Notes to Nonexistent Objects

1. This distinction can be interpreted in one of two ways: According to one interpretation, “exists” expresses one mode of being and “there is” another. (For a critique of modes of being distinctions see Reicher 2005a.) According to another interpretation, however, “exists” expresses the only mode of being and “there is” has no ontological import whatsoever.

2. The view that quantification is ontologically neutral is also held by Tim Crane (see Crane 2013, Chap. 2). Some claim that Meinongians (and even Meinong himself) are not ontologically committed to nonexistent objects (see, for instance, Priest 2005). Obviously, whether or not this is correct depends not the least upon the question of what exactly it means to be ontologically committed to something, which leads into a highly subtle, complex and controversial debate that cannot be pursued here. (For a contribution to this debate see Reicher 2005a.)

3. A similar view is held by the 18th century philosopher Thomas Reid (see Reid 1785). Reid’s view is discussed and compared with the views of Brentano, Meinong, Findlay and Anscombe in Prior 1971.

4. Thus, Tim Crane states: “[…] I have come to realize that unless we understand non-existence we cannot understand intentionality” (Crane 2013, ix).

5. There is an alternative paraphrase of “Pegasus doesn’t exist” put forward in Quine 1953: “Nothing pegasizes.” This is the result of transforming the singular term “Pegasus” into the general term “to pegasize”. The point of this is the same as the one of the Russellian paraphrase, namely to get rid of the empty singular term. Quine’s proposal avoids some objections to Russell’s theory (see below); yet it seems that the term “to pegasize” is in need of further analysis.

6. Let’s assume for the moment, in order to get a grip on the problem, that there is no difference between “\(F\)s exist” and “there are \(F\)s”.

7. For other formulations of the predication principle see Kit Fine’s “falsehood principle” (Fine 1981), Plantinga’s “serious actualism” (Plantinga 1983) and Williamson’s “being constraint” (Williamson 2013).

8. This is not the place to enter a discussion about the merits and drawbacks of various versions of Free Logics. It must be sufficient for the present purpose to note that both (EG) and (PP) have an extraordinary degree of prima facie plausibility. Therefore, they should not be given up lightly.

9. Crane (2013) proposes such a “reductionist” solution. For details, see Section 5.1 below.

10. Sometimes, advocates of the story operator strategy use an unspecified story operator “according to a story” (in the sense of “according to one story or another”).

11. Yet, (1′) may be taken to imply

According to the story \(S\): There are flying horses.


According to the story \(S\): Pegasus exists.

These implications, however, are unproblematic, for they do not contradict “There are no flying horses” and “Pegasus does not exist”.

12. A defense of a generalized operator strategy is to be found in Brock 2002. Brock’s operator, however, is not a story operator but something one might call a “theory (or belief) operator”. It reads: “according to the realist’s hypothesis” (where “the realist’s hypothesis” is the assumption that there are fictitious objects). This strategy is not susceptible to the above objection, but it is doubtful whether it does justice to the intuitions that govern realism with respect to fictitious objects. The same holds true of the account in Everett 2005, which says that both authors and literary critics engage in some sort of “pretense”. Both Brock’s and Everett’s position are versions of “fictionalism”. (For more on fictionalism see Section 5.1 below and the entry on fictionalism.)

13. Throughout the whole entry, non-annotated premises are what we take to be prima facie truths.

14. Graham Priest would even deny that 1 (“Pegasus is a flying horse”) implies “There are flying horses”. He would claim, instead, that 1 implies “For some \(x,\) \(x\) is a flying horse”. Whether this is more than a linguistic difference depends, of course, partly on how “there is” is interpreted. (See note 1.)

15. Note that analogous considerations hold for the principle of existential generalization. (EG) had been formulated as

\(Fb \rightarrow \exists x(Fx)\)

and the following reading had been suggested:

If \(b\) is \(F\), then there is something that is \(F\).

This reading can be (and is) accepted by a Meinongian. However, a Meinongian cannot accept

If \(b\) is \(F\), then \(F\)s exist.

16. The idea of fictitious objects as created artefacts occurs for the first time (though presented in an unfamiliar terminology) in Roman Ingarden’s Das literarische Kunstwerk (originally published in 1931; English translation: Ingarden 1973) and then in MacDonald 1954, Ferrater-Mora 1976/77, and van Inwagen 1977. More recently, creationist accounts can be found, among others, in Fine 1984, Salmon 1998, Thomasson 1999, Voltolini 2006, Reicher 2010. For a criticism of creationism see, e. g., Kroon 2011.

17. An anonymous referee drew my attention to the fact that this proposal involves a potentially confusing asymmetry. For if we use “there is” as the neutral quantifier (i.e., as the quantifier that expresses being but not existence), as Meinongians usually do, then, prima facie, “there was” should be restricted to things that were (i.e., had being) at some time in the past, not to things that existed at some time in the past. However, for a Meinongian, it would not make sense to understand “there was” in this way. For, according to the Meinongian, an object can gain and lose existence, but an object cannot gain and lose being. Therefore, the domain of things that had being in the past is co-extensional with the domain of things that have being now. Therefore, if “there was” were used as quantifier for everything that had being in the past, it would not be restricted at all. A Meinongian who is sympathetic to the idea of restricted quantification but wishes to avoid the unpleasant asymmetry pointed out above perhaps could do so by rendering past tense sentences formally as involving an untensed neutral quantifier plus a tensed existence predicate. “Dinosaurs existed” could thus be rendered as “There is an x such that (Dinosaur)x and (Existed)x”, where “there is” is the usual untensed and unrestricted neutral quantifier, and “(Existed)” is a tensed existence predicate.

18. A proponent of a Meinongian solution to the problem of past and present objects is Mark Hinchliff in his dissertation A Defense of Presentism, according to Markosian 2004.

19. For a critical discussion of such a view, see Weinberg 2013. Weinberg argues, convincingly, that “interests are contingent upon existence” and thus, that “[i]f a hypothetically possible person will never exist then there is no real subject for interests at all.” (Weinberg 2013, 473) A related debate concerns the question of whether one can reasonably attribute a certain degree of wellbeing to nonexistent people. (See Herstein 2013. Herstein answers this question negatively.)

20. At least, this is one of the possible interpretations of what the object called “blue” is, according to MOT\(^o\). Alternatively, one might interpret the object blue as \(\iota x\forall F(Fx \equiv B \Rightarrow F)\), i.e., as the object that has all and only those properties that are implied by the property of being blue (like being colored, for instance). It is difficult to decide whether Meinong, in the early version of his theory of objects, intended the object blue to be interpreted one way or the other. Since this question is of merely historical interest, we’ll assume, for the sake of convenience, that according to MOT\(^o\) the first interpretation is the correct one and leave the more complex interpretation for later (see section 5.4).

21. Incomplete objects violate the principle that for every property \(P\) and every object \(x\), either \(x\) exemplifies \(P\) or \(x\) exemplifies the negation of \(P\). But incomplete objects do not violate the principle that for every property \(P\) and every object \(x\), either \(x\) exemplifies \(P\) or \(x\) does not exemplify \(P\) (i. e., the principle of excluded middle). However, Anthony Everett has argued that there may be special cases of fictitious objects which violate the latter principle, which would, if true, constitute a serious objection against fictional realism (see Everett 2005 and 2013). Several authors have defended fictional realism against Everett’s objections by proposing ways to avoid the violation of the principle of excluded middle even in Everett’s examples of outlandish fictions (see Schnieder and von Solodkoff 2008, Voltolini 2010, Milne 2013, Murday 2015).

22. The distinction between complete and incomplete objects resolves certain puzzles in connection with fictitious objects: How many hairs are there in Pegasus’s tail? What was the shoe size of Sherlock Holmes’ grand-grandmother? (We suppose that the respective stories do not give us any hint with respect to these questions.) — The Meinongian answer is simple and plausible: Pegasus is not determined with respect to the exact number of hairs in its tail. Sherlock Holmes is not determined with respect to the shoe size of his grand-grandmother. In general, fictitious objects are highly incomplete.

23. For Russell’s criticism of MOT\(^o\) see Russell 1973a, 1973b, and 1973c. Meinong defended himself in Meinong 1973. His reply to Russell can be plausibly interpreted as an anticipation of a revised version of MOT\(^o\) (see Rapaport 1978), which will be delineated in section 5. For a detailed discussion of the Russell-Meinong debate see Smith 1985, Griffin 1985–86, and Simons 1992.

24. Why can’t one simply say that nonexistent objects have the properties they are characterized as having at the worlds at which they exist? Priest explains that this is not his view, since, according to his brand of noneism, “[t]hey may not exist at such worlds – indeed it may be part of their characterization that they do not exist. Conversely, they may exist at worlds without having their characterizing properties there: there are worlds where Sherlock Holmes exists and is a doctor, not a detective” (Priest 2011b, 249, footnote 35). That is, a nonexistent object that is an existent detective in one nonactual world may be identical to a nonexistent object that is a nonexistent doctor in another nonactual world.

25. For critical discussion of Priest’s theory, see Hale 2007, Kroon 2012, Sauchelli 2012, and the Book Symposium in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 76 (2008), which consists of contributions by Daniel Nolan, Frederick Kroon and, of course, Priest’s replies.

26. Although Priest does not say so explicitly, one might suggest that they have properties like being round in some non-actual world, being a detective in some non-actual world etc. If so, his solution becomes structurally similar to the dual copula strategy. Priest admits “a certain similarity here” in his 2011b (p. 250), but continues his comment as follows:

[T]he accounts are not structurally identical. For one thing, a characterized object may have all sorts of properties at a characterizing world that are not part of its characterization. (For example, Holmes may be either right handed or left handed at a world — though neither of these is in his characterization.) And since they are not part of its characterization, the object does not, according to Zalta, encode them. For another, I claim that characterization can be applied to any condition. To avoid contradiction, Zalta has to say that properties that involve encoding are not allowed to be part of a characterizing property. (ibid.)

The problem of the underdetermination of nonexistent objects in the actual world is also broached in Nolan 2008 (191–193). Nolan argues that this problem is particularly pressing for objects of mathematics. Priest replies to this in his Priest 2008.

27. Priest claims that non-actual worlds themselves are nonexistent objects. This view, together with what has been said above, seems to entail (although Priest does not say so explicitly) that nonexistent worlds are constituted (partly) by existent objects. For Pegasus, for instance, exists in those worlds which are such as described in Greek mythology. Seemingly, it will not do to say that Pegasus does not “really” exist in those worlds (since those worlds are nonexistent), because Pegasus is said literally to have existence-entailing properties in those worlds, and if existence in a nonexistent world were not “real” existence, it seems that, consequently, objects existing in a nonexistent world could not literally have existence-entailing properties.

28. Priest himself discusses this and other problems of the application of his noneism to the topic of fictitious objects in Priest 2011a. Note that Meinongianism in general (understood as the doctrine that there are objects that do not exist) is, in principle, neutral with respect to the question of whether nonexistent objects are necessary or contingent objects. The versions of Meinongianism presented below are compatible with the view that Meinongian objects are created, though this is not the standard view among Meinongians. But Priest’s noneism can in no way accommodate the “creationist” intuition, unless he abolishes the doctrine that the domain of discourse is the same in all possible (and impossible) worlds.

29. Originally, this distinction has been made by Ernst Mally, a disciple of Meinong, and Meinong adopted it for the mature version of object theory. Terence Parsons and Dale Jacquette are two contemporary proponents of this strategy. See Meinong 1972, Parsons 1980, Jacquette 1996, and also Routley 1980.

30. However, there is no complete agreement among advocates of the nuclear-extranuclear distinction as to which properties are extranuclear. In contrast to Parsons, Dale Jacquette classifies intentional properties as nuclear. (Jacquette 1996, 73f.)

31. We use the superscripts ‘\(^n\)’ and ‘\(^e\)’ to indicate whether the properties in question are nuclear or extranuclear.

32. If we set aside the constitutive-consecutive distinction, we may interpret the object called “blue” as \(\iota x\forall F^n(F^nx \equiv F^n = B^n).\) This object has exactly one nuclear property, namely the property of being blue. But this object too has infinitely many extranuclear properties, among them the property of having exactly one nuclear property. Thus the paradox is avoided in the same way as with \(\iota x\forall F^n(F^n x \equiv B^n \Rightarrow F^n).

33. This doctrine raises a difficult question: what is the difference between an extranuclear property and its nuclear counterpart? For a discussion of this problem see Reicher 2005b.

34. However, MOT\(^{ne}\) may be made stronger by assuming that not only there is a nuclear counterpart to every extranuclear property but that there is also an extranuclear counterpart to every nuclear property. (This assumption is made in Parsons 1980, see p. 167.) Of course, this makes the problem of how to distinguish nuclear from extranuclear properties even more pressing. But given that all properties come in nuclear-extranuclear pairs, one might say: The round square exemplifies only nuclear roundness and squareness, while every existent square exemplifies extranuclear squareness. The (nonexistent) golden mountain exemplifies only nuclear goldenness and mountainhood, whereas every existent mountain exemplifies extranuclear mountainhood. One might argue that the principle of contradiction concerns extranuclear properties only and that a thing’s nuclear mountainhood does not entail that the thing can be perceived and is located in space, since a thing that exemplifies only nuclear mountainhood is not a mountain in the usual sense. Such an extension of MOT\(^{ne}\) would bring MOT\(^{ne}\) very close to the dual copula theory (see next section).

35. Like the nuclear-extranuclear distinction, this strategy too has been introduced first by Ernst Mally (see Mally 1912). In contrast to the former, however, Meinong never adopted the dual-copula distinction.

36. Van Inwagen applies this distinction exclusively to objects of fiction (in the narrower sense, connected to the ontology of art), but in its function and spirit it seems to be analogous to the ones of Mally and Castañeda.

37. According to the interpretation adopted here, properties of the form “encoding being \(F\)” can be exemplified by abstract objects only. Alternatively, one might assume that, for instance, an existent “real” human being exemplifies both the property of being human and the property of encoding the property of being human, while something that encodes being human without exemplifying this property must be an abstract object.

38. An anonymous referee suggested to me that fearing the devil might be analogous to fearing a harmless snake that one mistakenly believes to be poisonous: although the devil is in fact abstract (and therefore harmless), those who fear “him” mistakenly believe that “he” is concrete and dangerous. However, I do not believe that this analogy holds. As I see it, those who fear the devil are not intentionally directed at an abstract object that encodes being evil etc. Rather, they are directed at a concrete object that exemplifies being evil. It is not that they mistakenly attribute certain properties to an abstract devil. Rather, they do not have an abstract devil as their intentional object of fear in the first place.

39. Contributions to a discussion of the topics mentioned below are to be found in Reicher 2001 and Reicher 2005b.

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Maria Reicher <>

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