underneath the differences, are there not more essential similarities? Above all, is reason not identical among men? I do not believe in ‘prelogical mentality.’ The mind cannot be prelogical, and it can even less be alogical” (1964, 42). This affirmation is clearly directed at Levy-Bruhl. So the influence on his thinking claimed by Senghor is rather Henri Bergson’s. The poet often refers to the importance of the “1889 Revolution”, in reference to the year of publication of Bergson’s Essay on the immediate data of consciousness. Bergson, for Senghor, has given a philosophical expression to a new paradigm which, unlike Cartesianism and, even before it, Aristotelianism, makes room for a type of knowledge which does not divide by analysis the subject from the object and the object into its constitutive separated parts: different from the reason-that-separates, says Senghor following Bergson, there is a reason-that-embraces, which makes us experience “the lived identity of knowledge and the known, the lived and the thought, the lived and the real” (1971, 287). That approach of reality is the other side of our analytical intelligence: according to Bergson, the push of life in evolution, the élan vital, has produced consciousness. Now “consciousness, in man, is pre-eminently intellect. It might have been, it ought, so it seems, to have been also intuition. Intuition and intellect represent two opposite directions of the work of consciousness: intuition goes in the very direction of life, intellect goes in the inverse direction, and thus finds itself naturally in accordance with the movement of matter. A complete and perfect humanity would be that in which these two forms of conscious activity should attain their full development” (Bergson 1944, 291–292). Clearly Bergson does not see “intuition” and “intelligence” as dividing humanity into different types: he calls for their equal development in a fully accomplished humanity.
Two conclusions can be drawn from Senghor’s Bergsonism. First, the epistemology of Négritude, what he calls a Negro way of knowing does not simply reproduce Levy-Bruhl’s radical cognitive dualism which ultimately divides humanity into two categories, the European and the non-European. It is rather a way of emphasizing the role played by what Bergson has called “intuition” in the production of African cultural objects, more particularly African art. Because, and this is the second conclusion, when he speaks of an African epistemology in fact Senghor is still speaking about art and aesthetics. He is speaking about art as knowledge, art as a particular approach to reality, art as the realm par excellence of intuitive knowledge or emotion. That concept is to be understood in relation to the distinction made by Henri Bergson in his 1932 book on The two sources of morality and Religion between two opposed notions of “emotion”. One that is a reaction, a “stirring of sensibility by representation” (Bergson 1932 [1977, 43]), and one that is “a cause and not an effect”, that is “pregnant with representations” (Bergson 1932 [1977, 44]). The first Bergson calls “infra-intellectual” while the second is “supra-intellectual” (Bergson 1932 [1977, 44]). Clearly, Senghor’s “emotion” corresponds to the creative one, the one “pregnant with representations”. Its meaning in Senghor’s formula is also consonant with its definition by Jean-Paul Sartre as a way of seeing the world as a “non-instrumental totality”: “in this case, writes Sartre, the categories of the world will act upon consciousness immediately. They are present to it without distance” (Sartre 1989, 52,90).
We can now conclude with a reexamination of Senghor’s infamous formula, which he kept explaining again and again: “Emotion is Negro as Reason is Hellenic”. To pay attention to the context in which it was written is to recall that Senghor, in the late 1930s was absorbing not only ethnological literature but also writings about “art nègre”. In particular a book that he refers to in a simple footnote but which was very influential on his thinking: Primitive Negro Sculpture by Paul Guillaume and Thomas Munro, published in the US in 1926 and translated into French in 1929. One of the main points made in the book was to contrast Greco-Roman statuary expressing the ideal of the beautiful form as it exists in reality even if it is transfigured by art and African sculpture as a manifestation of the life force beneath the appearances of things. When that context is taken into account, it becomes clear that Senghor’s neatly crafted formula (it is an alexandrine in French) can be read as an analogy: Hellenic art is to analytic reason what African art is to emotion. And thus it becomes less scandalous as the simple expression of the Nietzschean way in which Senghor’s Négritude has considered art as knowledge and aesthetics as epistemology. As Abiola Irele has rightly remarked: “Senghor’s theory of the African method of knowledge and his aesthetic theory” are not just “intimately related [but] even coincide” (Irele 1990, 75). Senghor considers that method, that form of vital knowledge, as “the way of the Africans” and he declares that Bergsonism represents but “a return” to it (Senghor, 1993, 125).
In 1956 Aimé Césaire wrote a resounding public letter to Maurice Thorez, then the General Secretary of the French Communist Party, telling him that he was resigning from the party. He had been a member for more than ten years and had been elected in 1946 as a communist mayor of Fort-de-France then as a Representative of France in the French Assembly. The three “fathers” of Négritude found themselves members of the same French Parliament: Senghor who had been elected a deputy from Senegal in 1946 was sitting with the Socialists and so was Léon Damas who got elected to represent Guiana in 1948.
In his Letter to Maurice Thorez, Césaire started by enumerating his many grievances against a communist party that had uncritically pledged total allegiance to Russia before he came to “considerations related to [his] position as a man of color.” As a person of African descent, he declared, his position expressed the singularity of a “situation in the world which cannot be confused with any other … of … problems which cannot be reduced to any other problem … [and] of [a] history, constructed out of terrible misfortunes, that belong to no one else” (Césaire, 2010, 147). That is why “black peoples”, he argued, needed to have their own organizations, “made for them, made by them, and adapted to ends that they alone [could] determine” (Césaire, 2010, 148). Césaire insisted also that Stalinist “fraternalism,” with its notions of the “advanced people” who must help “peoples who are behind,” says nothing different than “colonialist paternalism.” (Césaire, 2010, 149)
Ultimately, what Césaire was seeking in formulations such as “it should be Marxism and communism at the service of black peoples, not black peoples at the service of the doctrine” was to define the notion of a people by means of culture rather than politics. And consequently he was refusing to just dilute the cultural dimension of the existential response of black peoples to colonial negation in Marxist universalism: Césaire’s “letter” was also, eight years later, a political response to Jean-Paul Sartre’s Black Orpheus. Is my decision an expression of “provincialism”, Césaire asked at the end of his letter. “Not at all”, he answered. “I am not burying myself in a narrow particularism. But neither do I want to lose myself in an emaciated universalism. There are two ways to lose oneself: walled segregation in the particular or dilution in the ‘universal’” (Césaire, 2010, 152).
Césaire called then for the promotion of an “African variety of communism” as a way of avoiding both pitfalls. Senghor also has insisted on an African socialism born of a “Negro African re-reading of Marx.” This African socialism of Senghor could be presented briefly in two fundamental points: first the insistence that it is the early Marx who can truly inspire an African doctrine of socialism, second the understanding that socialism is a natural development of African societies and cultures. So in article titled “Marxism and humanism” and published in 1948 in Revue socialiste (a Journal sponsored by the French Socialist Party) Senghor notes that which will later be the point of departure for Louis Althusser’s reading of Marx: between the early Marx and the Marx who writes The Capital, there is an epistemological break. It is to be recalled here that in 1844 in Paris, Marx wrote a certain number of texts that he just abandoned afterwards to “the criticism of the mice”. Those texts, known as The 1844 Manuscripts were later discovered and published in Leipzig in 1932. They manifest that Marx’s thinking and language were then fundamentally ethical as he was outraged by human condition under capitalist regime characterized by reification and alienation: human beings are alienated because, Marx writes, the product of their work sucks out their life force and stands in front of them as strange and hostile artifacts. Alienation is the sentiment of living in exile and imprisoned in a de-humanized world. The Marx who writes the Capital will abandon that moral language and analyze the condition of the working class through technical concepts, for example that of extortion of surplus value. While Althusser considered this break the advent of Marxist science as an “anti-humanist theory” Senghor saw it as self-betrayal by Marx repudiating his identity as a philosopher and giving to his views the appearance of dogmatic economic petrifactions. The task of an African re-reading of Marx is then
- To save Marx the humanist, metaphysician, dialectician and artist from a narrowly materialist, economistic, positivist, realist Marxism;
- To invent an African path to socialism which is inspired by black spiritualities, and which continues the tradition of communalism on the continent.
The concept of alienation in particular, so central in the writings of the early Marx are at the heart of Senghor’s reflections on Marxism and liberation. Liberation for Senghor is liberation from all forces of alienation, natural and sociopolitical. And in his 1948 article he writes about the early works of Marx: “For us, men of 1947, men living after two world wars, we who have just escaped the bloodthirsty contempt of dictators and who are threatened by other dictatorships, what profit is to be had in these works of youth! They so nicely encapsulate the ethical principles of Marx, who proposes as the object of our practical activity the total liberation of man.” In Senghor’s vitalistic philosophy, total liberation will be reached when the human being reaches the stage when her artistic end can now flourish, when the evolution from homo faber to homo sapiens has now given birth to homo artifex.
Reflecting on what has been achieved by the Négritude movement, Lucius Outlaw notes that for all the criticisms it has received, “nonetheless, the Négritude arguments, fundamentally, involved a profound displacement of the African invented by Europeans.” And he continues: “It is this African challenge and displacement, through radical critique and counter-construction, that have been deconstructive in particularly powerful and influential ways: involving direct attacks on the assumed embodiment of the paragon of humanity in whites of Europe, an attack that forces this embodiment back upon itself, forces it to confront its own historicity, its own wretched history of atrocities, and the stench of the decay announcing the impending death of the hegemonic ideal of the Greco-European Rational Man” (Outlaw 1996, 67).
L. Outlaw acknowledges that that was the main point of Sartre’s Black Orpheus. It could now be argued that the question, today, is no longer that of a “deconstructive challenge” to “the hegemonic ideal of the Greco-European Rational Man” but that of what Outlaw calls “the reconstructive aspects of this challenge” (Outlaw 1996, 68). Has Négritude anything to contribute, today, to that reconstructive aspect? What does it say about the present and future of Black arts, since Négritude as ontology, as epistemology, and even as politics takes us back, according to Césaire and Senghor, to the philosophy of art considered as a vital knowledge of a reality conceived as a web of forces?
To such a question, it can be said that Césaire had given an answer in the conclusion of his 1966 Dakar address. There could be no prescription of what African art should be. There is no model it should imitate not even its own past. It has to continuously invent itself and that self invention is not to be separated from the question of Africa’s self invention. “African art of tomorrow will be worth what Africa and the African of tomorrow are worth”, Césaire declared before ending his lecture with these final words: “… the future of African art is in our hands. That is why to the African Heads of States who say: African artists, work to save African art, here is what we respond: people of Africa and first of all you, African politicians, because you have more responsibility, give us good African politics, make us a good Africa, create for us an Africa where there are still reasons for hope, means for fulfillment, reasons to be proud, give back to Africa dignity and health, and African art will be saved” (Thébia Melsan 2000, 25–26).
One way of raising the question of political relevance is to ask: is there any room for a version of Négritude in what could be considered as a philosophical foundation of black solidarity? In September 1956, at the First Meeting of Black Writers and Artists held in Paris, at the Sorbonne, Aimé Césaire gave a lecture on “Culture and Colonization” (Césaire 1956). This was quite a historic reflection, at a time of maturity for the Négritude movement and just a few months before the shaking of decolonizations started with the independence of Ghana, on the relationship between Négritude and Pan-Africanism. “What is the common denominator”, Césaire started his lecture by asking, “in this assembly gathering people as diverse as Africans from Black Africa, North Americans, Caribbeans and Malagasies?” The first obvious answer, he declared, was that they all lived in a situation that could be described as colonial, semi-colonial or para-colonial. In fact, he continued, there are two aspects in the solidarity of people of African descent gathered then at the Sorbonne: one that could be characterized as “horizontal” and one “vertical”. The horizontal solidarity is political: Pan-Africanism or Black solidarity between Africans and the African Diaspora is their common response to the situation of submission to colonialism and racism. The vertical solidarity or “solidarity throughout time” is the way people of African descent manifest different faces of an African civilization. Not to be misunderstood, Césaire hastens to make the precision, with cultural commonality. African cultures in Africa and in the African Diasporas are at least as different as Italian culture would be from Norwegian culture. But they share civilizational traits in the same way Norwegian and Italian cultures share European traits. Césaire’s distinction between cultures (characterized by difference) and civilization (defined by the existence of commonalities) would mean that the “vertical” dimension of Pan-Africanism is what could be identified as Négritude. How do we see Pan-Africanism today?
Our times are dominated by the postcolonial and anti-essentialist view that differences should not be subsumed under a notion of Black identity which might have worked as a response to colonial negation but does not have any substantial meaning (just what Sartre said in 1948, when he labeled Négritude an “anti-racist racism”, which Senghor and Césaire forcefully dismissed, insisting that their antiracist combat should never be confused with racism, even a counter or a reverse one). As an example, the créolité movement in the Caribbean claimed creoleness as a continuous process of hybridization (“Neither Europeans, nor Africans, nor Asians, we proclaim ourselves Creoles”, the Créolité writers famously stated at the beginning of the manifesto (Bernabé, Chamoiseau, and Confiant 1990, 75)) turning its back on Césaire’s Négritude and his claim of an African heritage as constitutive of his identity: Négritude is ante-creole, they wrote. This movement established itself as following from Edouard Glissant’s philosophy of creolization. This philosophy is based on a distinction between what Glissant calls “atavistic cultures” grounded in some “creation myth of the world” (a group to which sub-Saharan African cultures belong), and what he calls “composite cultures” “born from history” (Glissant 2003, 111). Thus, he asks, “my own genesis, what is it if not the belly of the slave ship?” Not Africa, then, where the ship was coming from with its hideous freight, but the journey itself, the unpredictable becoming of the voyage to new shores, to new continuously proliferating, rhizomatic identities. The Africanness of African-Americans could be another example. The demand to be called African-Americans after having been “Negroes” then “Blacks” has certainly more to do with the internal identity politics of being Americans in the same way Irish-Americans or Chinese-Americans are than with any claim of substantial solidarity with Africans. Pan-Africanism that is engagement and solidarity with the African continent has always been the concern of a tiny elite among African Americans (even if it is associated with considerable names such as Marcus Garvey or W.E.B. Dubois).
Within the African continent, there is today a renewed attempt at reviving Pan-Africanism under the form of African unity, what is referred to sometimes as “the United States of Africa”. The African Union has thus divided the continent into six great regions that should achieve economic and political integration in a near future as a significant step towards continental unity. It is significant that the decision was made to consider the African Diasporas a symbolic sixth region. Is that a gesture which will remain simply symbolic, a last tip of the hat from the new pragmatic Pan-Africanism to the lyricism of Négritude about Black Solidarity (it should be noted that Pan-Africanism means that the divide between sub-Saharan Africa and the Maghreb has no significance and that Africans are black as well as of European or Asian descent)? In 1956, Césaire seemed to have been conscious that a “horizontal solidarity” as a response to a shared condition of living under colonial and racist domination was less problematic than a vertical solidarity throughout time binding together peoples who have come to develop very different cultures or, within the same nations, very different subcultures. He still believed in that shared “Négritude” as a “civilization” under which those differences would be subsumed. But above all he believed, against any “incarcerating conception of identity” (2004, 92) that Négritude, ultimately, amounts to the continuing fight against racism: “one can renounce the heritage”, he declared in his Miami address but “has one the right to renounce the fight” when one understands that what is at stake today is not Négritude but racism, “seats of racism” here and there which need to be confronted if we are to “conquer a new and larger fraternity”? (2004, 90–92)
To dismiss too quickly Négritude as an essentialism of the past, which might have been necessary as a “deconstructive challenge” to an oppressive colonial order but has nothing to say when it comes to the call for cosmopolitanism and creolization, would miss an important dimension of that multifaceted movement. The essentialist language is pervasive in Négritude literature, no doubt, but so is the language of hybridity which can be seen as undermining it the way Penelope used to undo at night what she had woven during the day. Senghor is as much a thinker of “métissage” (mixture) than he is a thinker of Négritude. His watchword, “everyone must be mixed in their own way” is as central to Négritude as the defense and illustration of the values of civilization of the black world. There is in fact a de-racialized use of the word “nègre” by Senghor which is crucial to understand why painter Pablo Picasso, poets Paul Claudel, Charles Péguy or Arthur Rimbaud, philosopher Henri Bergson, etc. have been somehow enrolled by Senghor under the banner of “Négritude”. The message being, ultimately and maybe not so paradoxically, that one does not have to be black to be a “nègre”.
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