# Skolem’s Paradox

*First published Mon Jan 12, 2009; substantive revision Tue Nov 11, 2014*

Skolem's Paradox involves a seeming conflict between two theorems from classical logic. The Löwenheim-Skolem theorem says that if a first-order theory has infinite models, then it has models whose domains are only countable. Cantor's theorem says that some sets are uncountable. Skolem's Paradox arises when we notice that the basic principles of Cantorian set theory—i.e., the very principles used to prove Cantor's theorem on the existence of uncountable sets—can themselves be formulated as a collection of first-order sentences. How can the very principles which prove the existence of uncountable sets be satisfied by a model which is itself only countable? How can a countable model satisfy the first-order sentence which says that there are uncountably many mathematical objects—e.g., uncountably many real numbers?

Philosophical discussion of this paradox has tended to focus on three main questions. First, there's a purely mathematical question: why doesn't Skolem's Paradox introduce an outright contradiction into set theory? Second, there's a historical question. Skolem himself gave a pretty good explanation as to why Skolem's Paradox doesn't constitute a straightforward mathematical contradiction; why, then, did Skolem and his contemporaries continue to find the paradox so philosophically troubling? Finally there's a purely philosophical question: what, if anything, does Skolem's Paradox tell us about our understanding of set theory and/or about the semantics of set-theoretic language?

- 1. Background
- 2. Mathematical Issues
- 3. Philosophical Issues
- 4. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Background

To understand Skolem's Paradox, we need to start by recalling two
theorems from classical
logic.^{[1]}
The first comes from the late 19th century. In
1873, Georg Cantor formulated a new technique for measuring the
size—or *cardinality*—of a set of objects. Cantor's
idea was that two sets should have the same cardinality just in case
their members can be put into one-to-one correspondence with each
other. So, for instance, the set {1, 2, … , 26} can be put into
one-to-one correspondence with the set {*A*, *B*,
… , *Z* } via the natural map which relates 1 to
*A*, 2 to *B*, 3 to *C*, etc., etc.; similarly,
the set of natural numbers can be put into one-to-one correspondence
with the set of even numbers via the map: *x*
2*x*.

When Cantor applied this conception of cardinality to infinite sets,
he came to the initially surprising conclusion that there are different
kinds of infinity. There are relatively small infinite sets like the
set of even numbers, the set of integers, or the set of rational
numbers. These sets can all be put into one-to-one correspondence with
the natural numbers; they are called *countably infinite*. In
contrast, there are much “larger” infinite sets like the
set of real numbers, the set of complex numbers, or the set of all
subsets of the natural numbers. These sets are too big to be put into
one-to-one correspondence with the natural numbers; they are called
*uncountably infinite*. Cantor's Theorem, then, is just the
claim that there are uncountably infinite sets—sets which are, as
it were, too big to count as
countable.^{[2]}

Our second theorem comes from the early 20th century. In 1915,
Leopold Löwenheim proved that if a first-order sentence has a
model, then it has a model whose domain is
countable.^{[3]}
In 1922, Thoralf Skolem
generalized this result to whole sets of sentences. He proved that if a
countable collection of first-order sentences has an infinite model,
then it has a model whose domain is only countable. This is the result
which typically goes under the name the *Löwenheim-Skolem
Theorem*. Before moving on, it is useful to mention three, somewhat
more refined, versions of this
theorem.^{[4]}

Let *T* be a countable collection of first-order sentences
and let *A* be an infinite set. The *Upward
Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem* says that if *T* has
*any* infinite model, then *T* has a model whose domain
has the same size as *A* (indeed, we can assume without loss of
generality that the domain of this second model just *is*
*A*).^{[5]}
The *Downward Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem* says that if
**N** is a model of (infinite) cardinality κ and if λ is
an infinite cardinal smaller than than κ, then **N** has a
submodel of cardinality λ which satisfies exactly the same
sentences as **N** itself
does.^{[6]}
Finally, the *Transitive
Submodel Theorem* strengthens the downward Löwenheim-Skolem
theorem by saying that if our initial **N** happens to be
a so-called *transitive* model for the language of set theory,
then the submodel generated by the downward theorem can also be chosen
to be
transitive.^{[7]}

Return, now, to the original version of the Löwenheim-Skolem
theorem—the one which simply claimed that any theory which has
*an* infinite model also has a model which is countably
infinite. *Skolem's Paradox* arises when we notice that the
standard axioms of set theory can themselves be formulated as
(countable) collection of first-order sentences. If these axioms have a
model at all, therefore, then the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem ensures
that they have a model with a countable
domain.^{[8]}
But this seems quite
puzzling. How can the very axioms which prove Cantor's theorem on the
existence of uncountable sets be satisfied by a model which is itself
only countable? How can a countable model satisfy the first-order
sentence which “says that” there are uncountably many
things?

These questions can be made somewhat more concrete by considering a
specific case. Let *T* be a standard, first-order axiomatization
of set theory. (For convenience, this entry will focus on the case
where *T* is ZFC, but any standard axiomatization of set theory
would do equally well.) On the assumption that *T* has a model,
the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems ensure that it has a countable
model. Call this model **M**. Now, as *T*
⊢ ∃*x* “*x is
uncountable*,” there must be some
*mˆ* ∈
**M** such that **M**
⊨ “*mˆ*
*is
uncountable*.” But, as **M** itself is only
countable, there are only countably many *m* ∈
**M** such that **M**
⊨ *m* ∈
*mˆ* On the surface,
then, we seem to have a straightforward contradiction: from one
perspective,
*mˆ* looks uncountable, while from another
perspective,
*mˆ* is clearly countable.

This, then, gives us a fairly simple formulation of Skolem's
Paradox. Before turning to look at this paradox's solution, a point
about motivation is probably in order. From one perspective, there's
nothing especially *surprising* about the fact that a particular
model fails to accurately capture every feature of the reality of which
it is a model. A mathematical model of a physical theory, for instance,
may contain only real numbers and sets of real numbers, even though the
theory itself concerns, say, subatomic particles and regions of
space-time. Similarly, a tabletop model of the solar system will get
some things right about the solar system while getting other things
quite wrong. So, for instance, it may get the relative sizes of the
planets right while getting their absolute sizes (or even their
proportional sizes) wrong; or it may be right about the fact that the
planets move around the sun, while being wrong about the mechanism of
this motion (e.g., the planets don't really move around the sun because
some demonstrator turns a crank!). Given all this, it may be unclear
why we should even *expect* first-order models of set theory to
accurately capture the distinction between countable and uncountable
sets. Hence, it may be unclear why we should even think that Skolem's
Paradox *looks paradoxical* in the first place.

Although we'll say more about this kind of issue later (see
especially sections
2.1
and
3.1),
a few preliminary remarks are appropriate here. First, it's important
to note that there are *some* set-theoretic concepts which
first-order models *do* capture quite precisely. As we'll see in
section 3.1, first-order models capture finite cardinality
notions—e.g., “*x* is empty,”
“*x* has two members,” “*x* has
seventeen members,” etc.—quite nicely.^{[9]}
If we
allow ourselves to use infinitely many formulas, then we can also
capture the more-general notion “*x* is
infinite.”^{[10]}
Finally, if we fix our understanding of
membership—i.e., if we restrict our attention to models which use
the real membership relation to interpret the symbol
“∈”—then we can also capture the general notion
“*x* is
finite.”^{[11]}

Given all this, Skolem's Paradox shows that the line between
countable and uncountable sets is, in a fairly deep sense, the
*first place* where our model theory loses the ability to
capture cardinality notions. This fact helps to explain why Skolem's
Paradox may continue to look paradoxical even after we've absorbed the
general points about models and model theory which were presented in
the second-to-last paragraph. In short: it's the very fact that we
*can* capture so many of the cardinality notions which live, as
it were, *below* the countable/uncountable distinction which
makes our sudden inability to capture the countable/uncountable
distinction itself so initially surprising.

Second, Skolem's Paradox does not depend on the specific
axiomatization of set theory that we happen to be working with.
*Any* first-order axiomatization of set theory can have the
Löwenheim-Skolem theorems applied to it, so *every* such
axiomatization is subject to Skolem's Paradox. This means, in
particular, that we can't resolve the paradox by simply choosing a new
axiomatization of set theory (or adding some new axioms to the
axiomatization that we're already using). The fact that Skolem's
paradox is, in this way, *intrinsic* to the first-order
context—that it is an *inescapable* fact about first-order
axiomatizations of set theory—is another reason why Skolem's
Paradox may seem so initially puzzling.

This, then, gives us a first pass at formulating Skolem's Paradox. In the next section, we explain why this simple version of the paradox doesn't constitute a genuine contradiction, and we look at several more-refined formulations of the paradox. In section 3, we turn to historical and philosophical issues. Section 3.1 looks at Skolem's own understanding of his paradox. Sections 3.2–3.4 look at some more-recent attempts to argue that, even though the paradox doesn't constitute a genuine mathematical contradiction, it still tells us something philosophically important about the nature of our understanding of set theory.

## 2. Mathematical Issues

In an introduction to the 1922 paper where Thoralf Skolem first
presented Skolem's Paradox, Jean van Heijenoort writes that the paradox
“is not a paradox in the sense of an antinomy … it is a
novel and unexpected feature of formal
systems.”^{[12]}
This comment reflects the
general consensus on Skolem's Paradox within the mathematical
community. Whatever philosophical problems the paradox is supposed to
engender, it just doesn't constitute a problem *for
mathematics*.

To understand why the paradox doesn't constitute a problem for
mathematics we need to ask two questions. In the simple formulation of
the paradox given above, we noted that there's a specific
*mˆ*
∈ **M** such that **M**
⊨ “*mˆ*
*is
uncountable*.” Literally, of course, this isn't quite right.
What we really mean here is that there's a rather complicated formula
in the language of formal set theory—a formula which
mathematicians sometimes find it convenient to abbreviate with the
English expression “*x* is uncountable”—and
that **M** satisfies this particular formula *at*
*mˆ*.
For convenience, let's denote the relevant formula by
“Ω(*x*).” Then we can rephrase the
fact mentioned above by saying that **M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*].^{[13]}
Our two questions, then, are these:

- Why is it so natural to abbreviate Ω(
*x*) by “*x*is uncountable”? Why, in particular, would anyone even think that the fact that**M**⊨ Ω[*mˆ*] entails that*mˆ*is uncountable? - Why doesn't the fact
**M**⊨ Ω[*mˆ*] really entail that*mˆ*is uncountable?

In effect, the first of these questions asks whether Skolem's Paradox
is *simply* an artifact of our abbreviations, an artifact which
would disappear if Skolem's Paradox were formulated more carefully and
perspicuously. Assuming that it wouldn't so disappear, the second
question asks for a more-detailed explanation of how the paradox can
really be dissolved.

### 2.1 The Appearance of Paradox

There are two ways to approach the first question. On the one hand,
we could start with the formula Ω(*x*), and give
this formula what we might call its “ordinary English”
interpretation. This is the interpretation which lets
“∈” refer to the real set-theoretic membership
relation, which lets “∀” and “∃”
range over the whole (real) set-theoretic universe, and which
interprets “=” and the propositional connectives in the
usual
manner.^{[14]}
Then for any set *m*, Ω(*m*) will come out
true if and only if *m* is
uncountable.^{[15]}
This shows that there is
at least one interpretation of Ω(*x*) under which
this formula really does capture—at least from an extensional
perspective—the ordinary mathematical notion of uncountability.
So, there's at least one interpretation under which
Ω(*mˆ*)
really does say that *mˆ*
is uncountable.

On the other hand, we could start, not with the formula
Ω(*x*), but with the ordinary English sentence
“*x* is uncountable.” If asked what this sentence
means, a set theorist will say something about the lack of a bijection
between x and the natural
numbers.^{[16]}
If asked about the phrase “is a
bijection,” she will go on to talk about collections of ordered
pairs satisfying certain nice properties, and if asked about the term
“ordered pair,” she will say something about the ways one
can identify ordered pairs with particular sets. If she takes this
process far enough—and if she saves herself some time by using
symbols like ¬ and ∃*y* as abbreviations for
“not” and “there exists a set *y* such
that”—then she will eventually obtain a detailed
explication of “*x* is uncountable” which looks just
like the formula Ω(*x*). That is, if we simply
compare the syntax of her explication of “*x* is
uncountable” with the syntax of Ω(*x*), then
we will find that these two expressions contain exactly the same
symbols in exactly the same
order.^{[17]}
Once again, therefore, we find that there's a
real, if a somewhat superficial, similarity between
Ω(*x*) and “*x* is
uncountable”—a similarity which remains even after we stop
using “*x* is uncountable” as a straightforward
abbreviation for Ω(*x*), and a similarity which
explains why even a perspicuously formulated version of Skolem's
Paradox may continue to look somewhat puzzling.

These, then, are two ways of thinking about the relationship between
Ω(*x*) and “*x* is
uncountable.” Together they explain why it's so natural for
mathematicians to use “*x* is uncountable” as an
abbreviation for Ω(*x*) and (so) why someone might
be inclined to think that the fact that **M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*]
should
entail that *mˆ* is
uncountable. They also bring us back to
our second question: why *doesn't* the fact that
**M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*]
really entail that
*mˆ* is uncountable.

### 2.2 A Generic Solution

To answer this second question, it's useful to begin by comparing
the ordinary English interpretation of
Ω(*x*)—the one introduced three paragraphs
ago and the one which really does entail that *x* is
uncountable—with the model-theoretic interpretation of
Ω(*x*) that's given by **M** and
⊨.
Clearly, it's this latter,
model-theoretic interpretation which is most relevant to understanding
the fact that **M**
⊨
Ω[*mˆ*].
Further, it's only if this
model-theoretic interpretation is pretty closely tied to the ordinary
English interpretation—and so, derivatively, to the ordinary
English expression “*x* is uncountable”—that
we will have any real grounds for believing that the fact that
**M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*]
should entail that
*mˆ* is uncountable.

Fortunately, even a rough description of the model-theoretic
interpretation is enough to show that no such “close ties”
exist. The model-theoretic interpretation is obtained by letting the
significance of “∈” be fixed by the interpretation
function of **M**, letting the quantifiers in
Ω(*x*) range over the domain of
**M**, and letting the significance of “=” and
the propositional connectives be fixed by the recursion clauses in the
the definition of first-order satisfaction. This description highlights
two immediate differences between the model-theoretic interpretation
and the ordinary English interpretation.

First, the model-theoretic interpretation understands
“∈” to refer to whatever binary relation on
**M** happens to fall under the interpretation function of
**M**; in contrast, the ordinary-English interpretation of
Ω(*x*) understands “∈” to refer
to the real set-theoretic membership relation. But there is no reason
to think that these two understandings agree with each other. We can
find cases were **M**
⊨ *m*_{1} ∈ *m*_{2},
despite the fact that neither *m*_{1} nor
*m*_{2} are even sets (indeed, as far as the model
theory is concerned, *m*_{1} and *m*_{2}
could both be cats, or rabbits, or hedgehogs, or
…).^{[18]}
Further, even when
all of the elements in **M** *are* sets, this
provides no guarantee that the model-theoretic understanding of
“∈” will agree with the ordinary English
understanding. We can find a case where *m*_{1} and
*m*_{2} are genuine sets, but where **M**
⊨ *m*_{1}
∈ *m*_{2}, despite the fact that
*m*_{1} is not really a member of
*m*_{2}; similarly, we can find a case where
**M**
⊨ *m*_{1} ∉ *m*_{2},
despite the fact that *m*_{1} really *is* a
member of *m*_{2} (and where, once again,
*m*_{1} and *m*_{2} are genuine
sets).^{[19]}

Second, the model-theoretic interpretation understands
“∃*x*” and “∀*x*” to
range only over the domain of **M**, while the ordinary
English interpretation understands these quantifiers to range over the
whole set-theoretic universe. Clearly, these two understandings are
quite different. Further, the differences in question are pretty
closely related to the sorts of sets that are involved in Skolem's
Paradox. Suppose, for instance, that **M**
⊨
“*mˆ*
*is the set of
real numbers*.” Then a simple cardinality argument shows that
there are 2^{ℵ0} real numbers which do not
live in the domain of **M** (and so, in particular, which
do not live in {*m* |
**M**
⊨
*m* ∈
*mˆ* }).
Hence, there's a real
difference between the genuinely uncountable set ℜ and
the merely countable set {*m* | **M**
⊨
*m* ∈
*mˆ* }—between,
that is, the real set of real
numbers and the set of things which **M** merely thinks
are real numbers. On the model-theoretic interpretation of
Ω(*x*), the quantifiers only range over the
latter, smaller set, while on the ordinary English interpretation, they
range over the entire, larger set. Similarly, suppose that
**M**
⊨ “*m is infinite*.” Then we can show
that there are exactly 2^{ℵ0} bijections
*f* : ω → {*m*′ ∈
**M** | **M**
⊨
*m*′ ∈
*m* }.^{[20]}
However, at most countably many of these
bijections live in the domain of **M**. Hence, only
countably many of them are “seen” by ∃*x* and
∀*x* under the model-theoretic interpretation of
Ω(*x*), although all
2^{ℵ0} of them are “seen” under
the ordinary English interpretation.

Taken together, these results suggest that Skolem's Paradox may
simply turn on a surreptitious slide between two different
interpretations of Ω(*x*). Given a countable model
for ZFC, it's the model-theoretic interpretation of
Ω(*x*) which allows us to find an element
*mˆ*
∈ **M** such that **M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*].
But it's only the ordinary-English interpretation which provides us
with any real grounds for thinking that
Ω(*mˆ*)
entails that
*mˆ*
is uncountable. Further, and as we have
just seen, there are enough differences between the model-theoretic
interpretation and the ordinary English interpretation to make us
suspicious of any facile slide between the two (even if we didn't know
that this slide would eventually lead us all the way to Skolem's
Paradox). In particular, then, we should resist any attempt to move
directly from the fact that **M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*]
to the claim that
*mˆ* is uncountable.

In effect, this analysis treats Skolem's paradox as a
straightforward case of equivocation. There's one interpretation of
Ω(*mˆ*)
under which this formula really does entail that
*mˆ*
is an uncountable set; there's
another—quite different—interpretation which ensures that
**M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*];
Skolem's Paradox depends on
confusing these two interpretations. In principle, we should be no more
surprised to find that this confusion leads us astray then we are to
find that our direct deposits aren't buried in the local riverbank.
Indeed the model-theoretic case may be a bit worse than the banking
case: you could get lucky and find buried treasure while digging in the
riverbank, but it's a straightforward theorem that if
**M** is countable, then
{*m* | **M**
⊨
*m* ∈
*mˆ* }
is also countable.

### 2.3 Transitive Submodels

Before turning to examine some of the more-purely philosophical
issues concerning Skolem's Paradox, a few further points about the
paradox's mathematics are in order. First, in order to get a better
feel for *how* the differences between the model-theoretic and
the ordinary English interpretations of Ω(*x*)
actually give rise to Skolem's Paradox, it's worth tracking these
differences through a slightly more refined version of the paradox. We
say that a set **X** is *transitive* if every
member of **X** is a set, and every member of a member of
**X** is also a member of **X** (so,
*y* ∈ *x* ∈ **X** ⇒
*y* ∈ **X**). We say that a model for the
language of set theory is transitive if the model's domain is a
transitive set and the model's “membership” relation is
just the real membership relation restricted to the model's domain (so,
for any *m*_{1}, *m*_{2} ∈
**M**, *m*_{1} ∈
*m*_{2} ⇔ **M**
⊨ *m*_{1} ∈ *m*_{2}). Then, as
noted in section
1,
the *Transitive Submodel
Theorem* says that if we start with *any* transitive model
of ZFC, then we can find a transitive model whose domain is countable
(indeed, we may assume that this countable model is a submodel of the
model with which we started).

Suppose, then, that **M** is a countable transitive
model of ZFC. This has two effects on the analysis of Skolem's Paradox
given in the last section. First, it ensures that the model-theoretic
and the ordinary English interpretations of Ω(*x*)
*agree* on the interpretation of “∈”: for
*m*_{1}, *m*_{2} ∈
**M**, **M**
⊨ *m*_{1} ∈ *m*_{2}
if and only if *m*_{1} really is a member of
*m*_{2}.^{[21]}
In this case, therefore, the explanation of
Skolem's Paradox has to involve the interpretation of the quantifiers.
Second, the fact that **M** is transitive ensures that
**M** gets more than just membership right. In particular,
if *f* and *m* live in the domain of **M**,
then **M**
⊨
“*f* : ω → *m* is a
bijection” if and only if *f* really is a bijection
between the natural numbers and
*m*.^{[22]}

Together, these facts help us to isolate what's really going on in
the transitive submodel version of Skolem's Paradox. Consider again the
formula we've been calling Ω(*x*). This formula
has the form:

Ω(x) ≡ ¬∃f“f: ω →xis a bijection”

Under its ordinary English interpretation, this formula says that the
set-theoretic universe doesn't contain any bijections between the
natural numbers and *x*. In particular,
Ω(*mˆ*)
says that there is no bijection between the
natural numbers and
*mˆ*.
In contrast, the model theoretic interpretation of
Ω(*mˆ*)—the
one which is relevant to the fact
that **M**
⊨ Ω[*mˆ*]—says
only that *the
domain of M* doesn't contain any bijections
between the natural numbers and

*mˆ*.

^{[23]}Clearly, these two interpretations have the potential to come apart.

And in the case of Skolem's Paradox, they actually do come apart.
Since **M** is countable, the set
*mˆ* = {*m* | **M**
⊨ *m* ∈
*mˆ* }
must also be countable. So, there really does
exist a bijection (indeed, 2^{ℵ0}
bijections), *f* : ω →
*mˆ*.
On the ordinary English interpretation of
Ω(*mˆ*),
the quantifiers “see” these bijections, and so
Ω(*mˆ*)
comes out false. What Skolem's Paradox shows
is that **M** itself *does not* contain any such
bijections. Hence, the quantifiers in the model-theoretic
interpretation of
Ω(*mˆ*)
don't see any bijections
between ω and
*mˆ*,
and so
Ω(*mˆ*)
comes out true. In this case, then, differences in the ways the
model-theoretic and ordinary English interpretations of
Ω(*x*) handle the quantifiers provide a perfectly
natural explanation of what's going on in Skolem's Paradox.

This transitive submodel version of the paradox has been widely discussed in the literature (McIntosh 1979; Benacerraf 1985; Wright 1985; Tennant and McCarty 1987). Indeed, several authors have suggested that transitivity may be necessary to formulate a philosophically significant version of the paradox (Benacerraf 1985; Wright 1985). See Tennant and McCarty 1987 for some objections to the latter view.

### 2.4 ZFC, Power Sets, and Real Numbers

The analysis of sections 2.2–2.3 explains in general terms how
a countable model can satisfy a formula like
Ω(*x*) at a particular element. But it may still
leave an obvious question unanswered: how can a countable model *of
ZFC* satisfy such a formula? Granted that an *arbitrary*
model can interpret a formula like Ω(*x*) in a
peculiar manner—how can a model satisfy *all of the axioms of
set theory* while still maintaining this peculiar interpretation?
Shouldn't the fact that **M** satisfies ZFC ensure that
**M** also gets basic set-theoretic notions like countable
and uncountable correct?

The short answer to these questions is this: countable models
“misinterpret” the axioms of set theory just as badly as
they misinterpret the formula Ω(*x*). For the
moment, let's stick with the assumption that **M** is
transitive and consider the power set
axiom:^{[24]}

∀x∃y∀z[z⊆x↔z∈y]

On its ordinary English interpretation, this axiom says that every set
has a power set—a set which contains all and only the subsets of
the set with which we
began.^{[25]}
On its model-theoretic interpretation, however,
the axiom says something much weaker. For any *X* ∈
**M**, the axiom ensures that we can find a *Y*
∈ **M** which contains exactly those subsets of
*X* which also live in **M** (so, *Y* = {
*Z* | *Z* ⊆ *X* ∧ *Z*
∈ **M** }). But if *X* is infinite,
then most of the subsets of *X* *won't* live in the
domain of **M** (since, after all, there are
2^{ℵ0} subsets of *X*, while the
domain of **M** is only countable). So, the *Y*
generated by the model-theoretic interpretation of the power set axiom
will be much smaller than the real power set of *X* (Fraenkel
et al. 1984; Tennant and McCarty 1987; Shapiro 1991; Hallett 1994;
Giaquinto 2002; Bays 2007a).

In this case, then, differences in the ways the model-theoretic and
the ordinary English interpretations of the power set axiom handle the
initial ∀*z*-quantifier—and, in particular,
differences concerning which subsets of *X* get
“seen” by this quantifier—explain how a countable
model can satisfy an axiom which is “supposed to” generate
an uncountable set. And this kind of phenomena is fairly general. In
Resnik 1966, Michael Resnik tracks this phenomena through the case of
the real numbers. As before, assume that **M** is a
countable transitive model of
ZFC.^{[26]}
Then there will be a particular *R*
∈ **M** such that, modulo some abbreviations,

M⊨ “Ris the set of real numbers.”

Resnik notes that, even though **M** satisfies this
formula, *R* doesn't really contain *all* the real
numbers—it only contains those real numbers which happen to live
in the domain of
**M**.^{[27]}
So, the mere fact that *R* is countable
doesn't, in any interesting sense, generate a paradoxical situation in
which the set of *all* real numbers is also countable.

Taken together, these examples highlight a crucial fact: the
“misinterpretations” which explained how a countable model
can satisfy a sentence like
Ω(*mˆ* )
are actually
fairly *systematic*. They also explain how these models can
satisfy sentences like “*R* is the set of real
numbers” or “*Y* is the power set of ω”;
and they even explain how these models can satisfy the axioms of set
theory (e.g., the power set axiom). When enough of these
misinterpretations get put together, they jointly explain how it's
possible for a countable model to both satisfy the axioms of set theory
and, at the same time, maintain the peculiar interpretation of
Ω(*x*) that we discussed in sections
2.2–2.3. In the end, then, while the Löwenheim-Skolem
theorem may still be interesting technical fact—“a novel
and unexpected feature of formal systems,” in van Heijenoort's
words—Skolem's Paradox itself should no longer appear very
paradoxical.

### 2.5 Four Final Points

We close this discussion of the mathematical side of Skolem's
Paradox with four final points. First, the discussion in 2.3–2.4
focused on the transitive submodel case of Skolem's Paradox. This case
is relatively straightforward to analyze, and (so) it's the case that's
been most widely discussed in the literature. But it can also be
somewhat misleading. Much of the analysis of 2.3–2.4 turned on
the fact that transitive models get a lot of things “right”
about the set-theoretic universe (membership, bijections, real numbers,
etc.). Most importantly, if **M** is transitive and
*m* ∈ **M**, then *m* =
{*m*′ ∈ **M**
| **M**
⊨
*m*′ ∈ *m* }.

If **M** is not transitive, however, then nearly all of
this falls apart. Bays has argued that there are versions of Skolem's
Paradox which turn *solely* on the way certain non-transitive
models interpret a few specific instances of the membership relation in
Ω(*x*) (Bays 2007a, sections 4–5). Similar
points would carry over to our discussion of power sets and real
numbers in section 2.4. We can, for instance, find a countable model of
ZFC which contains the whole set of real numbers as a member—the
model remains countable only because
ℜ ≠
{*m* | **M**
⊨
*m* ∈
ℜ} (Benacerraf 1985; Bays 2007a, section 1). In short, although
the generic explanation of Skolem's Paradox that was given in section
2.2—the one which simply notices that there are *some*
differences between the model-theoretic and the ordinary English
interpretations of Ω(*x*) and then chalks Skolem's
Paradox up to *some kind* of equivocation between these two
interpretations—continues to hold up when we move to
non-transitive models, the more-detailed analyses of 2.3–2.4 all
break down. In the general non-transitive case, therefore, the analysis
of section 2.2 may be the best we can do in giving an explanation of
Skolem's Paradox (which is not to say that we can't give more-detailed
explanations in the context of any *particular* non-transitive
model).

This brings us to a second point. Skolem's Paradox depends crucially
upon the fact that we're using a *first-order* axiomatization of
set theory. More precisely, it depends upon the fact that we're using
first-order model theory to interpret this axiomatization. In 1930,
Zermelo proved that (second-order) models of second-order ZFC compute
cardinalities and power sets
correctly.^{[28]}
In particular, then, if **M**
is a model for second-order ZFC and if
*mˆ*
∈ **M**, then **M**
⊨
“*mˆ*
is uncountable” if and only
if {*m* | **M**
⊨
*m* ∈
*mˆ* }
really is uncountable. Hence, Skolem's Paradox doesn't arise in the second-order
context (Zermelo 1930; Shapiro 1991).

This second point shows that Skolem's Paradox goes away if our logic
is strong enough. The third point shows that *weakening* our
logic has a similar effect. In Tennant and McCarty 1987, Tennant and
McCarty show that standard proofs of the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem
fail in constructivist set theory, and they argue that the theorem
itself is probably constructively
invalid.^{[29]}
This means that there's no way to generate
Skolem's Paradox from within the framework of constructivist
mathematics. For constructivists, therefore, as for those who are
willing to countenance second-order axiomatizations of set theory,
Skolem's paradox simply doesn't arise.

Together, these last two points highlight just how central classical first-order logic is to Skolem's Paradox. From a mathematical standpoint, this shouldn't be all that surprising. Lindstrom has shown that the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems play a key role in characterizing first-order logic itself (Lindström 1966; Lindström 1969; Ebbinghaus 2007). Given this, it should be unsurprising that the puzzle that's most closely associated with these theorems also turns out to be tied pretty closely to the peculiarities of the first-order situation. Although, as we've seen, the paradox doesn't constitute a straightforward mathematical contradiction, it does help us to understand the nature and limits of classical first-order logic.

This brings us to a final point. The above discussion explains why
those of us who are willing take a naively realistic attitude towards
the language of set theory—e.g., those of us who have no qualms
about expressions like “the ordinary English interpretation of
Ω(*x*)”—should remain untroubled by
Skolem's Paradox. It's important to emphasize that this analysis
*also* explains why Skolem's Paradox doesn't introduce
contradictions into various forms of axiomatized set theory, even when
these axiomatizations are themselves understood formalistically or
model-theoretically. From a proof-theoretic standpoint, for example,
there is a difference between unrelativized quantification and
quantification which has been explicitly relativized to some formula in
our language (where this formula is one that, from an intuitive
perspective, serves to “pick out” the domain of countable
model of ZFC). So, there's no *a priori* reason to think that a
sentence with unrelativized quantifiers will conflict with that
sentence's fully-relativised
counterpart.^{[30]}
Similarly, from a model-theoretic
perspective, there is a difference between quantifiers which range over
the whole domain of a model and quantifiers which only range over the
“elements” of some particular member of the model (where,
once again, this member is one which the larger model
“thinks” is a model of ZFC). So, although the naive realism
of sections 2.1–2.4 is useful for expository purposes, it's not
essential to the underlying analysis of Skolem's Paradox.

## 3. Philosophical Issues

The last section explained why Skolem's Paradox does not constitute
a problem for mathematics. This, of course, has not kept philosophers
from arguing that the paradox *does* constitute a problem for
philosophy. In this section, we explore several attempts to derive
philosophical conclusions from the mathematics surrounding Skolem's
Paradox. Before doing so, however, two cautionary notes are in order.
First, many of the more provocative discussions of Skolem's Paradox are
quite brief—amounting to little more than suggestive comments
made in passing. Hence, much of the discussion of these comments will
have to be somewhat conjectural. Second, many critical discussions of
Skolem's Paradox have focused simply on working carefully through the
paradox's mathematics and then explaining why the paradox doesn't
constitute a genuine mathematical contradiction. Since this material
was already covered in section 2, we won't say any more about these
issues in this section.

### 3.1 Skolem's Views

In the 1922 paper where he originally presented Skolem's Paradox, Skolem used the paradox to argue for two philosophical conclusions: that set theory can't serve as a “foundation for mathematics” and that axiomatizing set theory leads to a “relativity of set theoretic notions” (Skolem 1922). These claims, and Skolem's arguments for them, have attracted considerable attention in the literature. Unfortunately, Skolem's paper is quite compressed, and so it's difficult to determine exactly what these claims were really supposed to amount to. At present, there are three interpretations of Skolem's paper which have some currency in the philosophical literature.

Let's begin with Skolem's claim that axiomatizing set theory leads
to a relativity of set-theoretic notions. One way to understand this
claim is to view it against the backdrop of what we might call an
*algebraic* or *model-theoretic* conception of
axiomatization. On this conception, the axioms of set theory serve to
characterize—or perhaps even to implicitly define—basic
set-theoretic notions like set, membership and set-theoretic universe.
So, a *set-theoretic universe* is simply a model for the axioms
of set theory, a *set* is simply an element in some
set-theoretic universe, and *membership* just refers to whatever
binary relation a particular universe uses to interpret the symbol
“∈.” On this conception of axiomatization, then, the
axioms of set theory should not be seen as attempts at
describing—or even partially describing—some antecedently
given “intended model” of set theory; instead, the intended
*models* of set theory are simply those models which happen to
satisfy our initial collection of set-theoretic
axioms.^{[31]}

We should emphasize, here, that this algebraic conception of
axiomatization would have been quite familiar to mathematicians working
at the time Skolem wrote his 1922 paper. Skolem himself was trained
in Schröder's algebraic school of logic, so this would have been
the natural way for him to think about axioms. But even people who
weren't trained in Schröder's school would have found the
conception familiar. It's the conception which lay behind Hilbert's
famous axiomatization of geometry (about which Hilbert reputedly
claimed, somewhat notoriously, that we can replace points, lines, and
planes with tables, chairs, and beer mugs as long as the latter objects
stand in the right kinds of relations). It's also the conception which
lay behind the 19th-century results that arithmetic and analysis can be
given categorical (second-order) axiomatizations. Finally, and most
importantly, it's the conception of axiomatization which Skolem
attributes to Zermelo in the very paper that we're currently
discussing, and so it's the conception of Zermelo's axioms that Skolem
is primarily concerned with
criticizing.^{[32]}

Given this algebraic conception of axiomatization, then, Skolem
appeals to the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems to argue that the axioms
of set theory lack the resources to pin down the notion of
uncountability. Given any first-order axiomatization of set theory and
any formula Ω(*x*) which is supposed to capture
the notion of uncountability, the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems show
that we can find a countable model **M** which satisfies
our axioms. As in section 1, therefore, we can find an element
*mˆ* ∈
**M** such that **M**
⊨ Ω(*mˆ*) but
{*m* | **M**
⊨
*m* ∈ *mˆ* } is only
countable. Thus, as long the basic set theoretic notions are
characterized simply by looking at the model theory of first-order
axiomatizations of set theory, then many of these notions—and, in
particular, the notions of countability and uncountability—will
turn out to be unavoidably
relative.^{[33]}

This, then, provides the content of Skolem's claim that axiomatizing
set theory leads to a relativity of set-theoretic notions. It is
important, here, to distinguish this claim from a more trivial claim
which Skolem might be thought to be making. From one perspective, the
algebraic conception of axiomatization leads to an *obvious*
form of relativity: the elements which count as sets in one model may
not count as sets in another model, the membership relation of one
model may be different than the membership relation of another model,
and this latter difference in membership relations may hold even if the
two models happen to share the same domain. On this trivial notion of
relativity, therefore, almost everything turns out to be relative, even
simple notions like “*x* is the empty set” or
“*x* is a singleton.” After all, an object could be
a “singleton” in one model while being a
“doubleton” in another model, or it could be “the
empty set” in one model while being omitted entirely from another
model's domain.

It's important to emphasize that Skolem's own notion of relativity
is more sophisticated than this. Let's grant that the specific element
which serves as “the empty set” will not remain constant as
we move from one model of set theory to another—with the empty
set in the first model becoming, perhaps, a singleton in the second.
Nonetheless, we can still use a formula in the language of set theory
to capture the notion “*x* is the empty set” in an
essentially absolute way. In *any* model of our axioms, an
element *mˆ* ∈
**M** will satisfy the
open formula “∀*y y* ∉ *x*”
if and only if the set {*m* | **M**
⊨
*m* ∈
*mˆ* }
is really empty. Hence, there's at least
*a* sense in which we can still capture the notion
“*x* is the empty set” from within the algebraic
framework. And this point extends more widely—a similar argument
would apply to notions like “*x* is a singleton” or
“*x* has seventeen members.” Even on the algebraic
conception of axiomatization, therefore, there are some set-theoretic
notions which we can still pin down pretty precisely. What the
Löwenheim-Skolem theorems show is that, no matter how rich our
(first-order) set-theoretic axioms may be, we cannot use this kind of
technique to pin down the notion “*x* is
uncountable.” This is the result which lies behind all of
Skolem's talk about “relativity,” and it's a result which
highlights a genuine weakness in the algebraic approach to
set-theoretic
axiomatization.^{[34]}

To summarize, then, the upshot of this discussion is this:
*if* we take a purely algebraic approach to the axioms of set
theory, then many basic set-theoretic notions—including the
notions of countability and uncountability—will turn out to be
relative. In Skolem's words: “axiomatizing set theory leads to a
relativity of set-theoretic notions, and this relativity is inseparably
bound up with every thoroughgoing axiomatization” (Skolem 1922,
p. 296). Of course, this still leaves open the question of whether
these notions are, as it were, *absolutely relative*—of
whether there is some other, non-algebraic and non-thoroughgoing, way
of understanding our axioms which does not lead to the sort of
relativity we've just been discussing. It's when we turn to this latter
question that the various interpretations of Skolem's paper begin to
come apart.

The most traditional interpretation of the paper sees Skolem as
mounting a straightforward attack on set theory. Skolem starts his
paper by noting that the classical set-theoretic paradoxes should lead
us to be skeptical of informal understandings of set theory—of
“naive reasoning with sets,” to use Skolem's own
expression. Given this, our only real option is to fall back on some
form of axiomatized set theory, and the only respectable way to
understand our axioms is algebraically (since understanding them
intuitively would amount to falling back into our previously
discredited naiveté). But Skolem's Paradox shows that
set-theoretic notions are relative on the algebraic conception of
axiomatization. So, these notions are *really* relative. In
short: the classical paradoxes show that the algebraic conception of
set theory is the best conception we've got, and so Skolem's Paradox
shows that set-theoretic notions are unavoidably relative. This
traditional reading of Skolem is quite prevalent in the folklore;
variants of it are discussed in Hart 1970, McIntosh 1979, Muller 2005,
and Bellotti 2006.

The second interpretation focuses on Skolem's claim that set theory
cannot provide an adequate foundation for mathematics. In particular,
Skolem thinks that set theory lacks the resources to provide a
foundation for ordinary arithmetic—on his view, arithmetic is
“clear, natural and not open to question,” while set theory
itself is far more problematic. To *show* that set theory is
problematic, Skolem runs through a number of different ways of
interpreting set theory—naive set theory, axiomatized set theory
construed proof-theoretically, axiomatized set theory construed
algebraically, etc.—and he argues that each of these
understandings of set theory is inadequate for foundational purposes.
On this reading, then, Skolem's Paradox plays only a modest role in
Skolem's overall argument. It serves to highlight some problems with
one particular conception of set theory (the algebraic conception), but
it plays no role in Skolem's arguments against other conceptions of set
theory. Further, these other arguments do not show—or even
purport to show—that the various non-algebraic conceptions of set
theory lead to any kind of relativity (although they do, of course,
have other problems which render them unsuitable for foundationalist
purposes).^{[35]}
Versions of this foundationalist reading of Skolem's paper can be found
in George 1985 and Benacerraf 1985; see Jané 2001 for some
criticisms of this line of interpretation.

The final interpretation of Skolem's argument comes in a paper by Ignacio Jané (Jané 2001). Jané's reading agrees with the traditional interpretation in taking Skolem to be mounting a fairly general attack on set theory—and, in particular, on the notion of an absolutely uncountable set. But it agrees with the foundationalist interpretation in that it takes this attack to be mounted piecemeal, with Skolem's Paradox itself playing only a modest role in one prong of the attack. Very roughly, Jané thinks that Skolem is trying to show that there is no rigorous way to initially introduce the notion of an uncountable set into mathematics. The set-theoretic paradoxes show that we should not naively take Cantor's Theorem at face value—so, Cantor's proof itself doesn't force us to accept uncountable sets. Skolem's Paradox shows that adopting an algebraic understanding of the set-theoretic axioms also doesn't force us to accept uncountable sets, since we can always interpret these axioms as applying to a model that's only countable.

Of course, as Jané notices, there are a number of strategies
that we could use to evade this application of Skolem's Paradox: we
could use uncountably many axioms to force our models to have
uncountable domains, we could appeal to the Upward
Löwenheim-Skolem theorem to show that Zermelo's axioms
*also* have uncountable models (see section
1),
or we could move to a second-order version of Zermelo's axioms and then
prove that these axioms can *only* be satisfied by models with
uncountable domains (see section
2.5).
Unfortunately, each of these strategies presupposes that we already
have a prior grip on the notion of an uncountable set—e.g., to
initially characterize an uncountable set of axioms, to formulate the
Upward Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, or to prove that second-order ZFC
has only uncountable models. So, none of these strategies can be used
to *introduce* uncountable sets into mathematics in the first
place. Or so, at any rate, Jané takes Skolem to be arguing.

These, then, are the three main interpretations of Skolem's paper in
the literature. Without taking a stand on which of these
interpretations best captures Skolem's own intentions, we note that
most of Skolem's *contemporaries* interpreted him as giving
something like the “traditional” argument described above
and that their responses to Skolem's Paradox reflected this
interpretation. Zermelo himself came to accept the algebraic conception
of his axioms, but he then insisted that these axioms should be
interpreted in second-order terms and that, so interpreted, they do not
fall prey to Skolem's Paradox (Zermelo 1930; Taylor 1993; Ebbinghaus
2003). Similarly, Tarski suggested that Skolem's Paradox could be
defused by treating “∈” as a logical constant in some
version of type theory (see the remarks published at the end of Skolem
1958). But, while both of these suggestions would allow mathematicians
to avoid Skolem's Paradox, they both depend on accepting pieces of
powerful mathematical machinery which Skolem—on *any*
reading of his paper—would almost certainly have wanted to
reject. Given Skolem's *philosophical* purposes, therefore,
these contemporary responses to his paradox would not have seemed very
threatening (see Skolem 1955 and Skolem 1958 for some of Skolem's own
reflections on these kinds of responses).

### 3.2 Skolemite Skepticism

Over the years, there has been a small but steady stream of
philosophers and logicians who have found what we've called the
traditional interpretation of Skolem's paper philosophically
compelling—i.e., compelling as an independent philosophical
argument and not just as an interpretation of Skolem's paper. Their
view, which Michael Resnik has dubbed the “Skolemite” view,
holds that the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems really do show that
set-theoretic notions are relative. Indeed, Skolemites are often
willing to go a bit further than this and claim that, although a given
set may be uncountable “relative to the means of expression of an
axiom system,” *every* set is countable when considered
from an “absolute” perspective (Kneale and Kneale 1962;
Goodstein 1963; Wang 1964; Fine 1968; Thomas 1968, 1971).

In this section, we isolate the key idea behind some classical developments of these Skolemite claims, and we then consider some of the responses to them which have appeared in the recent literature. (In section 3.3, we consider an interesting new approach to the Skolemite position.) We start with the Skolemite argument itself. Very roughly, this argument comes in three steps. First, it argues that the algebraic conception of set theory is the only respectable conception for contemporary mathematicians and philosophers to adopt. Second, it follows Skolem in arguing that the algebraic conception of set theory leads to a relativity of set-theoretic notions. Finally, it extends Skolem's argument to defend the strong form of relativity mentioned at the end of the last paragraph—i.e., the one under which every set turns out to be countable when it's considered from an “absolute” perspective.

For our purposes, the second step in this argument has already been
considered in enough detail in the context of our discussion of Skolem;
so we'll simply recap the main points here. On the algebraic conception
of set theory, basic set-theoretic notions are characterized by looking
at the model theory of first-order axiomatizations of set theory.
Notions which remain fixed as we move from model to model—in the
sense of “fixed” that we discussed in the last
section—have an “absolute” significance; notions
which vary as we move from model to model have only a
“relative” significance. Given this, the
Löwenheim-Skolem theorems show that the notions of countability
and uncountability will in fact vary as we move from model to model. On
the algebraic conception of set theory, therefore, these notions are
only
“relative.”^{[36]}

This brings us to steps 1 and 3 in the Skolemite argument. Step 1 is
where different versions of this argument display the most variability.
In some cases, step 1 is simply presupposed, so it's hard to get a feel
for how the underlying *argument* is really supposed to go
(Kneale and Kneale 1962; Goodstein 1963; Wang 1964). In other cases,
it's suggested that any rejection of the algebraic
conception—and, in particular, any move to simply take
expressions like “all sets” or “is really
uncountable” at face value—amounts to falling back on an
unacceptably naive form of “Platonism” (Fine 1968; Thomas
1968, 1971; Klenk 1976). In still other cases, Skolemites follow
Skolem's lead and appeal to the set-theoretic paradoxes to bolster
their rejection of Platonism; they then suggest that the abandonment of
Platonism leaves the algebraic conception of axiomatization as the only
viable alternative (Klenk 1976).

There's another strategy that's available here: some authors have
defended the Skolemite position by using *other* puzzles about
the interpretation of mathematical language—i.e., puzzles other
than Skolem's Paradox—to motivate the initial move from Platonism
to the algebraic conception. So, for instance, Klenk has argued that we
can parley one of Benacerraf's classical puzzles—that presented
in Benacerraf 1965—into this kind of an argument (Klenk
1976).^{[37]}
Similarly, Wright has appealed to Wittgensteinian considerations
concerning the relationship between meaning and use to motivate a
limited Skolemite position (Wright 1985). Finally, several authors have
suggested that the whole development of twentieth-century set theory
tells in favor of the algebraic approach—after all, the entire
history of the subject has been a move *away* from naive
approaches to set theory and *towards* formal axiomatization
(and especially first-order axiomatization). See, Klenk 1976 for this
last kind of analysis.

Turn, now, to the third step in the Skolemite argument. The
mathematical theorem which underlies this third step is clear. Let
φ(*x*) be a formula which is supposed to define a
unique set—e.g., “*x* is the power set of
ω” or “*x* is the set of real
numbers.”^{[38]}
Then we can find a model **M**
⊨ ZFC and an element *m*
∈ **M** such that **M**
⊨ φ(*m*) and
{*m*′ ∈ **M**
| **M**
⊨
*m*′ ∈ *m* } is only countable. So, if
we're willing to concede that all it takes to *be*, say, the
power set of ω is to satisfy the relevant defining formula in
some model of set theory, then we can make sense of the claim that at
least one instance of the power set of ω is “really”
countable. If we are willing make the further assumption that it only
takes *one* bijection to *one* such instance of the power
set of ω to render the power set itself “absolutely”
countable, then we can understand the Skolemite's strong claim about
absolute countability. Of course, neither of these two final moves
*follows* in the strict sense from the algebraic conception of
axiomatization; but they are both moves which a proponent of the
algebraic conception might well find congenial.

This, then, gives us the basic structure of the various Skolemite
arguments. Before turning to some responses to these arguments which
have appeared in the recent literature, it is important to be clear
about the role that Skolem's Paradox itself can and cannot play in
these arguments. At times, it appears as though some Skolemites think
that the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems *by themselves* show
that there's a problem with our ordinary conception of sets: so, the
theorems show that set-theoretic notions are relative, relativity is
incompatible with our ordinary conception of sets, and so our ordinary
conception of sets has to be abandoned (Kneale and Kneale 1962;
Goodstein 1963). It should be clear from section 2, however, that this
line of argument has no chance of succeeding. The analysis in section 2
shows that those of us who are willing to take a naively realistic
attitude towards set theory—or, for that matter, those who take
more sophisticated stances which rest on the iterative conception of
sets and/or some form of second-order structuralism—will have no
problems with Skolem's Paradox. Hence, the paradox *itself*
cannot force us to abandon our ordinary conception of sets.

Instead, the successful Skolemite needs to follow the basic approach
set out at the beginning of this section. He begins with an independent
argument for the algebraic conception of set theory—i.e., an
argument which would lead us to abandon the ordinary conception of sets
in favor of the algebraic conception, and (crucially) an argument which
does not itself turn on issues relating to Skolem's Paradox. Once this
preliminary argument is complete, the Skolemite can then proceed to
*use* the algebraic conception of sets (plus, of course, the
Löwenheim-Skolem theorems) to defend the claims about
set-theoretic relativity that are made in steps 2 and 3 of his
argument.

Two further comments about this approach are in order. First, we
should note that this approach provides the Skolemite with a response
to the kinds of arguments that we made in section 2. In particular, it
allows him to challenge our all-too-naive use of expressions like
“the ordinary English understanding of
‘∈,’ ” “the real members of
*mˆ*,”
“quantifiers which range over the
*whole* set-theoretic universe,” etc. Given an independent
argument against the ordinary conception of sets, the Skolemite is not
going to be too impressed with a “solution” to Skolem's
Paradox which turns on the naive employment of these kinds of
expressions. See Thomas 1968, 1971; Klenk 1976.

Second, we should note that, although this approach requires the
Skolemite to start with an independent argument against our ordinary
conception of sets, it need not render the Löwenheim-Skolem
theorems themselves completely superfluous. After all, it's still a
*theorem* that set-theoretic notions like countability and
uncountability come out relative on the algebraic conception. This
isn't something which happens to all set-theoretic notions—e.g.,
“*x* is the empty set” or
“*x* has seventeen members”—and it's
not something which just drops out from the algebraic conception of
axiomatization.

That being said, this is a place where the Skolemite has to be
rather careful. Unless the considerations raised in step 1 of his
argument are pretty closely tied to the details of the algebraic
conception—and tied in a way which makes that conception
genuinely attractive as a *positive* understanding of set
theory—the Skolemite's larger argument is threatened with a
certain kind of rhetorical triviality. After all, once the Skolemite
has the resources to push us to the algebraic conception of set
theory—as in step 1 of his argument—then he also has the
resources to *directly* undermine our ordinary conception of
sets, and to do so without bringing Skolem's Paradox itself into the
discussion. If this is right, then the Skolemite's larger argument
could well amount to criticizing ordinary set-theoretic notions for
being “relative” in a rhetorical context in which the
Skolemite has *already presented* far stronger criticisms of
these notions in the course of defending the initial step in his
argument. That would be more than a little bit
awkward.^{[39]}

To avoid this kind of awkwardness, we think that the Skolemite
should frame his argument, less as a criticism of our ordinary
set-theoretic notions, and more as a constructive analysis of the
algebraic conception of set theory. That is, he should focus primarily
on defending the algebraic conception of set theory as an
*independently plausible* conception of set theory (step 1), and
he should then present set-theoretic relativity as simply a new and
surprising consequence of this positive conception (steps 2–3).
This argumentative strategy leaves room for the Löwenheim-Skolem
theorems to do some real philosophical work—e.g., as described
two paragraphs ago. It also gives step 1 a tighter—and a more
constructive—focus. On this reading, step 1 serves mainly to
highlight the positive virtues of the algebraic conception; criticizing
ordinary set-theoretic notions is (at best) a secondary
concern.^{[40]}
(See section 3.3 for more on this kind of point.)

This brings us to the criticisms of the Skolemite argument which
have appeared in the recent literature. Three general *forms* of
criticism are worth mentioning. First, a number of authors have
responded to the Skolemite argument by simply slowly and carefully
unpacking the mathematics surrounding the Löwenheim-Skolem
theorems so as to show that these theorems themselves cause no problems
for even quite naive understandings of set theory (Resnik 1966;
Benacerraf 1985; Bays 2007a). While this kind of response is effective
against the simplistic version of the Skolemite argument that we
discussed six paragraphs ago, it does very little against the more
sophisticated arguments that we're currently considering—i.e.,
arguments which *start* with an independent criticism of such
naive
understandings.^{[41]}
Given this, and given that we've already
discussed this kind of response in some detail in section 2, we'll say
no more about it here.

Second, several authors have responded to the Skolemite argument by
directly criticizing the algebraic conception of set theory and
defending more ordinary and intuitive understandings of set-theoretic
language (Myhill 1967; Resnik 1969; Hart 1970; Benacerraf 1985). There
are three issues which we should highlight here. First, it's hard to
see how the algebraic conception could provide a *general*
account of mathematical language, given that the conception itself
seems to presuppose an intuitive background theory in which to
formulate and prove our model-theoretic results (e.g., the
Löwenheim-Skolem theorems). This issue is exacerbated when we
focus on the third step in the Skolemite argument, since that step
seems to require both an absolute account of the natural numbers and an
absolute account of enumeration in order to formulate its conception of
“absolute countability” (see Resnik 1969; Benacerraf 1985;
and Shapiro 1991; see Thomas 1971; Klenk 1976; and Bellotti 2006 for
some concerns about this line of argument).

Note, here, that these initial points seem to tell against using any
completely *general* criticism of mathematical realism to push
people towards the algebraic conception of axioms. On the surface,
after all, any sufficiently general criticism of realism would apply to
the Skolemite's own model theory as much as it does to classical set
theory. It's doubtful, therefore, whether the Skolemite can really
appeal to, say, simple worries about “platonism” or about
our epistemic access to mathematical objects to motivate a full-blown
Skolemite position. In short: the very fact that Skolemite arguments
turn on substantial *mathematical* theorems seems to force the
Skolemite into accepting that some parts of mathematics are not subject
to Skolemite relativity. (In addition to the references in the last
paragraph, see Bays 2001; Bellotti 2005; and Bays 2007b for discussion
of this kind of point in the context of Putnam's model-theoretic
argument.)

Of course, this first argument leaves open the possibility that set
theory is a special case—that, even though some branches of
mathematics, like number theory and analysis, should be understood
absolutely, set theory, like group theory and topology, should still be
understood algebraically. Unfortunately, there are a number of obvious
differences between the practice of set theory and that of more-clearly
algebraic subjects like group theory. So, for instance, mathematicians
tend to treat the axioms of set theory as being less *fixed*
than those of group theory or topology. In set theory, mathematicians
sometimes raise the question as to whether the ZFC axioms are
correct—i.e., they talk as though there is an intuitive notion of
set against which the ZFC axioms might be checked and found wanting. In
group theory and topology, by contrast, it simply makes no sense to
talk about “intuitive notions” which could diverge from the
notion specified by the relevant
axioms.^{[42]}
In a similar vein, set theorists sometimes
debate whether we should add new axioms to the standard axioms of set
theory—e.g., large cardinal axioms, or axioms like V=L, or even
just axioms like Con(ZFC). In contrast, no one would dream of making
additions to the axioms of group theory or topology. In this sense,
then, an algebraic approach to set theory is *revisionary* of
set-theoretic practice in a way that an algebraic approach to group
theory is not.

Finally, even if we do accept an algebraic conception of set
theory—perhaps because we have a larger commitment to some kind
of structuralist philosophy of mathematics—it's unclear why this
commitment requires us to limit ourselves to *first-order*
axiomatizations of set theory. After all, many of the most successful
instances of the algebraic approach to axiomatization—e.g., the
19th-century results that arithmetic and analysis can be given
categorical axiomatizations—turn on using a second-order
background logic. And, as we noted in section 2, second-order versions
of ZFC do not give rise to Skolem's Paradox. Hence, it's not enough for
Skolemites to defend *an* algebraic approach to the
axiomatization of set theory, they need to show that a
*first-order* algebraic approach is the right way to go. See
Hart 1970 and Shapiro 1991 for developments of this line of
argument.

So much, then, for *general* criticisms of the algebraic
conception of axiomatization and its role in the Skolemite argument. We
turn now to a more-focused objection to the third step in that
argument. For the sake of argument, let's grant that the Skolemite has
shown that our set-theoretic notions are relative and that, for every
kind of set that we can define with a formula, there is *an*
instance of this kind of set which is only countable. So, there is
*a* countable instance of the power set of ω, *a*
countable instance of the real numbers,
etc.^{[43]}
Still, it's unclear why
this shows that *every* set is “absolutely”
countable. After all, just as the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem shows
that we can find countable instances of all these sets, the
Upward-Löwenheim-Skolem theorem shows that we can also find
uncountable instances.

Given this, a number of critics have suggested that Skolemites face
two explanatory burdens and that, so far, no Skolemite has managed to
meet these burdens. First, the Skolemite needs to explain how we can
identify sets across different models—i.e., why we should
consider the various different objects which satisfy
“*x* is the power set of ω” in
different models of set theory to be “the same set.” Note
that some such identification is essential if the Skolemite is going to
start with a proof of the countability of one of these objects and then
use this proof to argue for the absolute countability of all the others
(Resnik 1966). Second, the Skolemite needs to explain his preference
for countable sets. Even if the Skolemite can identify countable and
uncountable “instances” of a given set, he needs to explain
why this identification leads to the conclusion that all sets are
“absolutely countable” rather than to the conclusion that
all sets are “absolutely uncountable” (Resnik 1966;
Benacerraf 1985).

These, then, are the main criticisms of the Skolemite position which
have appeared in the literature. To treat them more thoroughly would,
unfortunately, require us to dive pretty deeply into questions
concerning, e.g., the status of our informal understanding of
set-theoretic language, the legitimacy of second-order quantification,
and the identity conditions associated with mathematical objects in
structuralist philosophies of mathematics. Exploring *these*
issues would take us pretty far away from Skolem's Paradox itself. For
a recent survey of some of the relevant literature here, see Bellotti
2006.

### 3.3 The Multiverse

Over the last decade, the set theorist Joel Hamkins has been arguing
for a conception of set theory which bears a surprising resemblance to
the traditional Skolemite position (though Hamkins' own motivations
seem to come more from set theory itself than from the traditional
philosophical literature). Hamkins notes that, as set theorists have
developed more and more powerful tools for constructing and comparing
different models of set theory—forcing, inner model theory,
large cardinal embeddings, etc.—they have become less and less
likely to treat any particular model as cannonical. Instead, set
theory has increasing come to focus on comparing *different*
models of set theory, rather than singling out one model as
priviledged. Hamkins argues, therefore, that set theorists should
accept what he calls a “multiverse” conception of set
theory—a conception in which *no* model of set theory is
privileged, and the purpose of set theory is simply to explore the
relations between the various models.

This multiverse conception is clearly related to the algebraic
conception discussed in
sections 3.1–3.2.
Further, it satisfies one of the key desiderata that we isolated in
section 3.2. Hamkins defends the multiverse as an
independently plausible conception of set theory, and he argues that
the motivation for accepting it comes from within mathematical
practice. (I.e., Hamkins does not argue that, because forcing
extensions are *possible*, we are *stuck* with
set-theoretic relativity; rather, he argues that, because forcing
extensions are *natural*, we should *embrace*
set-theoretic relativity.) In this sense, something like the
multiverse could well constitute the “right” way of
developing the algebraic conception.

Further, the multiverse conception leads naturally to the kinds of
conclusions traditional Skolemites tended to favor. Let *a* be
a set in some model **M** (where **M** lives
somewhere in the multiverse). Then **M** has a forcing
extension, **M[G]**, in which *a* is only
countable. This provides a natural gloss on the Skolemite claim that
“every set is countable from some perspective.” Similarly,
the Skolemite's bias in favor of countability (see
section 3.2) can be explained by the fact that,
if *a* is countable in one model **M**, then it
stays countable in all extensions of that model. In contrast,
uncountable sets can always be made countable by passing to an
appropriate forcing extension. For more on the multiverse, see
Hamkins 2011 and Hamkins 2012. For some criticisms, see Koellner 2013
(under Other Internet Resources).

### 3.4 Putnam's Model-Theoretic Argument

In recent years, the most widely discussed version of Skolem's
Paradox has come come in (one version of) Hilary Putnam's so-called
“model-theoretic argument against realism.” Putnam's
*general* goal in the model-theoretic argument is to show that
our language is semantically indeterminate—that there's no fact
of the matter as to what the terms and predicates of our language refer
to. In the case of set theory, therefore, he wants to show that there's
no single set-theoretic universe over which our quantifiers range and
no single relation to which the word “membership” refers.
In Putnam's own terms, there is no single “intended model”
for the language of set theory.

In the first few pages of his 1980 paper, “Models and
Reality,” Putnam argues that there is at least one intended model
for the language of set theory which satisfies the set-theoretic axiom
V=L.^{[44]}
To show
this, Putnam begins by assuming that there are only two things which
could play a role in fixing the intended model for set-theoretic
language. First, there are what Putnam calls “theoretical
constraints.” These include the standard axioms of set theory, as
well as principles and theories from other branches of science. Second,
there are “operational constraints.” These are just the
various empirical observations and measurements that we make in the
course of scientific investigation.

Given these assumptions, Putnam argues that finding an intended model which satisfies V=L simply requires finding a model of ZF+V=L which satisfies the relevant theoretical and operational constraints. His strategy for finding this model rests on the following theorem:

Theorem:ZF plus V=L has an ω-model which contains any given countable set of real numbers.

Here, the fact that this model satisfies ZFC is supposed to ensure
that it satisfies all of the theoretical constraints which come from
set theory itself, while the richness of ZFC ensures that the model
also has the resources to code up our best scientific theories (and
thereby to satisfy all of the theoretical constraints which come from
natural science). Finally, the fact that this model contains an
arbitrary set of real numbers ensures that it can code up all of the
various observations and measurements which constitute our
“observational
constraints.”^{[45]}
So, as long as Putnam is right in thinking
that the intended models of set theory are fixed solely by the formal
structure of our scientific theories—including our explicit
set-theoretic axioms—and by the physical measurements that we
happen to make, then this theorem will generate an intended model in
which V=L comes out true.

This version of the model-theoretic argument has three connections
to Skolem's Paradox. First, Putnam himself presents the argument as a
natural development of the paradox. At the beginning of his paper,
Putnam provides a quick sketch of Skolem's Paradox, and he then
suggests that his analysis of V=L comes from taking Skolem's arguments
and “extending them in somewhat the direction he [Skolem] seemed
to be indicating” (p 1). Second, and as evidenced by the passages
quoted in footnote
44,
Putnam's overall
conclusions fit well with more-recent Skolemite understandings of
Skolem's Paradox—see, e.g., his conclusion that V=L has no
“determinate truth value” (p 5) or that Skolem's
“ ‘relativity of set-theoretic notions’
extends to a relativity of the truth value of
‘V=L’ ” (p 8). Finally, and most importantly,
the proof of Putnam's theorem turns crucially on the
Löwenheim-Skolem theorems. (Very roughly, Putnam starts by
applying the downward Löwenheim-Skolem theorem *to* L, so
as to prove that his theorem holds *in* L; he then employs
Shoenfield absoluteness to reflect the theorem back up to
V.)^{[46]}

Putnam's argument has received a number of kinds of criticism in
the literature. On the technical front, Bays has argued that Putnam's
use of the downward Löwenheim-Skolem theorem is illegitimate,
since standard systems of set theory do not allow us to apply this
theorem to a proper class like L. Indeed, even if we leave the details
of Putnam's *proofs* aside, Gödelean considerations show
that Putnam's *theorem* cannot be proved in ZFC at all (since
the theorem entails ZFC's consistency). Of course, if Putnam is willing
to use a stronger background theory to prove his theorem—e.g.,
ZFC + “there exists an inaccessible cardinal”—then he
can evade these kinds of criticisms. But in this case, it's unclear why
the model which results from Putnam's theorem should still be thought
to satisfy our theoretical constraints. After all, anyone who accepts
the new axioms used in Putnam's revised proof will have theoretical
constraints which go somewhat beyond ZFC + V=L—e.g., their
theoretical constraints might well include the axiom “there
exists an inaccessible cardinal.” See Bays 2001 for Bays'
original formulation of this objection; see Velleman 1998 and Gaifman
2004 for some alternate formulations; see Bellotti 2005 and Bays 2007b
for critical discussion; and see chapter 3 (esp. § 3.3.3) of
Hafner 2005 for discussion of a similar point concerning Putnam's use
of transitivity.

Button (2011) has argued that, although this kind of technical criticism has teeth against the version of Putnam's argument which explicitly invokes the downward Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, there are alternate formulations of Putnam's argument which can evade the criticism. In particular, Button notes that even very weak theories can prove theorems like: “if ZFC is consistent, then ZFC has a countable model.” Since any proponent of ZFC must accept that ZFC is consistent, these weak theories are enough to get several variants of Putnam's argument off the ground. See Button 2011 for development of this point. See Bellotti 2005 and Bays 2007a for discussion of a somewhat similar point.

Staying in the technical vein, several authors have noted a tension
in the way Putnam's argument deals with the notion of finitude. On the
one hand, Putnam needs to use this notion in order to characterize his
model as an ω-model and (even) to make sense of the formal
definitions of a first-order language and of the first-order
satisfaction
relation.^{[47]}
On the other hand, Putnam can't allow opponents
of his argument to use this notion to specify what *they* think
makes a model intended. If his opponents could use this notion, then
they could define the notion of a model's being
“well-founded,” and that would be enough to rule out the
models generated by Putnam's theorem. In this sense, then, Putnam's
argument seems to turn on an unmotivated asymmetry between the kinds of
technical machinery that he himself uses and the kinds of machinery
that he makes available to his critics. See Bays 2001 and Bellotti 2005
for developments of this point; see § 3.4 of Hafner 2005 for some
critical reflections.

On the more-purely philosophical side, many authors have criticized
Putnam's assumption that simply satisfying a first-order formalization
of our theoretical constraints is enough to make a model
“intended.” So, for instance, Hacking has argued that we
should really be committed to a second-order formulation of set theory
and that Putnam's key theorem doesn't apply to such formulations
(Hacking 1983). Others have argued that the intended model for set
theory needs to be transitive and that, once again, there's no reason
to believe that the model produced by Putnam's theorem *is*
transitive (Bays 2001). Finally, and as mentioned in the last
paragraph, several authors have suggested that an intended model for
set theory should at least be well-founded, but there's no reason to
think that Putnam's own model *is* well-founded (Bellotti
2005).

Putnam's response to this kind of objection is interesting. Very
roughly, Putnam suggests that any conditions on intended models which
other philosophers might propose—e.g., those mentioned in the
last paragraph—should themselves be formalized in first-order
terms and treated as new theoretical constraints. When these new
constraints are fed back through Putnam's argument, he will once again
be able to generate a model which “satisfies” these
constraints. So, by simply adopting a particularly flexible reading of
the phrase “theoretical constraints,” Putnam ensures that
almost *any* conditions on intended models can simply be folded
back into his original argument (Putnam 1980; Putnam 1983,
vii–xii).^{[48]}

This argument—which is usually called the “just more
theory” argument—has received a huge amount of attention in
the literature. The most common response to the argument involves
drawing a distinction between *describing* the features of a
model which make that model intended and simply *adding new
sentences* for that model to satisfy. Put otherwise, it involves
distinguishing between *changing* the semantics under which our
axioms get interpreted—e.g., by restricting the class of
structures which count as models for our language and/or strengthening
the notion of satisfaction which ties sentences to models—and
simply *adding new axioms* to be interpreted using the same old
semantics. The response then goes on to argue that proposals like those
discussed two paragraphs ago—e.g., that intended models should be
transitive or well-founded or satisfy second-order ZFC—should be
understood as falling on the description side of this distinction
rather than on the “adding sentences” side (although the
latter is where Putnam's just more theory argument resolutely insists
on putting them).

In turn, Putnam has argued that this kind of response begs the
question against his overall argument. Putnam's argument, after all,
concerns the question of whether our mathematical language has any
determinate significance, and the response we're considering seems to
simply *assume* that it has such significance when the response
uses phrases like “transitive,” “well-founded,”
or “complete power set of **M**” to describe
its notion of “intended model.” In short: as long as the
determinacy of mathematical language is still at issue, it would beg
the question to make free use of this language in describing the
intended model of set theory. Or so, at any rate, Putnam tries to
argue.

As indicated above, this aspect of Putnam's argument has generated a huge literature. See Devitt 1984, chapter 11; Lewis 1984; Taylor 1991; Van Cleve 1992; Hale and Wright 1997; Chambers 2000; Bays 2001; and Bays 2008 for some representative criticisms of Putnam's argument. See Putnam 1983, vii–xii and Putnam 1989 for Putnam's response. See Anderson 1993; Douven 1999; Haukioja 2001; and Kroon 2001 for some recent defenses of this aspect of Putnam's argument.

## 4. Conclusion

We close this entry with a brief recap of two of the main points
that we've tried to emphasize. First, from a purely mathematical
standpoint, there's no conflict between Cantor's Theorem and the
Löwenheim-Skolem Theorems. There's a technical solution to
Skolem's Paradox which explains why the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorems
pose no problems for either naive forms of set-theoretic realism or
various forms of axiomatized set theory. Hence, there's no chance of
using the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems *by themselves* to
generate substantial Skolemite conclusions. Of course, there are still
some interesting technical issues which live in the neighborhood of
Skolem's Paradox. For example, we can look at how the paradox plays out
in the context of particular first-order models; we can examine the
degree to which various kinds of non-first-order logic are susceptible
to the paradox; and we can try to isolate the precise features of
first-order logic which allow the paradox to apply to it. Each of these
topics is clearly related to Skolem's Paradox, and each raises
questions about the relationship between model theory and set theory
which are well worth exploring. But, considered simply in and of
itself, Skolem's Paradox poses no threats to classical set theory.

Second, if we come to Skolem's Paradox with antecedent doubts about
classical set theory—e.g., the kinds of doubts which lie behind
some of the more sophisticated reconstructions of Skolem's original
argument, the kinds of doubts which lie behind the more plausible
versions of step 1 in the Skolemite argument, or the kinds of doubts
about semantic determinacy which lie behind Putnam's model-theoretic
argument—then we may well be able to parley Skolem's Paradox into
some kind of interesting philosophical conclusion. Of course there will
still be challenges here: we need to account for the status of the
background theories in which we prove the Löwenheim-Skolem
theorems, we need to explain the special significance of
*first-order* axiomatizations of set theory, and we may need to
explain how we can identify elements across various models of set
theory. In principle, however, these kinds of sophisticated uses of
Skolem's Paradox are not precluded by the technical solution to the
paradox that was mentioned in the last paragraph. Nor should this fact
be all that surprising: if we put enough philosophy into our analysis
of Skolem's Paradox, then we should expect to get at least a little
philosophy out.

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## Other Internet Resources

- The Löwenheim-Skolem Theorems, by Peter Suber.
- Skolem's Paradox up close and personal, by Vaughan Pratt.
- Koellner, P., 2013, “Hamkins on the Multiverse,” manuscript.