Supplement to Otto Neurath

Political Economy: Theory, Practice, and Philosophical Consequences

Intellectual landscape

Educated in an environment rife with economic debate and spirit of social reform, Neurath intended his economic thinking to contribute to social happiness in practice and to economics in theory and method. To that effect he challenged a number of views influential at the turn of the century: e.g., Marx’s objective (labor) theory of value, Gustav Schmoller’s historicist inductivism, Max Weber’s ideal-type theory, Carl Menger’s Aristotelian, sometimes Platonist, essentialism and deductivism, as well as his and his followers’ commitment to subjective utility theory and the maximization of utility (e.g., Böhm-Bawerk and others focus on expected and marginal utility). Along the way, he also rejected his own father’s idealist spiritualism guiding social and economic reform.

Neurath remained partly within the tradition of Menger’s so-called Austrian School of economics, embracing its decisionism in the technical form of a decision theory and a corresponding standard of rationality. Yet he also noted its limitations and conflict with his socialist epicurean goals. He rejected methodological individualism, the assumption of the value and even possibility of a precise absolute measures and calculus of utility especially involving an abstract and universal unit of calculation (and any uni-dimensionally commensurable alternatives). He defended, instead, an irreducibly multi-factorial notion of social welfare, use value and full utilization of resources over market standards of exchange value, monetary calculation and individual profit motive.

Neurath shaped and changed his ideas while entering ongoing theorerical and methodological debates dating from the late nineteenth century: the socialism debate (centered around Marx), the method debate (centered around Schmoller and Menger), the value-judgment debate (centered around Weber and Sombart), the unity of science – or natural vs. human, or mental, sciences – debate (centered around Windelband and later Rickert and Dilthey), the socialization debate (centered around Kautsky, Adler, Bauer and Bernstein), and the socialist calculation debate (centered around von Mises, Weber and Hayek).

Historiography or philosophy of history

The debates over the historical sciences, a cornerstone of nineteen-century German intellectual culture, were prompted mainly by Leopold von Ranke’s rejection of Hegel’s idealist philosophy of history, with its universal and concept-driven laws of development. It was to be replaced with an empiricist emphasis on documentation of facts through original sources, and, unlike any nomological, generalist, approach characteristic of the natural sciences, an emphasis on the value of individual periods and cultures and human agency. Also cyclical models of history were proposed and rejected.

The idealist tradition was based on the notion that knowledge, especially in the natural sciences, requires conceptual representation and Fichte’s student Emile Lask would speak of the hiatus irrationalis between reality itself and conceptual representation, and would note that, from the latter’s point of view, the former was infinitely complex (Oakes 1991). The general –the standard of understanding in the natural sciences– cannot fully capture the individual in its uniqueness –e.g. a historical hero and event. Moreover, the interpretive role of the historian towards texts, cultural artifacts, brought attention to their authors and human agency more generally.

From the same viewpoint, German historiography soon developed a history sensitive to the plurality of relevant historical dimensions of historical phenomena and their causes Lamprecht, Meyer, Weber and others defended different approaches to cultural history, with attention to collective and institutional entities. Independently, from the idealist tradition and the philological and literary movements, German historiography developed an explicit interest in hermeneutics, emphasizing the role of understanding –after the historical projects of philological studies generally and scriptural interpretations of Biblical texts–; the program was associated with Schleiermacher, Böckh, Weber and Dilthey. Also influential on Neurath on this account were Goethe and Tönnies, who believed in the hold words and concepts had on experience, historical and ordinary.

Goethe’s influence and Neurath’s romantic inheritance are manifest in two areas, morphology and historiography: holism, historical conditioning, role of pictures and metaphorical language in carrying physical theory and argument (ON 1973, 102–3), role of language, and thereby hypothetical elements, in establishing facts (Zemplen 2006). One may add that Neurath’s views fit with the romantic German tradition that emphasized will, life and holism,albeit against pseudorationalism, without metaphysics. Also, in 1908, Neurath appears listed as secretary of the Wiener Goethe Verein in its journal Chronik des Wiener Goethe-Vereins XXII, 39. Also Hans Hahn is listed as member.

Neurath’s doctoral teachers, Meyer and Schmoller, represented the Young German historical school. Neurath’s early work on the history of economics placed him at the center of debates over historiography and the human sciences. He valued (1) empiricism without universal generalizations or laws of development, as well as (2) the synthesis between the subjective and objective, empirical and theoretical, aspects of interpreted materials without metaphysical commitments about the mind, and (3) the interest, found in Meyer and Schmoller, in the plurality of conditions and institutions that may characterize a historical phenomenon or period.

The clear apprehension of different conditions and their relations effectively turn history into a catalogue of combinations out of which (conditional) lessons can be drawn. He would develop this idea in his notions of economic theory and history of science in the form of combinatorial generalizations of the number and kinds of arrangements of possibilities. These would form the conceptual or logical matrix in which to situate the subset of actual empirical historical cases realized (see below).

A precedent Neurath was familiar with was the eighteenth-century Scottish mercantilist James Steuart, who also defended the examination of possible scenarios and “theories” before choosing to apply the most effective course of action to achieve fixed social goals. Other sources of scientific and reformist uses of history were his Wilhelm Neurath’s, although within a spiritualist, teleological normative framework, and Ernst Mach, with his critical, anti-absolutist historical-critical method.

According to Sombart and Weber, the conceptual and interpretive dimension of history raised the issue of its value-ladenness in detriment of its scientific objectivity, particularly in the human sciences, such as political economy. Sombart pointed to the case of the notion of welfare. For Neurath, value judgments enter economic theory in terms of measured subjective pleasure of economic agents; or else in the evaluation of economic orders or plans relative to desiderata under consideration. But in neither case a measure of moral valuation is given by economic, or more generally, scientific theory. Objectivity in science was possibly insofar as it limited itself to description, even in causal terms, of relations to situations to be preferred on external grounds (Neurath 1911).

As a matter of methodology in political economy, Neurath’s interests and education placed him in the middle of the debate over method that separated the German Historical School and the Austrian School, the historical and theoretical approach. The Historical School, whose most visible representative became Gustav Schmoller, defended a historical scope largely for the purpose of applying empirical statistical methods. It was associated with the Verein für Sozialpolitik for the purpose of discussing and providing objective empirical judgment to inform government policy and guide social reform. Schmoller argued that the inductive empirical methodology was more attuned to the complexity of social phenomena and the empirical and academic status of the research and researchers provided a level of neutrality that enhanced objectivity and neutrality in the face of ideological and political conflict (Cat 1996, Lindenfeld 1997, Grimmer-Solem 2003).

The Austrian School, often seen represented by Carl Menger, father of the mathematician Karl Menger, favored a more purely theoretical approach, with conceptual analysis and deductive methods. Neurath defended a meta-methodological neutral stance that rejected the methodological debate as a pseudo-problem and assumed the compatibility and joint applicability of the two kinds of analyses: ‘Historical analyses often provided occasion for more general considerations, while theoretical research promotes the comprehension of organizational forms and induces historians to focus more closely on certain details.’ (Neurath 1911) History was central to both his synthetic theoretical approach and his future-oriented voluntaristic, constructive, reformist attitude.

Subsequent methodological debates between Neurath and Carnap within the Vienna Circle and discussions of logical empiricism often seem to recapitulate some of the traits of the Methodenstreit – with Neurath adopting a synthesis of theory and history that is closer to Schmoller’s attitude under the contextualist rubric of history, in opposition to Carnap’s and Popper’s projects under the rubric of theory (Cat 1995, Cartwright et al. 1996).

Neurath’s economics

Neurath’s contributions to scientific epistemology have their roots in many of his views on economics. Neurath’s historical bend not only led him to the subject of his doctoral and postdoctoral research in economy of antiquity—Cicero and Egypt; it also shaped his pedagogical work and was reinforced by it, with an economics textbook co-edited with his first wife, Anne Shapire, in the form of an anthology of classical readings beginning with Plato and Aristotle. It is from the cultures of antiquity that Neurath gets much inspiration for his economic and social ideas: e.g., Egyptian economy in kind and visual languages (hieroglyphs) and Aristotelian economics of personal and social wealth (beyond money) and the economic value of war as source of income –also Epicurus on happiness more generally. Neurath paid attention to the different roles of money, in history and contemporary debates on monetary economies (Uebel 2004, Mooslechner 2008).

Returning to Vienna after receiving his doctorate in Berlin in 1906, Neurath joined Eugen von Böhm-Bawerk’s postdoctoral seminar, also involving Friedrich von Wieser. There he encountered other young economists such as Ludwig von Mises, Otto Bauer and Joseph Schumpeter.

The Austrian School, especially with Menger and Schumpeter, had developed a quantitative economic theory based on the notion of wealth reduced to exchange value and hence with a focus on market behavior. The ensuing theory was an a priori (hardly empirical psychology), heuristic, model developing the utilitarian calculus of subjective pleasure, the so-called homo economicus model of marginal utility theory: with utility calculations based on precise unitary measures—cardinal, not just ordinal measures of utility value and ordering of preferences—altogether a decision theory, in support of a price theory, in particular, a market equilibrium theory (Tribe 1995 ch. 6, Blaug 1996 and 1997). Rational decision-making, prediction and explanation relied ultimately on monetary calculations based on observable, uniform quantitative units such as prices and a focus on price signaling in market exchanges; losses provide indicators of inefficiency. The assumptions behind the theory relied on controversial and developing areas of empirical psychology, social and political theory and scientific epistemology. By contrast, Marx and energeticists advocated equally uniform and quantitative units of labor.

Neurath challenged crucial assumptions, opposing both money and labor calculations (see Uebel 2004 and Turk 2018). In sum, the representation and comparative evaluation of organized economic totalities could not be reduced, according to Neurath, to uniform units of measurement of elementary constituents. Qualitative measurements of exact qualitative relations provide the only basis for in-kind, natural calculations of value and overall happiness and enable an administrative, unified, holistic model of socialized economy (patterned after wartime command economies maximizing efficiency in the availability and use of resources). The result was a rather inchoate combination of socialism and ecological economics in which the administrative economy is guided by egalitarian principles of distribution in the pursuit of maximum social happiness. From Aristotle and socialist literature Neurath adopted the household economic notion of wealth based on use value and welfare. Economists, he stressed from a consequentialist perspective, are interested in finding out what the conditions of the wealth of people are and which institutions increase it and which decrease it (Neurath 1917/2004, 328). The challenge remained to defend the rationality and objectivity, the fairness of decision-making in the alternative framework. As a personal matter as well as a matter of social justice, economic and political theory required a representation of wealth and its optimal allocation.

Tackling ‘the problem of pleasure maximum’, in the early 1910s, Neurath argued that cardinal measures for comparative utility, or pleasure values, could not be determined for the same individual, much less for different individuals (Neurath 1912/1973). The rejection of cardinality as a framework for representing utility, and wealth, resorted to considerations similar to ones introduced in empirical psychology by Fechner quantitative psycho-physics and more recently Duhem’s conceptual discussion of physical measurement and quantification via the use of scales (Fechner 1860 and Duhem 1906), among them the importance in order to construct cardinal units – and not just ordering relations – of fixing at least a zero point, and establish one end of a scale. Neurath also rejected, independently, the in-principle additivity of utility functions, that is, of pleasures. Despite the exact relations modeled after inequalities and additive operations in algebraic logic, social utility maxima cannot be calculated univocally. Interpersonal comparisons (even for the same individual over time) of utility are not generally available; and when they are, then it is the unitary measures which are not. In conclusion, cardinal unitary measures are not necessary for comparability; and comparability is neither necessary nor sufficient for choice, or, specifically, economic, social or political decision-making, to achieve a desired state of welfare.

Without a unitary measure, and an algorithmic calculation method for decision-making, Neurath was articulating and urging a more general type of framework: a shift from a model of market economy to models of administrative economy [Verwaltungswirtschaft] or economy in kind [Naturalwirtschaft]. Market economy, in any of its varieties, assumes a framework in which ‘people influence each other’s actions exclusively by means of the higher and lower qualities of life that result from the process of exchange’ with the main conditioning factors of profit and loss, and the goals of maximizing the first kind and minimizing the second. An administrative economy can ‘by rewards and penalties, prompt the individuals to do things which they would not have done in an economy characterized by exchange, because without these rewards and penalties the consequences would have been different.’ (Neurath 1917/2004, 321).

The historical geopolitical circumstances of Central Europe in the 1910s and a commission from the Carnegie Endowment for International Peace enabled Neurath to study war economies as empirical realizations of administrative models (Neurath 1919/1973, 123–157). In 1913 he would propose a new discipline, war economics. The goal was to learn from wartime political crises in order to solve peacetime economic crises. The latter he associated with failures of market capitalism, which included not just business cycles but artificial scarcity through waste and underproduction. Neurath drew attention to examples of war economies in antiquity—for instance in Egypt—noting their evolution from monetary exchange and a profit motive to organized barter and a productivity motive. He also became acquainted with economic studies of past wars, including the Napoleonic Wars and the American Civil War, that formed a minor tradition within political economy challenged by rising attention to the economic role of private individual agents. In addition to his familiarity with Aristotle, Neurath was familiar with studies by seventeenth-, eighteenth-, and nineteenth-century authors such as Caspar Klock, Adam Ferguson, Patrick Colquhoun, Joseph Lowe, Henry George, Ludwig Gustav von Gülich, Jakob Reiser and Adolf Jöhr.

The Carnegie Endowment for International Peace Year Book for 1912, lists several Neurath projects to be completed in 1913 and 1914: ‘Austrian and Servian [sic] loans, 1908–09’, ‘Rivalry among states with respect to capitalist investments in foreign countries—Adriatic railway’, ‘circulation of and revenue from private economic property’, ‘Effect of war upon the supply of the world with food and raw material’, ‘Stimulation or depression of nations by war (war and living conditions)’. ‘Influence of annexation upon the economic life of the annexing state and upon the state whose territory has been annexed’, ‘annexation of half-civilized or uncivilized peoples, etc.’, ‘Economic effects of withdrawing men from industrial pursuits to enter the army and navy’, ‘Compulsorily-Austrian labor market, 1866–78–1904’, ‘Non-compulsorily-Austrian labor market, 1866–78–1904’, ‘Loans for armaments—forms of loans’, ‘Effects of war on economic conditions’ (C.E.I.P. Year Book for 1912, 93). Three works by Neurath associated with political economist Eugene von Philippovich of the University of Vienna as economics and history editor listed as indefinitely delayed by the war: ‘The effects of the Balkan wars on Austria-Hungary, with special regard to Serbia, Bulgaria, Roumania, Russia, Montenegro, Albania, Italy, Switzerland and Germany’; ‘War and order of life. The liquidity, productivity and rentability of the wealth of nations in the case of war’; and (with Professor Harald Westergaard, professor of political science and statistics at the University of Copenhagen as editor) ‘Preliminary statistical studies in Old Servia [sic]’ (C.E.I.P.Year Book for 1915, 90).

Neurath had further opportunity to research and help administer war economies during World War I. He was appointed to the Ministry of War, where he headed a new General War and Economics Section of the Scientific Committee for War Economy. Ironically, he briefly counted with the (reluctant) help of Ludwig von Mises.

A war economy planned production and distribution to meet perceived (and calculated) needs during wartime. An economy in kind similarly planned for peacetime. Neurath found in war economies the displayed advantages of speed of decision and execution, optimal distribution of means relative to military goals, and increased evaluation and utilization of invention. Two disadvantages resulting from centralized decision-making might be the ineffective replacement of simple exchanges and the reduction of productivity, which could be reduced, as Lenin learned, through the methods of Taylorism (Tribe 1995, 155). Social and economic theory, and scientific methodology, had become for Neurath matters of theory and of actual practice, of the relation between theory and practice, and, just as important, of a theory of practice (Neurath 1913/1983).

In opposition to the reductive notion of monetary wealth, Neurath’s complex, multi-factorial notion of wealth as happiness distinguished between the notion of quality of life – with its degrees of intensity – and the basis of life. The former is the complex of experiences collected under the rubrics pleasure, happiness and welfare. The latter is ground for the complexes of objective conditions that cause the corresponding subjective experiences and he called conditions of life.

Subjective and objective conditions would be tracked by means of a universal statistics of incommensurable goods, and there were to be portrayed holistically by a life physiognomy: ‘what food the individuals consume per year, what their housing conditions are, what and how much they read, what their experiences are in family life, how much they work, how often and how seriously they fall ill, how much time they spend walking, attending religious services, enjoying art, etc.’ (Neurath 1917/2004, 326). Calculation in kind [Naturalrechnung] would involve a realistic consideration of incommensurable qualitative possibilities, a plurality of individuals, incomplete insight in the face of complexity, and, no less important, the necessity to act. The different possible silhouettes would suggest possible economic plans to choose from.

As a result, calculation in kind required a new form of practical reasoning, one far from the astronomical, Laplacean ideal in science and the Cartesian rationalist and individualistic ideal in philosophy, — which he referred to as “pseudorationality” and he subsequently recognized in Popper’s views. The alternative mode of calculation was based on (a) judgment (‘directly judge the desirability’ of possibilities, Neurath 1919/1973, 146), (b) justification (by showing ‘that it fits into the whole pattern of personal life of which we approve’, Neurath 1928/1973, 249), and (c) extra-logical factors or auxiliary motives. Tossing a coin is just one example of such motives as causes of decisions and thereby of actions (Neurath 1913/1983, 1917/2004); Neurath commended it over choices made ‘with the help of an inadequate metaphysical theory’ (Neurath 1912/1973, 122). A similar role was played by epistemic and social aims such as unity and coordination and economic constraints such as the avoidance of crises of overproduction and artificial scarcity (since Marx’s Capital referred to as the production anarchism, wastefulness, madness or chaos of the market) (Neurath 1917/2004, 322). Neurath’s voluntarism and his arguments anticipated much contemporary discussions of practical rationality under conditions of incomparability and incommensurability (see, for instance, Chang 1997, and O’Neill 2002).

Whereas an economy in kind requires calculation in kind, calculation in kind did not imply economy in kind. Neurath’s initial arguments after World War I were intended to defend economy in kind as a moneyless, marketless economy, where monetary calculations are insufficient and calculations in kind are universal and necessary. This implies the weaker claim against market fundamentalism, namely, that the universality of monetary, or profit-based calculations are the basis for rational decisions about labor and goods. In exile, after the Nazi annexation of Austria, Neurath’s arguments shifted towards the weaker claim (Uebel 2008).

The total dimension of the social and economic plan assumed plurality of people’s interests and their representation. Despite the centralized structure of his planning models, Neurath consistently defended, at least intended, his models to be democratic: first in the sense of representation, which from a technical—scientific and empirical- viewpoint was expressed through statistical surveys and informed citizen participation (hence the relevance of empirical visual languages as vehicles of public education at the service of democracy); second, in the sense of compromise (‘cooperative compromise’), namely, non-additive, negotiated cooperation with the aim of achieving an otherwise impossible state of welfare or order of life; third, freedom to have a multiplicity of loyalties and tolerance towards differences and multiplicity of attitudes -even within one’s own behavior, as ‘a human being full of contradiction’, including conflict with experts and echoing his own rejection in 1913 of a Cartesian logical unity as model for the psychological unity of the self (Neurath 1942/1973, 429)- (on pluralism, see O’Neill 1998 and 2008; also Sandner 2014).

Socialization debates: Political and theoretical developments

Besides the socialist tradition and debates, Austria had its own tradition of scientific utopianism based on Mach’s empiricist interest in energy as fundamental notion and his technological optimism. Leading figures were Josef Popper-Lynkeus and Carl Ballod (known also under the pen-name Ballod-Atlanticus), who proposed plans for the rational, fair and sustainable allocation of exhaustible energy and materials, established through statistical empirical methods to address the capitalist problems (crises) of production and distribution at the root of much poverty, and realized through the notions of a national peacetime work draft, a nutrition army, and the nationalization of distribution (Popper-Lynkeus 1912, Ballod 1898).

The calculations involved statistical surveys and assessments of nutrition and living conditions needs and work hours needed for producing them. Energy and time units were fundamental; time units were the standard cardinal unity of measurement in socialist calculations. One of the classical problems was the so-called imputation problem, of calculating the proportional contribution of production goods in joint production. Marx solved the problem and the parallel problem for consumer goods with the non-subjective labor theory of value, in terms of units of measurement for the amount of labor required for their production. The utopianist contributions went beyond the Marxist model of evolution of capitalism into modeling proposals now categorized as ecological economics (Martinez-Alier 1987, O’Neill 1993 and 2002).

From a technical point of view, scientific utopianism is an approach to social engineering in terms of the exploration of possible constructions for alternative social scenarios. Like mechanical engineering, according to Neurath, these utopian social constructions could be characterized as follows:

(1) They stem from imaginary and conceptual fictions and possibilities (‘the great task of consciously cultivating the future and the possible’); (2) they involve notions of balance and conservation in ‘comprehensive administration of energy and power’, (3) a collective dimension in the role and value of collaboration, (4) contextual and holistic social and historical aspects of thought, language and conventions (‘it is not a single individual who can really think new notions through to the end, but only whole groups or generations. Thinking, too, is a collective occurrence. Thus the Marxist must from the outset keep with a special vigour to historical experience’ Neurath 1928/1973, 293), (5) a pragmatic dimension in decision-making that connects planning with action and transformation of reality (‘successful collaboration id possible only when those who act fix on one possibility, whether by agreement or by propaganda. This choice itself is a matter of action and resolution, but that does not mean’, insisted Neurath, ‘that such action has no scientific basis’ Neurath 1928/1973, 293) and (6) a holistic dimension, insofar as socialization and planning are forms of ‘total organizations’, which must engage the economy as a whole (and from above), (7) in a unified format so that for any such model one may say that a ‘unified program would have coordinated and unified action’ (Neurath 1919/1973, 150–155, and Neurath 1920/1973, 19).

History would provide yet again the opportunity for insight and practice. The end of World War I brought with it the collapse of the German economy, the end of the rule of the Kaiser and his latest conservative government. Caught in the tide of communist revolutionary changes that was sweeping Eastern Europe, two short-lived Soviet republics were declared. In November 1918, the office of the Chancellor was occupied by Friedrich Ebert, a Majority Social Democrat, and under pressure from the now powerful Workers and Soldiers Council movement the new government established a commission to plan a comprehensive socialization of the economy. At the same time, Bavaria and Saxony declared a soviet republic, albeit in Bavaria presided by the Independent Socialist Kurt Eisner. Neurath, crafted a socialization plan for Saxony (the Kranold-Neurath-Schumann plan), and in January 1919 presented his ideas to the new Bavarian government and the Munich workers (Neurath 1973, ch 1, 1–83, Neurath 1920/2004, 345–370, Cat et al 1995, Uebel 2004). He was dismissed by the chairman of the socialization commission and Munich professor of economics, Lujo Brentano, as an ‘ancient-Egyptian romantic economist’ (which in a more interesting sense he was). But his ideas received the support of the industrialist, chairman of AEG, Walther Rathenau. While the assassination of Eisner led to the violent suppression of the Bavarian soviet republic, in March Neurath was appointed president of the central planning office for Bavaria. Carl Ballod was put in charge of calculation in kind. Neurath requested that his position be considered of a nonpolitical administrator as he considered his task as a technical one, with scientific status and ideologically neutrality. After a third, now communist, government’s fall and arrest, the same considerations at his trial (and a statement by Weber) kept him out of prison in 1921, although also out of Germany. He was eventually forced to return to Austria, where he joined the more socially oriented socialization efforts (with a focus on housing, education, etc) led by the Austro-Marxist Otto Bauer, among others, in what had become Red Vienna (Cartwright et al. 1996).

Neurath’s technical model of natural, that is, non-monetary, economics became after World War I a matter of socialist politics and part of the literature on socialization. As a social scientist, his main strategy for linking his work with the Marxist tradition was to defend it alongside Marx’s own work as scientific in character, as examples of social science. A meta-theoretical—epistemological, methodological- perspective resulted from his own familiarity with a number of debates over disciplinary issues in the human sciences, and philosophical issues and positions regarding the natural sciences rooted in Mach’s empiricism and Poincaré and Duhem’s conventionalism, with their own critical, anti-metaphysical, naturalistic and pragmatist connotations.

Neurath’s position sat uncomfortably among a number of economic and political models attempting to develop Marxism, or socialism, as an alternative to monetary market capitalism: Eduard Bernstein’s ethical revisionism and Karl Kautsky’s Social Democratic Marxist orthodoxy and agrarianism, Victor Adler, Max Adler and Otto Bauer and others’ personalist, cultural and non-territorial Austro-Marxism, Karl Korsch’s workers council democracy, Bolshevism’s dictatorship of the proletariat or Rosa Luxemburg’s Spartacism, without parliamentary representation. Unlike market socialists such as Helen Bauer, Neurath rejected the role of money. Unlike orthodox Marxism, Neurath’s central planning rejected the reliance of units of measurement of work and the objective content of price measurements, and economic determinism. His humanist, welfarist, voluntarist, scientific utopianism was an engineered epicurean socialism (closer in spirit to young-Marx’s philosophy) (Neurath 1928/1973, 284–90, Uebel 2004, Sandner 2008). Like the Austro-Marxists, especially the neo-Kantian Max Adler, Neurath rejected a radical materialist, mechanistic and economic reductionism, valuing a plurality of institutions and cultural and educational pursuits. The spirit of pluralism, revisionism and heterodoxy Austro-Marxism introduced in Austrian political culture enabled Neurath’s hybrid, deflationary, critical views. Unlike Bauer and Kautsky, however, or Schmoller’s German Young Historical School and corresponding members of Verein fur Sozialpolitik, he rejected gradual change and partial socialization. Like his father, Wilhelm Neurath, he advocated pan-cartelism, bringing together all industries under government control, without immediate full nationalization (expropriation) or replacement of expert owners and managers with managing workers councils (Cartwright et al 1996, Uebel 1995, Nemeth et al. 2008).

Besides criticisms from the socialist camp, Neurath faced criticism from early defenders of free-market economics: Max Weber, Ludwig von Mises, and Friedrich von Hayek (Lavoie 1985, Chaloupek 1990, Vaughn 1994, O’Neill 1998 and 2008, Steele 1999; Uebel 2004 and 2019; Turk 2018; only O’Neill acknowledges and does some justice to Neurath’s contribution). Neurath was thus drawn into meta-theoretical debates over the rationality, objectivity and informativeness of an economy.

For Weber, discussions of rationality and objectivity were central to his inquiries into the sociology of power and bureaucracy and the nature of scientific disciplines. Weber distinguished between substantive (ends) and formal (means-end, practical) rationality,A planned economy requires a rational plan, and a rational plan requires in turn a method warranting the possibility of determining an outcome in the process of making a decision to take a course of action. Outside the household, with its accounting largely based on the use value of goods, the market of goods with exchange value offers the possibility of using their monetary price as a universal unit of value and calculation of profitability (Weber 1921). This in turn determines the solutions to higher-order calculation problems and, by inclusion, the outcomes of decision-making processes. Moreover, the monetary calculation of profitability is as objective as it is formal and precise.

Mises pointed to commensurability as the root of objectivity of rational calculation of decision of production and allocation of consumption and production goods (Mises 1920/1935 and 1922). Socialism in the form of Neurath’s model of moneyless economy is, then, ex hypothese, the abolition of rational economy (Mises 1920/1935, 110). Mises added a practical objection, in terms of one individual, Robinson Crusoe’s capabilities: ‘No single man can ever master all the possibilities of production, innumerable as they are, as to be in a position to make straightway evident judgments of value without the aid of some system of computation.’ (in Hayek 1935, 102).

Hayek confronted Neurath on the problem of coordination of action in a pluralistic society with dispersed knowledge. Hayek’s criticisms shared the Austrian cognitive (and practical) perspective, in his case to consider the market an efficient and reliable information-communication mechanism but the solution to the coordination problem is non-discursive to the extent that all information is communicated by relative prices. These are the mechanism and information on which rational decision-making and spontaneous coordination and cooperation (catallaxy) would be based (Hayek 1935, O’Neill 1998).

Among Austrians, the debate was fought along a line that distinguished two options only, either monetary market economy or moneyless central planning. But Neurath entered the debate with an altogether different notion of rationality, and of objectivity as well. Recall his distinction between rationality and pseudorationality. The latter ‘treats everything as calculable’ (Neurath 1942/1973, 402) and analyzable and representable by precise formulas. For Neurath, the ‘logical correctness’ of the method is not correlated with its ‘logical precision’ (Neurath 1935/1987, 71–72). Neurath’s solution to coordination and cooperation with pluralism is discursive and humanist. The rationality of central planning is based on the deliberative balancing of possible sets of specific conditions and units that characterize different possible life situations. It is also based on the fact that the choice is somewhat determined by a given specific goal. Here Neurath offered a corresponding boat analogy, this time a battleship from the context of war economy, the original source of empirical data and motivation for his model of moneyless economy (hehd introduced a similar analogy first in 1913):

‘Besides modern commercial activities, military activities have also been rationalized to a very high degree. ‘Success in battle’ is similar to ‘gains in a venture’. Now let us see, e.g., how the captain of a battleship proceeds when he is forced to fight far from home. As commanding officer, he takes into account the course of the ship, the power of the engines, the range of the guns, the stores of ammunition, the torpedoes, and the food supplies, but certainly not the prices of the individual elements. He bases his calculations on numerous specific units which he may even represent to himself in graphic terms, as we can also imagine a graphic representation of the economic plan of a natural macroeconomy. This apparatus, which is rationalized through and through, is composed of people and things, just like an economy, the only difference being that the war apparatus is considered from the point of view of winning a battle and an economy from the point of view of changing life situations…The captain of the battleship does not have a formula which would allow him to think of substituting a number of torpedoes for a canon, or a number of men for an armoured plate. While people readily admit that the military leadership can operate without a general unit, they do not want to make the same assumption for the economic leadership.’ (Neurath 1935/1987, 108)

In 1928 he made a similar methodological point explicitly within the context of economics:

The most careful and conscientious, perhaps statistical, consideration of all circumstances does not give us a unit for calculation. How can one numerically compare, beyond the amounts, things like the protection of man-power with the protection of coal deposits? In spite of the most careful assessment of all quantities, with due regard to numerical estimated coal deposits yet unexploited, one can still not mark each plan by a number obtained through additions and subtractions, etc., and then take the plan which gives the biggest number. Economic plans can be compared only in the way one compares the pears and books; one can prefer one plan to another only on the basis of a total estimate. (Neurath 1928/1973, 263–4)

This total estimate, which constitutes the grounds for rationality, commensurability and decision-making, is based on desired configurations of social and economic goals. Examples of specific economic goals for Neurath are the effective allocation of exhaustible resources, the elimination of under-restricted production and destruction of goods and the misuse of man-power that monetary calculation allows. These goals may be more specific and are always contingent. Empirical data make them available to the people’s representatives and decisions are then reached by common sense after experts have conceived of and proposed a number of informed possible theoretical alternatives:

Comparison between wholes (plans) could not always rest on commensurability of their parts:

The question might arise, should one protect coal mines or put greater strain on men? The answer depends for example on whether one thinks that hydraulic power may be sufficiently developed or that solar heat might come to be better used, etc. If one believes the latter, one may ‘spend’ coal more freely and will hardly waste human effort where coal can be used. If however one is afraid that when one generation uses too much coal thousands will freeze to death in the future, one might use more human power and save coal. Such and many other non-technical matters determine the choice of a technically calculable plan … we can see no possibility of reducing the production plan to some kind of unit and then to compare the various plans in terms of such units…. (Neurath 1928/1973, 263)

The rationality of economic planning is, as it is for science generally, not an arbitrary but a pragmatic matter. It does not lack a model of justification, but Neurath’s model differs from the one adopted by Mises (O’Neill 1998). It is in this sense that Hayek’s subsequent contribution with an emphasis on information as the basis for an argument against central planning redefined the calculation debates. For Neurath, to justify a belief or a decision meant ‘to show that it fits into the whole pattern of personal life of which we approve.’(Neurath 1928/1973, 249) Rationality is thus based on historically and socially contingent values. It is also fallible and equivocal. So, in early as well as in later essays, Neurath dismissed also in the economic context the appeal to pseudorational precise calculations preferred on the mere grounds that they might offer fixed outcomes to be considered the best.

Regarding objectivity, Neurath made clear in ‘What is Meant by a Rational Economic Theory?’ that economic thinking in central planning is committed to a ‘consistently scientific language’ and to ‘objective connections’ (Neurath 1935/1987). This objectivity is provided by the language of physicalism, of material things and structures in space and time, not of physical theory. And it underwrites the generality of the scope of economy in kind, from market goods and maximum profit to the welfare of the population. As he put it, ‘it is precisely the strict physicalists, those who seek to carry out the program of unified science, who have no objections to the concept ‘welfare’.’(ibid., 73) Objectivity and unification go together once again. The unified language of physicalism guarantees the public and social character of knowledge in the form of universal statistics, often neglected or kept secret in capitalist systems. But all this information, in the absence of the market, is the basis of unified central planning. Hence, he stated in 1919, ‘a socialist economy knows no economic statistical secrets.’(Neurath 1919/1974, 141)

Finally, the objectivity of physicalism in the service of central planning without money replaces the quantitative market prices as universal equivalent or general unit with unified yet specific units of kinds of things. Both general and specific units contribute to their objective and scientific nature through the use of numbers. Neurath emphasized that with a universal statistics of specific units ‘ ‘natural calculation’ is applicable in all cases where there is talk of ‘quantities of welfare’.’ (ibid., 72) But this leads to a less reductionistic kind of conceptual unification. Whereas the monetary general unit eliminates important differences among many kinds of goods making them directly commensurable, the use of specific unit allows for a general rational economics respecting heterogeneity among kinds of things such as health and disease, which for Neurath are ‘not objects to be bought and sold.’

This anti-reductionistic attitude enabled Neurath to address Mises’s argument from complexity. But Neurath’s notion of social reality as a complex comprised of entities of different kinds suggests a holistic approach to its description and prediction. Planning and socialization can only take place for the whole and from above. This holistic perspective demands unified knowledge of the whole.

Already in 1919 Neurath pointed out explicitly that successful planning required a unified program. Subsequently, in the broader context of scientific methodology Neurath argued that given the complexity of social phenomena—often involving natural events- successful prediction requires the unity of the sciences at the point of action (Cat et al. 1996 and in Cartwright et al. 1996). Yet, for him understanding of social groups rendered physical knowledge of the behavior of the microscopic material constituents irrelevant. By the time of Neurath’s exile from Nazi Austria, he had come to advocate the weaker notion of calculation in kind over the centrally planned economies in kind. Yet the holistic scientific attitude to planning was not out of his view of governance, whether of society or science. Neurath would still speak in the early 1940s of the ‘orchestration of the sciences, and, correspondingly, in his review of Hayek’s The Road to Serfdom in 1945 he would speak of planning as ‘orchestration of ways of living’ (Neurath 1945, 121). He would also write in 1943 in his essay ‘Planning or Managerial Revolution?’ that ‘sometimes it is less difficult to manage a bigger enterprise as a whole than the smaller units which are its parts.’ (Neurath 1943, 153)

Rationality, objectivity and unity, were for Neurath radically social. Science is linked to society in at least three ways. Neurath, the sociologist, showed through word and work that society falls within scope of application of science. Neurath, the socialist, wanted science, and scientific philosophy, to serve society by promoting freedom and welfare. Neurath, the philosopher of science, argued that science has social structure and values that must be shared by the society to which it belongs. The republic of scientists is not Plato’s republic.

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Jordi Cat <>

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