Notes to Neoliberalism

1. This entry understands Mises as a neoliberal precursor, as he adopted sharper limits on the state than anyone normally classified as a neoliberal. But see Slobodian (2018) and Whyte (2019: 31) for a different take.

2. Angus Burgin places Hayek and Friedman, as well as Buchanan, near the center of what others call neoliberalism. See Burgin 2012: 118.

3. Similarly, we should not define neoliberalism by how governments and political parties use it, since they often use the term pejoratively for political gain.

4. Neoliberalism is not utilitarian in part because utilitarianism is a moral theory, whereas neoliberalism is an account of political economy.

5. I am not focused on a stricter definition of efficiency, like Pareto efficiency.

6. Buchanan (1975: 183) sometimes criticized Hayek for relying too much on unconscious forces.

7. While Keynes was a defender of capitalism to some extent, Keynesian ideas are premised on certain large-scale market failures, and so they do count as critiques of capitalism.

8. Friedman, “Individuality and the New Society: The Market vs. the Bureaucrat,” 16, March 1968, box 50, folder 2, Friedman papers.

9. Hayek (1979: 45) liked Friedman’s proposal.

10. Hayek does not actually engage A Theory of Justice. See Hayek 1978: 166, 179.

11. This entry focuses on neoliberal attitudes towards the organization of nation-states, despite neoliberals investing enormous effort in developing theories of the global economy and proper global political institutions, but this is largely because neoliberals ultimately came to disagree rather a lot about the proper structure of the global economy, and, in particular, in the structure of the European Union. For an account of the variation among their views, see Slobodian 2018: 180. Slobodian discusses the global project of neoliberalism, and differences between neoliberals, in great detail. But since, on his telling, neoliberals ended up with a fairly wide array of attitudes towards international institutions, neoliberal attitudes towards global institutions are too variable for philosophical analysis, though Slobodian (2018: 15) reviews some points of agreement on foreign policy. Whyte (2019) agrees with Slobodian in understanding neoliberalism as a global project. And, critically, neoliberals obviously support free trade, free immigration, and monetary policies, like floating exchange rates. See Burgin 2012: 182–3, 221).

Copyright © 2021 by
Kevin Vallier <>

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