Notes to Pain

1. Although the acceptance is not universal, the remaining controversy seems to relate to its formulation and details, not to its substance. Indeed even those who have been critical of this definition consider it to be an important advance over a conception of pain that the Note, appended to the main definition, warns against. For critical discussion see Melzack (1988), Price (1988, 1999), Fields (1999), Hardcastle (1999). Aydede (2017a) critically surveys the debates surrounding the IASP definition and defends it against criticisms. The term ‘nociceptor’ used in the definition refers to free nerve endings under the skin or innervating other kinds of body or organ tissue that contain receptors relatively specialized to respond to certain forms of noxious (harmful) stimuli.

2. Such syndromes are not restricted to chronic pains felt in phantom limbs after an accident or amputation, nor to referred pains such as feeling pain in one’s left arm due to a heart condition. 40% of all Americans suffer from chronic pains at least once in their lives — there are more that 1500 pain clinics in the US alone devoted to treat such cases and other pain syndromes such as cancer pain. A great portion of these are due to some pathology in the peripheral afferent nerves, or more typically, centrally caused pains (i.e., feeling pain in a particular body region caused by the central nervous system when there is nothing physically wrong in that region). In such cases even though there may be nothing physically wrong in the bodily location where the pain is felt, there is obviously something wrong (or at least, different) with the neural mechanisms that generate such experiences — but this is a different matter. Certain forms of allodynia and hyperalgesia can also be classified under this phenomenon.

3. Indeed some of my students regularly say this when I teach this material and press the question on them really hard. Nevertheless, it is important to note that what follows is shear speculation and should not be taken as part of common sense — indeed it’s not. Commonsense seems content with harbouring the tension between the two threads embedded in it.

4. The term ‘intransitive’ is from Armstrong (1962, 1968). Armstrong contrast these with ‘transitive’ bodily sensations such as feeling the temperature or smoothness of an object, where the experience has a straightforward non-mental perceptual object.

5. Broad (1959) defends one of the most sophisticated versions of a sense-datum theory. Interestingly, however, pains and aches, according to Broad, are less amenable to an act-object analysis. He writes:

It is by no means obvious that a sensation of headache involves an act of sensing and a ‘headachy’ object; on the contrary, it seems on the whole more plausible to describe the whole experience as a ‘headachy’ state of mind. In fact the distinction of act and object seems here to have vanished; and, as there is clearly something mental in feeling a headache, just as there is in sensing a red patch, it seems plausible to hold that a sensation of headache is an unanalyzable mental fact, within which no distinction of act and object can be found. (1959, pp. 254–55)

Perhaps this is so with headaches and other aches that are spatiotemporally very diffuse. But it is not clear whether it is indeed more plausible to make the same claim about acute pains that are temporally and spatially well delineated, such as a sudden jabbing pain in the back of one’s right hand or a pain caused by a pinprick in one’s left thigh, etc.

6. Jackson’s (1976, 1977) is an unabashed and technically sophisticated defense of a sense-datum view in general and of pains in particular. See also Addis (1986) for a similar line. Jackson no longer defends a sense-datum theory: he has recently rejected anti-physicalism and accepted a physicalistic representationalist view similar to the one we will discuss below. See Jackson (1998).

7. H. H. Price (1950) seems to defend this sort of view. He introduces the notion of a ‘sense-field’ according to which “sense-data, though they have places in their own sense-fields, are nowhere” (p. 248). However, Price does not treat pains as sense-data on their own, but rather as “outstanding parts of a sense-datum (namely, of the total somatic one) which display a particularly striking sort of sensible qualities” (p. 232). For Price, when it comes to somatic sensations and feelings, there is only one sense-datum with its own unique somatic sense-field such that all bodily feelings and sensations are qualifications or modifications of it.

8. Perkins (1983) is not a sense-datum theorists, although he is an indirect realist. He dispenses with phenomenal objects in favor of phenomenal qualities that one’s experience instantiates or somehow incorporates. But he still takes the act-object model to be the proper analysis of sensory experience except that the act is now directed toward not a mental object but rather an instance of a quality. Thus, not all indirect realist theories are sense-data theories, but this subtlety, although important for some purposes, won’t make a difference for what follows — but see Sections 3.1 and 3.5 below.

9. Other perceptual theorists (in the direct realist tradition) include McKenzie (1968), Wilkes (1977), Fleming (1976), Graham and Stephens (1985) and Stephens and Graham (1987), Newton (1989), Hardcastle (1997; 1999). For criticisms of some early perceptual views of pain, see Vesey (1964a, 1964b), Margolis (1976), Mayberry (1978, 1979), Everitt (1988), and Grahek (1991). Grice (1962) had already argued that there is a fundamental distinction between bodily sensations and standard perception. See Armstrong (1964), and Pitcher (1978) for replies to some of these criticisms. Holborow (1969) and Pitcher (1969) are criticisms of another perceptual theorist’s work, McKenzie (1968), who claims that ‘pain can be accepted as a sense in the way in which smell is a sense’ (p. 189). For a recent and quite radical defense of a perceptual view of pain, see Hill (2004, 2006, 2009).

10. In what follows, it is useful to denote concepts by capitalized words that name them. So, for instance, ‘RED’ denotes the concept of red which in turn expresses the property of being red. In other words, RED expresses the property of being red, or redness in short. Even though here I assume for convenience a representationalist framework for concepts according to which concepts are mental representations realized in the brain — which is the psychologist’s preferred reading — nothing of any importance hangs on this. The reader may substitute his or her own preferred interpretation of how concepts are to be understood. For instance, concepts may be merely certain sorts of mental or behavioral capacities that are functionally or dispositionally characterized.

11. The following is a sampling. For accounts pre-dating Armstrong and Pitcher, see Baier (1964), Vesey (1965, 1967), Taylor (1965, 1966), Holborow (1966), and Coburn (1966). For more modern discussion, see Holly (1986), Hyman (2003), Wyller (2005), and Bain (2007). There is also an extended debate between Paul Noordhof and Michael Tye about whether the sense in which we locate pains in body parts require special senses of “in” that might not be spatial and whether this is in conflict with representationalism about pain. See Noordhof (2001, 2002, 2006) and Tye (2002, 2006a, 2006b). Olivier (2006) is a critical commentary on the debate between Noordhof and Tye.

12. Pitcher expresses his surprise in the opening paragraph of his influential paper thus:

I shall defend the general thesis that to feel, or to have, a pain, is to engage in a form of sense perception, that when a person has a pain, he is perceiving something. This perceptual view of pain will strike many as bizarre. But sense-datum theorists, at least, ought not to find anything at all odd in it: indeed, I am puzzled why philosophers of that school do not subscribe to the perceptual view of pain as a matter of course. Since I am not a sense-datum theorist, however, but a direct realist, I espouse what must at first appear to be an irremediably perverse position — namely, a direct realist version of the perceptual view of pain. (Pitcher 1970, p. 368)

See the pursuing text for why Pitcher calls his direct realist position an “irremediably perverse position.”

13. Compare the following analogies:

(i) Judy is dancing a waltz
(ii) The smile on John’s face was mischievous

It would be a mistake to analyze these sentences respectively as follows:

(i-a) There is an object that is a waltz such that Judy is standing in the dancing relation to it.
(ii-a) There is a unique object which is a smile and mischievous such that John has stood in the having-on-the-face relation to it.

Rather it is obvious that they should be rendered something like:

(i-b) Judy is dancing waltz-ly.
(ii-b) John was smiling mischievously.

The ontology of (i-a) and (ii-a) seems costlier than that of (i-b) and (ii-b) in that the former require two mysterious particulars in addition to and distinct from Judy and John, whereas the latter require, at least prima facie, only two particulars of familiar sort, Judy and John, and their being engaged in an activity of a certain kind or in a certain manner. The point of adverbialism in philosophy of mind and perception is to use this maneuver with the hope that whatever the true formal semantics of adverbs will turn out to be it will not commit us to strange sorts of particulars: on the whole we feel confident about what is going on ontologically when we express a state-of-affairs by uttering a sentence in which one adverbially qualifies a verb.

So similarly when one is having a bluish after-image, one is not standing in the seeing relation to a certain mysterious particular that is blue in the way sense-datum theories demand. Rather, on adverbialism, one is in a state of experiencing in a certain manner, i.e., blue-ly; this is usually unpacked as being in a sensing state of a certain sort, of the sort one is typically in when one is actually seeing something blue. In other words, ‘blue’ in reporting a blue after-image does not qualify a physical or mental particular that is actually blue, rather it qualifies an activity of the person qua standard perceiver.

The proper formal semantics of adverbs is still a controversial topic in linguistics. But adverbialism is advanced primarily as an ontological thesis in the philosophy of perception, although the issues interact with each other. Also, strictly speaking, it might not be true that adverbialism about perceptual experiences may make do with only one individual, the perceiver. One prominent version of adverbialism is the event modification theory, which quantifies over primitive events and takes adverbs to modify these events — see Davidson (1980). On this view, there are two individuals: the perceiver and the event of her perceiving an object. But many defenders of this view might take this commitment to be innocuous when compared to a commitment of phenomenal objects like sense-data.

For early defenses of adverbialism, see Ducasse (1952) and Sellars (1975). Aune (1967) can be interpreted as a variant of adverbialism explicitly applied to pain. Chisholm (1957) defends a view (the “theory of appearing”) which has close affinities with adverbialism. Kraut (1982), Lycan (1987a), and Tye (1984a) are more recent and technically more sophisticated defenses of adverbialism in general. Tye (1984b) and Douglas (1998) defend adverbialism about pain specifically. The latter is an adverbialist reply to Langsam (1995) who attempts to give an explanation of why we think and talk about pains as mental objects. For powerful criticisms of adverbialism, see Jackson (1975; 1977), Robinson (1994), and Foster (2000).

14. For instance, when Pitcher first introduces the notion of unpleasantness as the reason for why our concept of pain works the way it does (see below), he writes in a parenthetical note:

(When I refer to the act, or state, of feeling pain as an experience, I do not, of course, mean that it is an exclusively mental happening or anything of the sort: I mean ‘experience’ in the sense that riding a bicycle or lying on a rug before a fire is an experience — that is, merely as something that we do or undergo.) (Pitcher 1970, pp. 379–80, italics in the original.)

Perhaps perceptual experiences are not exclusively mental happenings. However, one cannot help but think that they are conscious experiential episodes in a much more robust sense than riding a bike is.

15. Fred Dretske, Michael Tye, and David Bain are probably the best known representationalists about pain and other such bodily sensations. Lycan (1987a, pp. 60–61) contains a brief statement of a representationalist account of pain; however, he does not claim that the affective aspects of pain can also be handled representationally. He seems to have in mind a mixed representationalist-cum-psychofunctionalist theory about pain and other bodily sensations. See below.

16. A naturalist functional role psychosemantics (internalism) may not be out of the question. See Carruthers (2000, Chp. 9) for a representationalist account of pain that comes close to this — what he calls a consumer’s psychosemantics. Rey (1997, Chp. 11) contains an account of sensory experience according to which phenomenal properties are identified with narrow functional roles of sensory states which roles are then identified with the narrow representational content of these sensations. See also White (1986) for a similar narrow functionalist account.

17. Early direct realists like Pitcher and Armstrong, among others, recognized this difficulty and explicitly addressed it. We don’t find a clear acknowledgement in strong representationalists about this difficulty (but see Tye 2006a, 2006b). Hill (2006) contains an extended discussion of this problem, but his solution involves the rejection of the idea that the concept of pain applies to experience: he argues that it applies to tissue damage, appearances notwithstanding — however, see his 2017.

18. Indeed, if they were genuine perception of bodily conditions, they would be very odd forms of perception: nobody seems to have the slightest idea about what they are perceptions of, which is manifested in the fact that we don’t have concepts that apply to what these experiences may be representing. The concepts we have are none other than the concepts TICKLE, TINGLE, which, just like PAIN, don’t seem to track physical conditions of the body parts that they are applied to — they seem to track their experiences.

19. See Price (1999, 2000, 2002, 2017) for an illuminating discussion of such cases and underlying mechanisms. Price draws a distinction between immediate unpleasantness of a pain experience and what he calls pain’s secondary affect, which consists of a conscious cognitive appraisal of the consequences of the pain and its cause, which involves various emotional reactions (e.g., worry, panic, anxiety, arousal, depression, etc.) that typically last longer than the onset of pain. He thinks that pain asymbolia involves cases where both the immediate unpleasantness and the secondary affect are absent, whereas in other cases, although immediate unpleasantness is present, the secondary affect is absent.

There is strong evidence that the disassociation between the sensory vs. affective components of pain also goes in the other direction: in addition to cases where the intensity of sensory component can be reduced without affecting the unpleasantness of the experience (Gracely et al. 1979), there is at least one well documented and studied case where the patient experiences something very unpleasant upon receiving nociceptive stimuli without being capable of identifying his experience as pain (Ploner et al. 1999). It is worth quoting from this study to illustrate the prima facie counter-intuitive results, which provided strong support for the bi-dimensional nature of pain experience:

[At higher intensities of cutaneous laser stimulation] the patient spontaneously described a ‘clearly unpleasant’ intensity-dependent feeling emerging from an ill-localized area ‘somewhere between fingertips and shoulder’ that he wanted to avoid. The fully cooperative and eloquent patient was completely unable to further describe quality, localization, and intensity of the perceived stimulus. Suggestions from a given list containing ‘warm’, ‘hot’, ‘cold’, ‘touch’, ‘burning’, ‘pinprick-like’, ‘slight pain’, ‘moderate pain’, and ‘intense pain’ were denied. (Ploner et al. 1999, p. 213).

In personal communication, Donald Price has indicated an important feature of the findings: the unpleasantness reported by the patient has arisen only when the laser stimulus intensity has reached 350 mJ; that is 150 mJ more than the normal pain threshold established for the normal right hand. As emphasized by Price, this seems to indicate that the disassociation of affect from sensation is not just a matter of a parallel system being shot down, rather it leaves room for a serial interpretation of the interaction between affect and sensation. Price (2002) contains useful discussion of such cases.

20. See Robinson (1982), Jackson (1982, 1986), Chalmers (1996) among others.

21. Perhaps, because unlike what happens in other exteroceptive sensory modalities, there is a huge variability between nociceptive stimuli and pain experiences. This can be taken as evidence that even the sensory-discriminative aspect of pain may not be representational, or may not be entirely representational. A strong representationalist needs to argue for her case in the face of apparent scientific counterevidence — see Hill (2006, 2012) who is sensitive to this issue. For a strong argument against representationalism along these lines, see Pautz (2010).

22. See, for instance, Berridge (1999), and Leknes & Tracey (2008).

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Murat Aydede <>

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