Epistemological Problems of Perception

First published Mon Dec 5, 2016; substantive revision Tue Mar 14, 2023

The central problem in the epistemology of perception is that of explaining how perception could give us knowledge or justified belief about an external world, about things outside of ourselves. This problem has traditionally been viewed in terms of a skeptical argument that purports to show that such knowledge and justification are impossible. Skepticism about the external world highlights a number of epistemological difficulties regarding the nature and epistemic role of experience and the question of how perception might bring us into contact with a mind-independent reality. The issues that arise are of central importance for understanding knowledge and justification more generally, even aside from their connection to skepticism.

Two main types of response to the skeptical argument have traditionally been given: a metaphysical response that focuses on the nature of the world, perceptual experience, and/or the relation between them, in an effort to show that perceptual knowledge is indeed possible; and a more directly epistemological response that focuses on principles specifying what is required for knowledge and/or justification, in an effort to show that skepticism misstates the requirements for knowledge.

Much of the philosophical tradition has viewed the central epistemological problems concerning perception largely and sometimes exclusively in terms of the metaphysical responses to skepticism. For that reason, these will be addressed before moving on to the more explicitly epistemological concerns.

1. The Problem of the External World

The question of how our perceptual beliefs are justified or known can be approached by first considering the question of whether they are justified or known. A prominent skeptical argument is designed to show that our perceptual beliefs are not justified. Versions of this argument (or cluster of arguments) appear in René Descartes’s Meditations, Augustine’s Against the Academicians, and several of the ancient and modern skeptics (e.g., Sextus Empiricus, Michel de Montaigne). The argument introduces some type of skeptical scenario, in which things perceptually appear to us just as things normally do, but in which the beliefs that we would naturally form are radically false. To take some standard examples: differences in the sense organs and/or situation of the perceiver might make them experience as cold things that we would experience as hot, or experience as bitter things that we would experience as sweet; a person might mistake a vivid dream for waking life; or a brain in a vat might have its sensory cortices stimulated in such a way that it has the very same perceptual experiences that I am currently having, etc.

All this suggests a “veil of perception” between us and external objects: we do not have direct unvarnished access to the world, but instead have an access that is mediated by sensory appearances, the character of which might well depend on all kinds of factors (e.g., condition of sense organs, direct brain stimulation, etc.) besides those features of the external world that our perceptual judgments aim to capture. Paraphrasing David Hume (1739: I.2.vi, I.4.ii; 1748: sec 12.1; see also Locke 1690, Berkeley 1710, Russell 1912): nothing is ever directly present to the mind in perception except perceptual appearances.

But if our only access to the external world is mediated by potentially misleading perceptual appearances, we ought to have some assurance that the appearances we are relying on are not of the misleading variety. And here is where all the trouble arises, for it seems that there is no way we could have any evidence for the reliability of perception (i.e., perceptual appearances) without relying on other perceptions. We have empirical reason, for example, to think that science is not yet capable of stimulating brains in a very precise way, but appealing to this to rebut the possibility of brain-in-a-vat scenarios seems blatantly question begging. At the heart of the problem of the external world is a skeptical argument referred to here as “PEW,” one possible reconstruction of which follows. The premises are named, as we will want to discuss them individually.

  1. Nothing is ever directly present to the mind in perception except perceptual appearances. (Indirectness Principle) Thus:
  2. Without a good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs. (Metaevidential Principle)
  3. We have no good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical. (No-Good-Reason Claim)
  4. Therefore, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs.

A few comments on the logic of the argument are in order. (2) and (3) make up the meat of the argument; together they entail (4). This means that (1), which is motivated by the skeptical scenarios mentioned above and the associated veil of perception view, would be unnecessary for deriving the skeptical conclusion, as are those skeptical scenarios, were it not for the fact that (1) is commonly taken to render perception inferential in such a way as to lend support to (2). If (1) is true, then, plausibly, (2) is: if our access is mediated by potentially nonveridical appearances, then we should only trust the appearances we have reason to think veridical. And no other reason to endorse (2) is immediately apparent (although an additional motivation for (2) will be discussed below, in section 3.1.1). (1) is therefore an important component of the traditional problem. The plausibility of (3) derives from the idea that our only means of verifying the veridicality of appearances would itself depend on perception, in the question-begging manner sketched above.

Notice that PEW addresses justification rather than knowledge. On the reasonable assumption that knowledge requires justification, (4) implies that our perceptual beliefs do not count as knowledge. One who denies this assumption could easily rewrite PEW in terms of knowledge rather than justification with little or no reduction in plausibility. PEW has been reconstructed here in a way that is supposed to be intuitively compelling. Were we to get specific about the implicit quantification involved (we have no good reason for thinking that any perceptual appearances are veridical? that perceptual appearances are in general veridical? that this perceptual appearance is veridical?), the argument would get a lot more complicated. The simpler version presented above is sufficient for our current purposes.

The problem of the external world should be distinguished from what is typically called the problem of perception (see the entry on the problem of perception), even though they are motivated by similar considerations, in particular, by the Indirectness Principle. The problem of perception is the problem of how perception is possible—how it is possible, for example, to see mind-independent objects, rather than inferring them from awareness of sense-experiences, in light of the claim that only appearances are ever directly present to the mind. The problem of the external world is a distinctively epistemological problem, and it focuses on the normative status of perceptual judgments about external objects; it matters little for these purposes whether and how such judgments might amount to seeing. What matters is whether such judgments are or could be justified.

PEW illustrates the central problem of the epistemology of perception: if many or any of our perceptual beliefs are justified, PEW must have gone wrong somewhere. But where? Several subsidiary problems in the epistemology of perception arise in the efforts to solve this central problem.

2. Metaphysical Solutions to the Central Problem

The Indirectness Principle is a metaphysical principle: it says something about the nature of perception. The Metaevidential Principle and the No-Good-Reason Claim are epistemic principles: one lays down specifically normative requirements for justified belief and the other denies that these requirements are satisfied. Because PEW can be challenged by denying any of the premises, there are two main classes of solution to the central problem: metaphysical solutions, which challenge the Indirectness Principle; and epistemological solutions, which challenge the Metaevidential Principle and/or the No-Good-Reason Claim. This section addresses the first class of solutions to the central problem. Section 3 addresses the second class.

PEW starts with the Indirectness Principle, and it has often been thought that the central skeptical worry is due to a metaphysics of perception that holds that, although worldly objects do exist outside of the mind, they are never directly present to the mind, but only indirectly so, through mental intermediaries. Thomas Reid, for example, held that “Des Cartes’ system, which I shall beg leave to call the ideal system, … hath some original defect; that this skepticism is inlaid in it, and reared along with it” (1785: 1.vii). Consequently, a great deal of philosophy since Descartes has involved various attempts to block PEW by doing away with the intermediaries between the mind and the objects of perception, by offering a metaphysics of perception that puts these objects directly before the mind. If perception is direct in the relevant sense, then the skeptical problem never even gets off the ground.

There are two main branches to this tradition. The more obvious and commonsensical one originates with Reid (1764, 1785) who insists that physical objects and their properties can be directly present to the mind as well as mental objects can. This is the direct realist option. Earlier on the scene, however, is a tradition tracing back to George Berkeley (1710, 1713), which agrees with Descartes that only mental items are directly present to the mind but which holds that the objects of perception—tables, rocks, cats, etc.—are really mental items after all. This is the idealist/phenomenalist option. Despite the manifest differences between realist and idealist metaphysics, both branches of the “direct presence” tradition are united in rejecting the Indirectness Principle, insisting that tables and such are indeed directly present to the mind in perception. If perception is thus direct, the Indirectness Principle is false, and support for the Metaevidential Principle is undercut, and PEW ceases to pose a threat to knowledge.

2.1 Varieties of Direct Presence

Whether in the realist or idealist tradition, the direct presence theorist rejects the Indirectness Principle, insisting that when one perceives a cat, for example, the cat is directly in view, directly present to, simply there before the mind. But what is meant by these spatial metaphors? The metaphors can be unpacked in several importantly different ways, having different implications for the rest of PEW. The spatial/metaphorical terminology has been so vastly prevalent in the literature that it is very often hard to tell which author intends which conception(s) of directness. Consequently, it is difficult to pin particular conceptions of directness on particular authors, and the presentation here won’t try except where it’s quite obvious. Instead, the next five subsections aim to map out the more salient possibilities. Later, in sections 2.2 and 2.3, these distinctions will be used to examine how the traditional metaphysical theories of perception bear on the epistemology of perception.

Notice that what is metaphorical about “direct presence” is the notion of presence, not of directness. To be directly present is to be present, but not in virtue of the presence of another thing (that would be indirect presence). Directness is merely unmediatedness, but what kind of mediation is at issue will depend on what kind of presence is intended.

2.1.1 Phenomenal Directness

One dimension of directness, emphasized by Reid (1785), notes that perceptual judgments are phenomenally noninferential, in the sense that they do not result from any discursive or ratiocinative process; they are not introspectibly based on premises. This noninferentiality is usually understood loosely enough to allow for perceptual beliefs’ being based on things other than beliefs (in particular, on experiential states, as we will see below) and also to allow for the possibility of unconscious or subpersonal inferential involvement in the formation of perceptual beliefs, so long as the agent is not deliberately basing these perceptual beliefs on other beliefs. Without these two allowances, claims of noninferentiality would quickly run afoul of standard views in epistemology and psychology, respectively. To claim that perception is phenomenally direct is to claim that it is noninferential in this sense.

2.1.2 Referential Directness

Another way that perception might be direct is if perception represents external objects, as such, without that representation being mediated by representation of other things. Contrast this with the classical empiricists’ opposing view, that the only way to represent external objects is as the cause of our sensations (Locke 1690, Berkeley 1710). One might worry, however, that unless perception puts objects directly before us, we are in danger of not genuinely being able to think about the objective, external world at all, but only about ourselves. To say that perception is referentially direct is to say that the ability of perceptual states to represent does not depend on the ability of other states to represent.

2.1.3 Perceptual Directness

One version of indirectness claims that we perceive outer things by perceiving (or standing in a quasi-perceptual relation to) inner things—usually sense-data (see below and the entry on sense-data). This makes it sound as if what we thought was ordinary direct perceiving of tables and rocks and such is really more like “perceiving” that someone has broken into your house—indirectly, on the basis of actually perceiving the broken window, empty area where the TV used to be, and so on. It is easy to see how such perceptual indirectness may invite the semantic and epistemological worries we have been seeing. To claim that perception of external objects is perceptually direct is to claim that it is not mediated by the perception (or quasi-perceptual apprehension or awareness) of something else.

2.1.4 Direct World-Involvement

One could endorse phenomenal directness and perceptual directness while still holding that perceptual contact is mediated by experience, where experience is conceived as something in virtue of which we have perceptual contact, though it is not the perceptual contact itself. An alternative is a relational metaphysics of perception according to which elements of the perceived world are literally parts of the perceptual experience. On idealist versions of this view, the mental states whose immediate apprehension constitutes perceptual experience just are the objects of perception (or parts of these objects). On (direct) realist versions of the view, perceptual experiences are not internal mental states of the agent but are relations between the agent and some external objects or states of affairs. Thus the agent is in a different type of mental state in the case of veridical perception (the “good case”) than in the case of hallucination (the “bad case”). Veridical perception is a certain kind of relation to a distal array, while hallucination or dreaming is an introspectively indistinguishable but metaphysically distinct relation to something else entirely.

2.1.5 Epistemological Directness

Finally, one might hold that perception is direct in the sense that one’s perceptual beliefs about external objects, like rocks and cats and such, enjoy a kind of justification or knowledge that does not depend on—is not mediated by—any other justification or knowledge. Such beliefs are said to be “epistemically noninferential”, or “epistemologically basic” and the normative status is sometimes referred to as “immediate justification/knowledge” or “basic justification/knowledge”. This possibility will be explored in more detail below, in section 3. Epistemological directness will be treated separately from the previous senses of direct presence, which can all be viewed as metaphysical senses of direct presence. The relation between metaphysical and epistemological directness will be addressed below, in section 2.4.

With these distinctions in hand, we can better situate the traditional theories of perception that are often thought to bear on the skeptical problem.

2.2 Idealism and Phenomenalism

Idealism and phenomenalism are views that hold that ordinary objects (tables, clouds, rocks, etc.) are really collections of or constructs out of actual and/or possible mental states, especially perceptual experiences. (I won’t try to distinguish phenomenalism from idealism but will use “idealism” to include both.) There are several varieties of idealism and several motivations for holding the view. But one motivation is that it promises to solve the skeptical problem of the external world. Berkeley (1710) held that idealism was a cure for skepticism. Transcendental idealism (Kant 1781) aims to split the difference with the skeptic by distinguishing the phenomenal objects of perception—which are collections of appearances and about which we can know something—from the noumenal objects—which are things in themselves and not mere appearances, and about which skepticism is true.

Idealism promises to solve the skeptical problem by attacking the Indirectness Principle. If the problem of the external world starts with the gap between the proximal and the distal objects of perceptual experience, then idealism would avoid skepticism by simply closing that gap. The idealist can embrace direct world-involvement while retaining the claim that nothing is ever directly present to the mind but its own mental states, by holding that the world is fundamentally mental, that, e.g., tables are just collections of ideas. Although metaphysical solutions are usually aimed at the Indirectness Principle, idealism might, additionally, undermine the No-Good-Reason Claim. Hume (1739) argued that we couldn’t reasonably posit external objects as plausible causes of our experiences without first observing a constant conjunction between external objects and experiences; but we can’t “observe” external objects unless we justifiedly believe in their existence, which we could only do if we could reasonably posit them as plausible causes of our experiences. Thus, a vicious circularity. On the other hand, if the objects of perception are not external after all, we are in a better position to infer causal relations between them and individual experiences.

The main difference between idealism and an indirect realism concerns not so much the metaphysics of perception as a larger metaphysical view about what else exists outside of the mind. Berkeley and Descartes agree about the direct objects of perception, but Descartes posits an additional stratum of mind-independent external objects in addition. The idealist denies that there is a veil of perception not because Descartes was wrong about the nature of perception, but because he was wrong about the natures of cats and rocks.

Idealism has a few contemporary defenders (e.g., Foster 2008, Hoffman 2009, Robinson 2022), though it is nowhere near the dominant view that it had been for almost two centuries after Berkeley. Most responses to PEW in the last century have endorsed some kind of realism instead, insisting that ordinary objects are indeed mind-independent.

2.3 Realisms, Direct and Indirect

The problem of the external world, especially the Indirectness Principle, sees its modern renaissance in Descartes’s representative realism, which was offered as an alternative to both the commonsense view of naive (aka direct) realism, and the hylomorphic theory standard among Scholastics. This latter doctrine holds that objects are combinations of primordial matter and forms impressed upon them, which determine the objects’ properties; these objects then cast off forms that can enter the mind through the sense organs. A red thing is simply something that has the form of RED, which it can transmit, making the receptive, perceiving mind also—though presumably in a different sense—red.

Both theories have difficulty handling error. Science frequently teaches us that things are not in reality the way they appear to the senses. The sun, for example, perceptually appears as a small disk rather than the large sphere that it is (Descartes 1641). This perceptual experience cannot involve either the transmission of forms (since the sun doesn’t have those forms), or the “direct pick-up” of objective properties (again, those properties aren’t there to pick up). Nor could we simply be picking up relational properties, like looking small from here, Descartes argues, because I could have the very same perceptual experience in a vivid dream (where even the relational properties are not instantiated) as I do in waking life. Therefore, perceptual appearances must be entirely mental and internal, rather than relational. Insofar as external objects are at all present to the mind, it is only because of these appearances, which thus serve as inner stand-ins, or proxies, for them. As John Locke puts it,

the understanding is not much unlike a closet wholly shut from light, with only some little openings left, to let in external visible resemblances, or ideas of things without. (1690: 163)

It is this notion of standing in that the term “representative realism” is supposed to capture. The representative realist may, but need not, hold that these proxies are also representations in the sense of having semantic contents, i.e., truth- or accuracy-conditions. In fact, the most recognizable form of representative realism denies that experiences are in this sense representational.

2.3.1 Sense-data

This best known, though now widely rejected, form of representative realism incorporates a sense-datum theory (see the entry on sense-data), which holds that every perceptual experience as of something’s being F involves the subject’s awareness of something that really is F. My having a perceptual (veridical or hallucinatory) experience as of something’s being blue requires there to be a nonphysical, inner, mental object—a sense-datum—that is blue. Sense-data are not normally taken to be true or false, any more than rocks or tables are; nonetheless, sense-data constitute the inner rocks and tables in virtue of which we perceive external rocks and tables and are in that sense the latter’s representatives. Two important features of this theory are worth highlighting: (i) that sense-data really do have the properties that external objects appear to have, and (ii) that the relation one stands in to one’s sense-data is a perceptual, or quasi-perceptual, relation: one is perceptually aware of objects due to a more fundamental awareness of one’s sense-data.

Any version of representative realism is indirect in the sense of denying direct world-involvement. The sense-datum theory further denies perceptual directness, as it has us perceive objects by way of perceiving our sense-data; and it is typically fleshed out in such a way as to be incompatible with referential directness as well, holding that we can think about mind-independent objects only as the external causes of these sense-data. It is, however, compatible with phenomenal and epistemological directness. For example, one could deny that the “inference” from sense-data to external objects is conscious and deliberate and insist that only such deliberate inferences would render a belief epistemically inferential (i.e., nonbasic) in the sense of 2.1.5 above.

2.3.2 Intentionalism and Adverbialism

Intentionalism holds that to perceive (or hallucinate) something as being blue is to be in a state with a distinctively semantic property of meaning blue, of referring to or predicating the property of blueness (see the entry on consciousness and intentionality). On this view, the inner states are not just representatives but representations; they have semantic values. Such representations typically lack the properties they depict external objects as having. Furthermore, the relation one stands in to one’s perceptual representations is not necessarily a quasi-perceptual one: it is normally held that one simply has, or tokens, the representations; they are not in any sense objects of perception or awareness in the ordinary course of events, but the vehicles of perception (Huemer 2001). They might, of course, become objects of awareness if we reflectively attend to them; and certain theories of consciousness hold that a perception only becomes conscious when it is the object of a higher order quasi-perceptual state, but in general, being in the perceptual state does not require perceiving one’s perceptual representations.

Sense-datum and intentionalist views both see perceptual experience as a two-place relation between perceiver and inner representative. Adverbialism, on the other hand, holds that perceptual experience itself is monadic; it doesn’t involve the perceiver standing in a relation to something (see the entry on the problem of perception).[1] Different kinds of perceptual experiences are simply different ways of sensing: one “senses greenly” or “is appeared to horsely”, and such locutions do not commit us to the existence of either sense-data or representations. Adverbialism is sometimes offered as an ontologically neutral way of talking about experiences (Chisholm 1957), sometimes as the more contentious claim that perceptual experience is primitive and unanalyzable.

Intentionalism and adverbialism deny direct world-involvement but are compatible with the other varieties of directness. They are also compatible with any of the corresponding varieties of indirectness.

2.3.3 Direct Realism

Proponents of intentionalist and adverbialist theories have often thought of themselves as defending a kind of direct realism; Reid (1785), for example, clearly thinks his proto-adverbialist view is a direct realist view. And perceptual experience is surely less indirect on an intentionalist or adverbialist theory than on the typical sense-datum theory, at least in the sense of perceptual directness. Nevertheless, intentionalist and adverbialist theories render the perception of worldly objects indirect in at least two important ways: (a) it is mediated by an inner state, in the sense that one is in perceptual contact with an outer object of perception only (though not entirely) in virtue of being in that inner state; and (b) that inner state is one that we could be in even in cases of radical perceptual error (e.g., dreams, demonic deception, etc.). These theories might thus be viewed as only “quasi-direct” realist theories; experiences still screen off the external world in the sense that the experience might still be the same, whether the agent is in the good case or the bad case. Quasi-direct theories thus reject the Indirectness Principle only under some readings of “directness”. A fully direct realism would offer an unequivocal rejection of the Indirectness Principle by denying that we are in the same mental states in the good and the bad cases. In recent years, direct realists have wanted the perceptual relation to be entirely unmediated: we don’t achieve perceptual contact with objects in virtue of having perceptual experiences; the experience just is the perceptual contact with the object (Brewer 2011).This is the view that perceptual experience is constituted by the subject’s standing in certain relations to external objects, where this relation is not mediated by or analyzable in terms of further, inner states of the agent. Thus, the brain in the vat could not have the same experiences as a normal veridical perceiver, because experience is itself already world-involving.

The type of direct realism that has received the most attention recently is disjunctivism (e.g., Snowdon 1980, McDowell 1982, Martin 2002, Haddock & Macpherson 2008; see the entry on the disjunctive theory of perception). There are many different versions of disjunctivism, but a common thread is the claim that the experiences involved in the veridical case are ipso facto of a different type than those involved in the hallucinatory cases. The theory of appearing (Alston 1999) is a type of disjunctivism but one that emphasizes the direct world-involvement in the veridical case rather than the radical difference between the cases.

Some forms of behaviorism, functionalism, and embodied mind are also direct realist views. If, for example, having a certain perceptual experience constitutively involves being disposed to act on worldly objects and properties in certain ways—that is, if behavioral dispositions are themselves individuated as world-involving—then this would render the experience relational in the way required by direct realism; disembodied brains in vats could not have the same experiences as we have in normal, veridical cases. Similar consequences follow if perceptual experience is understood in terms of “skilled coping” (Dreyfus 2002) or “sensorimotor know-how” (Noë 2004), again, provided that these terms are read as requiring certain interactions with real, external objects. Any such theory implies that brains in vats couldn’t have the same experiences we do, because they’re causally disconnected from the physical world. Such a view need not be a form of disjunctivism, however; depending on the details of the theory, a hallucinating subject who is nevertheless embedded in and disposed to act on the world in the right ways might have the same experience as a veridically perceiving subject.

Direct realism is compatible with all the metaphysical species of direct presence listed above. As such, it allows for an unequivocal denial of premise (1) of PEW, while quasi-realist views only reject that premise under certain understandings of direct presence.

2.4 Comments on Metaphysical Solutions

If representative realism is the cause of the central epistemological problem for perception, then perhaps direct realism or idealism will be the solution. Some philosophers have thought that these metaphysical views resolved the epistemological problem by closing the gap between appearance and reality, by making ordinary objects (e.g., tables and rocks) directly present to the mind.

On further reflection, however, it is clear that the metaphysical account will be, at best, a part of the solution.

Consider again PEW:

  1. Nothing is ever directly present to the mind in perception except perceptual appearances. (Indirectness Principle) Thus:
  2. Without a good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs. (Metaevidential Principle)
  3. We have no good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical. (No-Good-Reason Claim)
  4. Therefore, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs.

Most metaphysical solutions attack the Indirectness Principle as a way of undercutting the Metaevidential Principle. But they only attack metaphysical readings of the Indirectness Principle, and while the various metaphysical theories of perception from sections 2.2 and 2.3 may have certain intuitive affinities with the Metaevidential Principle or its denial, it follows from Hume’s “no ought from is” dictum that none of them immediately implies either premise (2) or its negation. Epistemological directness does straightforwardly entail the rejection of (2), but epistemological directness is compatible with any of the metaphysical theories of perception glossed above and is entailed by none of them. At best, a metaphysical theory of perception will block one avenue of intuitive support for (2), but it will not imply that (2) is false.

An idealist, for example, will allow that we sometimes dream and that there is a real difference between hallucination and veridical perception, even though in both cases the direct object of awareness is a collection of ideas. The standard view (Berkeley 1710) is that a hallucinatory table is a different sort of collection of ideas than a real table; certain counterfactuals are true of the latter that are not true of the former (e.g., that if I were to will certain movements, my visual perceptions would change in certain ways, etc.). But this reopens the gap between perceptual experiences and ordinary objects. Tables are not just experiences; they are larger entities of which experiences are parts, and those parts can be shared by hallucinations. So what is directly present to the mind is something common to hallucination and veridical perception. So my perceptual experience would seem to be neutral with respect to whether I am seeing or hallucinating a table. So to be justified in believing there is a table in front of me, I will need some reason to think this particular experience is veridical, and PEW is back in business (Alston 1993, Greco 2000).

Direct realism precludes this particular relapse into skepticism by denying that the experience is the same in the good and the bad cases. If our perceptual evidence includes the experience, then our evidence in the good case is different from our evidence in the bad case—they are different mental states. It does not follow, however, that these two bits of evidence have differing evidential import; both may—for all we’ve been told so far—be evidentially neutral with respect to, e.g., whether there is actually a chair in front of me or whether it merely appears so. Even if they are very different mental states, it doesn’t follow that they license different inferences; nothing prevents the direct realist from holding that both only license beliefs of the form ‘I’m either seeing or hallucinating a table’. Additionally, the direct realist is free to impose a metaevidential demand on justified perceptual belief, a demand that we know which kind of experience we are having before that experience can serve as evidence. Unsurprisingly, direct realists often endorse some kind or other of epistemological directness (section 3.3 below), though some endorse the Metaevidential Principle, and in any case, the metaphysical view is by itself silent on this epistemological issue.

Even with the metaphysical premise (1) removed, a purely epistemological version of PEW, consisting of (2) through (4), still challenges the justification of our perceptual beliefs. A satisfying solution to the problem of the external world requires the articulation of some plausible epistemic principles, one that explains which of the two crucial premises (2) and (3) of PEW are being rejected, and provides an epistemological context which renders that rejection plausible. An entirely metaphysical solution to the problem of the external world will not suffice. An epistemological solution to this epistemological problem will be needed in addition or instead.

3. Epistemological Solutions

Any satisfactory, non-skeptical epistemology of perception is going to deny one or more of the epistemological premises of PEW. But that denial will have to be situated within the context of a larger epistemological theory of perceptual belief—or better yet, of belief more generally. There are three broad, not necessarily exclusive, approaches to this question:

  • an evidentialist approach, which holds that perceptual beliefs are justified when held on the basis of (or when the agent is in possession of) something that counts as a good reason for holding that belief;
  • an etiological approach, which holds that perceptual beliefs are justified when formed in an appropriate way (i.e., when the psychological processes by which the beliefs are produced are the kind that generally conduce to justification); and
  • a world-involving approach, which holds that perceptual beliefs are justified when the agent is appropriately related to the worldly truthmaker for that belief (e.g., the perceptual belief that p is justified when the agent sees that p).

The first two are normally defended as parts of and continuous with a more general epistemological view, encompassing not just perception but also testimony, introspection, memory, inductive and deductive inference, and so on. The world-involving view, on the other hand, is formulated specifically to handle perception, though one could imagine it being extended to some of these other sources.

An important difference among these approaches is the way they handle perceptual experiences. On nearly any evidentialist view, experiences—construed as internal, nonfactive (i.e., non-factively-individuated) mental states of the agent—play a central role in the epistemological story, although not necessarily an evidential role; indeed what that role is will differ considerably for the different evidentialist views. For an etiological view, experiences matter if and insofar as they are links in the causal chain by which perceptual beliefs are formed, but they are no more or less important than the other, nonexperiential, links. The world-involving views bring experiences back to a position of centrality, but only with a very different understanding of experiences: not as inner states of an agent but as factive, relational phenomena holding between a perceiving agent and a worldly state of affairs.

These three are quite general approaches, and there is much room for disagreement within each. Thus there are internalist as well as externalist varieties of each as well as disagreement within each as to which of the epistemological premises of PEW is to be rejected.

3.1 Evidentialist Approaches

For most of the history of philosophy, epistemologists have assumed a framework that is both internalist and at least weakly evidentialist. Since the mid-1960s, both the internalism and the evidentialism have become controversial views, rather than common ground that can simply be assumed without argument, though they are still very much live options.

The traditional framework is internalist in both of the two main senses of mentalism, holding that all the factors relevant to justification supervene on the nonfactive mental states of the agent; and accessibilism, requiring that the presence of these factors is knowable by the agent on the basis of mere reflection (see entry on internalist and externalist conceptions of epistemic justification). The framework is weakly evidentialist in requiring—at least for any proposition that is not directly (i.e., immediately) justified—that its justification derives from and is a function of an actual or potential basing relation to some ground, or reason, in relation to which that proposition is a reasonable one to believe. Contemporary evidentialists tend to espouse a stronger kind of evidentialism, according to which all justification, and not just indirect justification, is a function of the agent’s evidence. But this is a later development. There’s no hint in Descartes or Locke, for example, that experiences serve as reasons for appearance beliefs; rather, their occurrence is partly constitutive of the reflectively transparent infallibility of those introspective judgments, which gives these judgments the highest degree of epistemic certainty.

3.1.1 Classical Foundationalism

Foundationalism is the view that some beliefs are epistemologically direct, or “basic”—i.e., their justification does not depend on evidential support from other beliefs—and all other justified beliefs ultimately derive their justification from these. (Basically justified beliefs are sometimes referred to as “immediately justified” as well.) Classical foundationalism is the view that (i) it is appearance beliefs—i.e., beliefs about perceptual appearances—that are basic, and perceptual beliefs about ordinary objects, events, and properties are based at least partly on these, and (ii) perceptual justification requires us to have good reason to think that the relevant current appearances are veridical. Basing is a relation of epistemic dependence and does not imply explicit inference, although particular theories might hold that the relation is satisfied only when inference occurs.

(i) is defended in one of several ways. Here are brief versions of some of the more common, often implicit, arguments:

  • The empirical foundation must consist of the most highly justified contingent beliefs, and these are appearance beliefs.
  • In order for perception to give us genuine knowledge of the external world, perceptual knowledge must be grounded in direct acquaintance with something; we are not directly acquainted with physical objects, but only with our experiences, so beliefs about these experiences must serve as the foundations of perceptual knowledge.
  • We can and do articulate beliefs about our experiences in defense of our perceptual beliefs when challenged; so these appearance beliefs must be at least part of our evidence for the perceptual beliefs.
  • Perceptual beliefs about external objects are not self-evident (if they were, they would be justified whenever held), so they must be based on some other belief; the only candidates are appearance beliefs, which plausibly are self-evident.

(ii) includes an endorsement of the Metaevidential Principle. We have looked at representative realism as one motivation for that principle, but there are others. Classical foundationalists have traditionally endorsed it because it follows from two other claims they find plausible. The first is (i) above, that our perceptual beliefs are based on appearance beliefs. The second is the claim that in order to be justified in believing hypothesis h on the basis of evidence e, one must be justified in believing that e makes h probable (or that e entails h, or e is good evidence for h, etc.) This second claim is a version of Richard Fumerton’s “Principle of Inferential Justification” and is often defended by citing examples (Fumerton 1995; see the entry on foundationalist theories of justification). My belief that you’re going to die soon cannot be justified on the basis of your tarot card reading unless I’m justified in believing that tarot cards really do tell the future. Whether such examples generalize to all inferences is an open question. Some forms of internalism (see the entry on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification) would imply the Principle of Inferential Justification as well.

The classical foundationalist avoids skepticism by rejecting the No-Good-Reason Claim, insisting that we do often have good, non-viciously-circular, reasons for thinking that our experiences are veridical. Two questions thus arise for classical foundationalism, one about the nature and justification of appearance beliefs and one about the allegedly non-circular inference from appearance beliefs to perceptual beliefs.

Appearance beliefs are not based on other beliefs, so how are they justified?

Appearance beliefs are a species of introspective belief, and introspection is sometimes thought to involve a “direct contact”, or “confrontation”, or “acquaintance with”, or “access to”, or “self-presentation” of certain truths. As we saw in section 2.1, regarding “direct presence”, such metaphors could be unpacked in a variety of ways. If claims about “acquaintance” and the like (for simplicity, all of them will be referred to indiscriminately as “acquaintance”) are given an epistemological reading, then they seem to restate or reiterate the classical foundationalist’s claim that we can have foundational justification for appearance beliefs, rather than to explain or argue for that claim. If they are making some metaphysical claim, then the consequences for epistemology are indirect and unclear. Epistemologists are sometimes less than fully explicit about how they are understanding acquaintance. And however acquaintance is understood, the classical foundationalist must make acquaintance broad enough that we are plausibly acquainted with appearances (on pain of skepticism) but narrow enough that we are not acquainted with physical objects as well (or else endorse a very different kind of foundationalism).

Roderick Chisholm’s (1977) conception of acquaintance (he calls it “self-presentation”) is explicitly and fundamentally epistemic—a self-presenting state is simply one such that a person is justified in believing they are in it whenever they actually are in it. This doesn’t explain or argue for the special epistemic status of appearance beliefs, but Chisholm denies that argument or explanation is needed: it is self-presenting that appearance beliefs are self-presenting.

Attempts to explicate acquaintance in non-epistemic terms fall into one of two categories. The traditional way to understand acquaintance is in terms of a containment relation between appearance beliefs and appearances, with the result that appearance beliefs entail their own truth. This is the indirect realist’s analogue of the world-involvement invoked by direct realists (above, sections 2.1.4, 2.3.3). Descartes (1641) held that appearance beliefs, like any belief about one’s own mental states, are infallible for this reason, and transparently so, and thereby justified. Though some still endorse this view (McGrew 2003), most epistemologists deny that our self-attributions are infallible. A more modest claim is that only some appearance beliefs are infallible. A certain kind of token-reflexive concept (“direct phenomenal concepts”) might include phenomenal qualities as literal elements or constituents (Chalmers 2003), and so introspective judgments that involve the application of such concepts cannot be mistaken.

This does not yet fully account for the distinctive epistemic status of appearance beliefs, as the epistemic implications of infallibility remain unclear, especially in the context of an internalist epistemology. One might believe some necessary truth as the result of a lucky guess; the belief is infallible, but not justified. This seems at least in part to result from the fact that the infallibility occurs, in some sense, outside of the agent’s perspective. (The infallibility involved in self-attribution, however, seems intuitively to fall within the agent’s perspective.)

The second type of approach views appearance beliefs as justified by something extrinsic to them, so that an appearance belief is justified when it is accompanied by acquaintance with the experiential fact that the appearance belief describes. Laurence BonJour (2003), for example, understands acquaintance in terms of constitutivity, though in a very different way from the one just seen. BonJour claims that awareness of the sensory content of an experience is partly constitutive of what it is to have a conscious experience. That awareness is thus infallible, but appearance beliefs—which purport to describe the experience and constituent awareness—are fallible. Though, he hastens to point out, we are very likely to get them right in such conditions. Similarly, Fumerton (1995, 2001) claims that acquaintance is a nonepistemic relation, but that whenever we’re acquainted with a fact, everything possibly relevant to the truth of that fact is unproblematically there before the mind.

These two views see acquaintance as a metaphysical (i.e., non-epistemic) relation. They lay down as a separate, further thesis one that is not directly entailed by but is rendered highly plausible, proponents think, by the nature of the acquaintance relation: that when one is thus acquainted with an experience, one has a strong prima facie justification to believe that one has that experience, and furthermore, that justification does not depend on any other beliefs. On either non-epistemic understanding of acquaintance, it puts us in a very good position to make correct judgments about our current experiences. Most classical foundationalists allow that all appearance beliefs are defeasible (i.e., having a kind of justification that is capable of being overridden or undermined by further reasons); hence the claim made is merely for prima facie, rather than ultima facie, justification. (To say that a belief is prima facie [aka pro tanto] justified is to say that it is has some positive epistemic status, in the sense that it is justified if it is not defeated by overriding or undermining considerations.) Chisholm (1977) and Timothy McGrew (2003) endorse the stronger claim that acquaintance provides indefeasible, ultima facie justification.

So far we haven’t seen any talk of evidence; that will come later for these views, in the movement from appearance beliefs to beliefs about the external world. But a stronger kind of evidentialism could hold that the experience (or acquaintance with it) serves not only as a truth-maker and justifier for the appearance belief, but as evidence for that belief as well. By “evidence” is meant here not just any factor that serves to confer justification on a belief, but something that serves as a ground, or reason, or rational basis, for that belief.[2] Not all justification-conferring or justification-relevant factors count as evidence in this sense (if they did, evidentialism [see Conee and Feldman (2004) and entry on epistemology] would not be the controversial thesis that it is). Evidence, in the current context, is something that an agent can possess and on which they can base a belief; someone who possesses evidence that fits, or supports, some belief has (prima facie) propositional justification for that belief, and doxastic justification if that belief is based on that evidence. Not all justification-making factors fit this bill. For example, Descartes held that all clear and distinct judgments were justified, though certain judgments—e.g., “I think”—are justified without evidential appeal to clarity and distinctness. It is the fact that it is clear and distinct that makes it justified, not the agent’s awareness of that fact or appreciation of that fact’s epistemic significance, so clarity and distinctness are not functioning here as evidence. Similarly, reliabilism holds, roughly, that being reliably formed renders a belief justified; although reliability need not—and typically does not—figure in as the agent’s evidence or grounds for believing something.

The stronger evidentialist view holds that even directly (i.e., basically/immediately) justified beliefs are justified by evidential connections, but since these beliefs are basic, their evidence must consist of something other than (justified) belief. Hence the popular claim that perceptual experiences are nondoxastic (i.e., non-belief) states that nevertheless serve as evidence for appearance beliefs, in much the way that beliefs serve as evidence for other beliefs, though with one crucial difference: for one belief to serve as evidence for another, the former must be justified; experiences on most views are not susceptible to justification, thus can be neither justified nor unjustified, but—on the standard strongly evidentialist view—can nevertheless serve as evidence and confer justification on beliefs. The justification of appearance beliefs on this view depends on evidential connections to other mental states but not to other beliefs, and because experiences need not be justified in order to serve as evidence, the threatened regress is halted in a way that is consistent with foundationalism. The idea of such nondoxastic evidence raises several problems, as we will see shortly.

Classical foundationalism is sometimes objected to on the grounds that we typically do not have beliefs about our experiences (e.g., Pollock 1986, Greco 2000), at least not consciously. This raises interesting and difficult issues about the natures of evidence and the basing relation. For the belief that p to serve as justifying evidence for the belief that q, must I consciously form the belief that p, or is it enough that, e.g., I have good reason to believe that p and be disposed to do so if the question arises? Surely the classical foundationalist never denied phenomenal directness or thought our perceptual beliefs were reasoned out explicitly. If one could show that only consciously formed beliefs could ground other beliefs, this would be bad news indeed for classical foundationalism, but this is a controversial claim. Alternatively, the objection might be that we are typically not even yet in a position to form justified appearance beliefs, in some situations where we are nevertheless well justified in our perceptual beliefs. Being in a position to form justified appearance beliefs would require further investigation, in an “inward” direction. This investigation is not always easy (Pollock 1986), and it is possible that such investigation would alter the nature of the experience. In addition, some perceivers may lack the conceptual resources to distinguish appearances from external objects, although they seem to be justified in their perceptual beliefs nonetheless.

The second big question for the classical foundationalist is how appearance beliefs provide justification for beliefs about external objects.

Cartesian foundationalism was the strictest form of classical foundationalism, requiring a deductive metaevidential argument for the reliability of perception. Descartes believed that he could give a non-circular argument for thinking that some perceptual experiences were veridical, by constructing an a priori argument for the reliability of perception. He also aimed for certainty, so his argument was a deductive one, starting with the existence and perfection of God and concluding that any clear and distinct awareness (including some elements of perceptual awarenesses) must be true; so some perceptual experiences—namely, the clear and distinct ones—are veridical. This would have licensed a rejection of the No-Good-Reason Claim, by showing how we could have a good reason for thinking our experiences to be veridical. However, Descartes’s a priori arguments for the existence of God were at best controversial, and the theology needed to deduce the reliability of perception from the perfection of the deity was unconvincing, so deductive metaevidential arguments along these lines were not pursued further.

NonCartesian forms of classical foundationalism have tried to combine the a priority required by non-circularity with a probabilistic form of inference, the most promising candidate being abduction, or inference to the best explanation (Russell 1912, BonJour 2003). According to this view, the best explanation of our experiences is the commonsense hypothesis that there is a mind-independent external world that conforms in some measure to these experiences and is the cause of them. The superiority of this explanation to the alternatives (idealism, a Cartesian demon, etc.) is held to be an a priori matter, thus not dependent on assuming the veridicality of the very experiences the argument is supposed to legitimate. There is a good deal of intuitive plausibility to the claim that an external world serves as the best explanation for our sense experience, but making that case in any detail, especially enough to satisfy the idealist, would require taking on some large and complex issues, like what makes one explanation better than another (see the entry on abduction), and—since the commonsense view is sometimes (e.g., Russell 1912, BonJour 2010) held to be simpler than competitors—what counts as simplicity, a vexed question in the philosophy of science (see the entry on simplicity). William Alston (1993) offers an influential critique of abductive arguments for the reliability of sense-experience.

Furthermore, if we are trying to explain how the ordinary person’s perceptual beliefs are justified, then it is not enough that there be some good deductive or abductive argument for the reliability of perception; this argument must be in some important sense available to or possessed by the agent. Premise (2) of PEW, after all, is the claim that the agent must have some good reason for thinking their experiences are veridical. Some (e.g., Pollock & Cruz 1999) think this imposes a significantly more onerous burden on the proponent of classical foundationalism, although others (e.g., BonJour 2010) claim that the superiority of the commonsense view is quite accessible to ordinary epistemic agents.

3.1.2 Fundamental Epistemic Principles

Other traditional foundationalists have responded to PEW by denying the Metaevidential Principle, rather than the No-Good-Reason Claim. Most such views have rejected both parts of the standard argument for the Metaevidential Principle (3.1.1 above), but one important exception is worth noting. Chisholm (1966, 1977) agrees with the classical foundationalist that perceptual beliefs are based on appearance beliefs but denies that any argument for the legitimacy of the appearance-reality inference is needed. Chisholm posits as a fundamental epistemic principle that if one is justified in believing herself to be perceptually appeared to as if p, then one is prima facie justified in believing that p. The significance of insisting that this principle is fundamental is to insist on the legitimacy of the move from p-appearance to p-reality while denying that that legitimacy is derived from deduction or abduction. This move is similar to one taken by the antireductionist in the epistemology of testimony (see the entry on epistemological problems of testimony).

To the classical foundationalist, this move seems illicitly ad hoc. Admittedly, it gives the answer we desire—that perceptual beliefs are justified—but it doesn’t explain how this can be so or give us any reason to think it is true (Fumerton 1995). The objection holds that the postulation of fundamental epistemic principles licensing the inferences we like, despite our inability to provide an argument for the legitimacy of such inferences, has, to borrow Bertrand Russell’s apt phrase, all the advantages of theft over honest toil.

3.1.3 Coherentism

The coherentist, like the classical foundationalist, endorses the Metaevidential Principle but holds that we can indeed have good arguments for the reliability of perception. Coherentism is the view that at least some justification comes from mutual support among otherwise unsupported beliefs instead of tracing back to basic beliefs. As such, coherentists are sometimes said to endorse certain kinds of circular (they prefer to call them holistic) argument, but a coherentist will reject the No-Good-Reason Claim by insisting that there is nothing viciously circular about our arguments for the reliability of perception (BonJour 1985, Lehrer 1990). Because it allows mutual support, coherentism can tolerate empirical arguments for the reliability of perception, in principle, allowing appeals to track records, evolution, and other scientific evidence.

Coherentism has traditionally been propounded as a doxastic theory: one that holds that only beliefs can serve as evidence. This is in part because one of the major motivations for coherentism derives from an argument due to Wilfrid Sellars (1956), Donald Davidson (1986) and Laurence BonJour (1980) that purports to show that nondoxastic states (e.g., experiences) cannot play an evidential role (about which, more below, in section 3.1.5). Indeed, on this sort of view, experiences play no epistemic role at all (though maybe a causal, psychological role), either evidential or otherwise. This doxasticism is the source of one of the most notorious problems for coherentism, however, for the internal coherence of a belief system could result from the ingenuity of the believer, rather than from its fit with reality. A detailed enough and cleverly constructed fairy tale could be highly internally coherent, but surely I am not justified in believing the fairy tale, in my current situation and environment. This is the famous isolation objection to coherentism: a belief system could be isolated from the world and yet be fully coherent. Since those beliefs would not be justified, coherence is not sufficient for justification.

The brunt of the isolation objection is that (doxastic) coherentism is unable to do justice to perception, for it does not require any genuinely perceptual contact with the world. But without perception, the whole of one’s beliefs is just another plausible story, not the one true description of things. (Even with perception, there is unlikely to be a single best belief set, but the number of equally good contenders will be vastly reduced.) For some time, BonJour (1985) thought that the problem could be solved with more beliefs; he required a candidate belief system to include a number of beliefs attributing reliability to beliefs that seem to be involuntary, noninferential, and directly caused by the outside world. But this solution seemed ad hoc, and it still didn’t require the belief set to be very highly constrained by perception; at best it constrained the belief set by what the agent believes to be perception, and even then, only those putatively perceptual beliefs about which the agent has favorable metabeliefs would need to constrain the rest of the system in any way. This seems to render perception epistemically “optional”, in an objectionable way.

Although BonJour (1997) has consequently abandoned this approach in favor of a form of foundationalism, others have sought to incorporate experiences into a nondoxastic coherentism (Conee 1988, Haack 1993, Kvanvig 2012, Kvanvig & Riggs 1992). If experiences are among the relata over which the coherence relation is defined, then a fully isolated agent won’t be able to satisfy the coherence requirement, and the isolation objection may be averted.

It is unclear whether such a move genuinely rescues coherentism or simply replaces it with a version of foundationalism. If consonance with experience can increase the credibility of a belief, then it begins to look as if that belief satisfies at least some (“weak”) foundationalist definitions of an epistemologically basic belief. Instead, the nondoxastic coherentist might insist that experiences justify perceptual beliefs, but only in the presence of the right background beliefs about which experiences reliably indicate which distal states of affairs, where these background beliefs are themselves justified in a coherentist manner (Gupta 2006). This view seems to be securely coherentist, though it threatens to render coherence with experience optional in just the way BonJour’s older view did. The crucial question here is whether experiences—alone, and in and of themselves—affect the coherence of a belief system, or whether they do so only in the presence of the relevant metabeliefs. If the former, then “nondoxastic coherentism” may not be significantly different from some form of foundationalism. If the latter, then an agent lacking the requisite metabeliefs might satisfy the coherence requirements quite well but have a belief system that clashes with their experience, and the nondoxastic coherentist would have to hold that the agent is none the worse, epistemically, for that fact.

The very spirit of coherentism seems to dictate that perception yields justification only because and insofar as the perceiver has metabeliefs that favor perception, while it is central to the foundationalist theory of perception that perceptual experience imposes epistemic constraints on us, whether we believe it or not.

3.1.4 Seemings Internalism

The epistemological views considered so far can all be considered egoistic theories, for they hold that justification for beliefs about external objects depends in part on justification for beliefs about oneself—about one’s current mental states, about the connections between one’s experiences or putatively perceptual beliefs and certain distal states of affairs, rendering perceptual beliefs nonbasic. Modest foundationalism is a nonegoistic version of foundationalism, one that allows some beliefs about external objects and their properties—particularly, perceptual beliefs—to be epistemologically basic. (Both types of foundationalism also countenance other basic beliefs, e.g., beliefs about simple arithmetical truths.) Modest foundationalism thus denies the Metaevidential Principle; perceptual beliefs are not based on other beliefs and thus not based on appearance beliefs, and if they are based on something other than beliefs (namely, experiences) the agent need not have a justified belief about the reliability of this connection.

Some proponents of modest foundationalism go a step further and offer a derivative denial of the No-Good-Reason Claim: since we already have justified beliefs about our surroundings, and introspective knowledge of the deliverances of perception, we can construct non-circular arguments for the reliability of perception. Indeed, if I can have first-order knowledge about the world around me without first having metaevidence about the reliability of perception, I should be able to accumulate empirical evidence for thinking that I am not a brain in a vat, that I am not dreaming, etc., without begging the question. Whether this should count as a virtue or a vice of the theory is a matter of debate. Proponents of a “Moorean” response to skepticism (see the entries on skepticism and epistemic closure) will see this as a selling point for modest foundationalism (Pryor 2000). Others (Vogel 2000, 2008; Cohen 2002) have interpreted this result as revealing a fundamental flaw of the theory: it makes justification and knowledge “too easy”. It is as if I used an untested speedometer to form beliefs both about my speed and what the meter indicated my speed to be, then used a number of such belief pairs to inductively argue for the reliability of the speedometer.

Modest foundationalism endorses epistemological directness (section 2.1.5 above) and could be considered a kind of epistemological direct realism, for it makes the world and its elements “directly present” to the mind in a fairly clear, epistemological sense: perceptual justification is not dependent on any other justification; no other beliefs are interposed between us and the world (in fact, John Pollock’s term for his [1971, 1986] modest foundationalism is “direct realism”; cf. Pollock & Cruz 1999). Modest foundationalism is compatible with any metaphysical view about the nature of perception. Even a sense-datum theorist could embrace this epistemological direct realism, provided they held that the inference from sense-data to external objects was a kind of (perhaps unconscious or subpersonal) inference that does not impose evidential requirements on the conclusion belief.

Modest foundationalism is usually associated with the internalist, strongly evidentialist versions of the theory, of the sort initially developed by Pollock (1971) and Anthony Quinton (1973), though given renewed visibility in recent decades by James Pryor (2000), Michael Huemer (2001) and others. These views hold that perceptual beliefs about external objects, events, and properties are directly justified by the corresponding perceptual experiences; it is the experiences themselves, rather than beliefs about the experiences, that do the justificatory work. Thus, Huemer’s (2007) “phenomenal conservatism”, Pryor’s (2000) “dogmatism”, and Pollock’s (1971, 1974, 1986) “direct realism” all endorse something like the following principle:

If S has a perceptual experience as of p, then S is prima facie justified in believing that p.


If it perceptually seems to S that p, then S is prima facie justified in believing that p.

That is, S is prima facie justified whether or not perception is reliable for S and whether or not S has any evidence in favor of the claim that perception is reliable. Perceptual beliefs are justified by the experience alone, in virtue of some intrinsic feature of that experience (its content, or phenomenal character, or assertive force, some combination of these, etc.). Of course, because the justification here is only prima facie justification, this justification could be defeated if, say, S has good enough reason to think that perception is unreliable, or has independent evidence that p is false.

To have a neutral term, this view will be called “seemings internalism”, for it holds that perceptual beliefs are based on “seemings”, i.e., appearance states, i.e., experiences. (There is no fixed, established terminology here.) Seemings internalism is attractive on the grounds that it offers intuitively correct, nonskeptical verdicts about ordinary perceptual belief and does so, according to some proponents, in a way that is less intellectually demanding than other internalist views, thus more likely to get the result that animals and small children have perceptual knowledge, even though they’re not sophisticated enough to have beliefs about appearances.

Susanna Schellenberg’s (2013, 2018) view is best classified as a form of seemings internalism, but only about one aspect or dimension of justification. On her view, any time it perceptually seems to you that p, you have “phenomenal evidence” for p. Full justification of the sort required for knowledge requires another kind of justification in addition to phenomenal evidence (as we’ll see in section 3.3). She has a complex externalist theory about what constitutes it seeming to you that p, but there is no conflict between a seemings internalist epistemology and the various kinds of semantic externalism (see entry on externalism about the mind).

Most seemings internalists are fairly liberal about the contents of the seemings and thus about which perception-based beliefs are directly justified. Others, notably Elijah Chudnof (2018) and Matthew McGrath (2013, 2018), are more conservative. Is my belief that there’s a dog in front of me basic, or does its justification depend on the justification of more elemental beliefs: that there’s a medium sized, 3-dimensional object of such-and-such a shape and a furry texture, etc.? Is my belief that that’s Django on the floor in front of me basic, or does it depend on the belief that there’s a black and tan dog of a certain description, that Django is a black and tan dog who fits that description, etc.? Liberals will take the former options, while conservatives will go with something like the latter. Seemings internalism requires experiential states whose contents match the contents of the basic beliefs, so a liberal view about direct justification requires a liberal view about the contents of perceptual experience (see the entry on the contents of perception). Chudnoff (2018) combines a liberal theory about the contents of perception with a conservative view about basic beliefs by endorsing a restricted kind of seemings internalism: not all perceptual experiences provide prima facie justification, only the ones with “presentational phenomenology”, which not all perceptual experiences do have.

3.1.5 The Sellarsian Dilemma and Other Challenges

Perhaps the most important problem for internalist, evidentialist views concerns the relevant understanding of seemings, or perceptual experience. It is clear that seemings must be non-belief states of some sort, as their epistemological role is to confer justification on basic beliefs, and the latter wouldn’t be basic if seemings were themselves beliefs. The “Sellarsian dilemma” is a famous argument, in some ways due as much to BonJour (1978, 1985) as to Sellars (1956), which claims that “experience” and “seemings” and the like are ambiguous in a way that undermines the epistemological role that a strongly evidentialist foundationalism requires of experiences. That role, of course, is to provide justification for beliefs without being themselves in need of it. Sellars (1956) starts with the justification of appearance beliefs. He argues that there is a kind of noncognitive awareness of sensations that does not involve learning or the application of concepts; this kind of awareness accompanies all conscious sensations, but this kind of awareness does not account for the justification of our appearance beliefs, for one might well have this kind of awareness without having any idea what kind of experiences one is having (or any idea that there are such things as experiences). There is another kind of awareness of our sensations that does involve the application of concepts and does entail knowledge and justification. But this awareness just is one’s knowledge of one’s experiences (i.e., one’s justified, true, unGettiered appearance belief). But that kind of awareness cannot then serve as a nondoxastic foundation that confers justification on beliefs without being itself in need of justification (see Lyons 2016).

This argument--Sellars’s original argument--is aimed at a kind of classical foundationalism, but a modified version has more general ambitions. Sellars himself (1956) thought that there are two elements to perception: a bare sensation, which is an inner event with qualitative character but no representational content; and a perceptual belief (or belief-like state, in cases where the agent does not accept appearances at face value; see Reid 1764, 1785 for a similar view). Recent formulations of the Sellarsian dilemma have focused on this mismatch in content between experience and perceptual belief, and have modified the argument to include an attack on modest foundationalism. There are several variants of the argument; what follows is an amalgamated version.

  1. Let us say that a state is “cognitive” just in case it has conceptual and propositional content, and assertive force; it is “noncognitive” otherwise.[3]
  2. If an experience is noncognitive, then it cannot justify a perceptual belief.
  3. If an experience is cognitive, then it cannot justify any beliefs unless it is itself justified.
  4. Therefore, in neither case can an experience confer justification without being itself justified.

In defense of (2), experiences have frequently been construed as lacking representational contents altogether (Sellars 1956, Martin 2002, Brewer 2011), or as having nonconceptual contents (Heck 2000, Peacocke 2001).[4] An influential argument (e.g., McDowell 1994, Brewer 1999) holds that without conceptual content, an experience would have to stand outside the “logical space of reasons” and thus cannot justify a belief. This line is perhaps most plausible if the relevant mode of justification is assumed to be a specifically evidential one (see section 3.1.1 above). To serve as evidence, the experience would need to stand in logical or probabilistic relations to beliefs, and without (conceptual) contents, it is unclear how it could stand in evidential relations to beliefs, or which beliefs it would serve as evidence for (McDowell 1994). A common response is that as long as experiences have contents of any sort, they can have truth conditions and thus stand in entailment and probabilistic relations to beliefs (Heck 2000, Byrne 2005). One way to follow through on the original argument for (2) is to emphasize the kind of content necessary for evidence appreciable as such by the perceiver. If experiences are nonconceptual, then it seems that I could have a nonconceptual experience of a cat without being in any position to appreciate the fact that the experience is of a cat. In such a case, I could fail to have any justification for believing that there is cat in front of me. So nonconceptual experiences cannot, by themselves, justify perceptual beliefs (Lyons 2016). Such an argument requires the controversial assumption that an agent must “appreciate” e’s evidential significance vis-à-vis h, in order for e to supply that agent with evidence for h. Some (e.g., Alston 1988) have explicitly rejected this assumption, although some forms of access internalism require it.

As for the other horn of the dilemma, premise (3), one can argue that so-called “experiences” that have assertive force and the same contents as beliefs are, if not themselves beliefs, at least sufficiently belief-like that they are susceptible to epistemic evaluation in much the way that beliefs are; if so and if only the “justified” ones can confer justification on beliefs, then these experiences will not have filled the role foundationalism had carved out for them (Sellars 1956, BonJour 1978, Sosa 2007).

In recent years, several authors (Lyons 2005, 2009; Bengson, Grube, & Korman 2011; Brogaard 2013) have argued that what we think of as perceptual experiences is actually a composite of two (or more) distinct elements, what Chris Tucker (2010) calls the “sensation” (an imagistic state, rich in perceptual phenomenology) and a “seeming” (here construed as a purely representational state, applying conceptual categories to things in the world). Seemings understood in this way are still non-belief states: in cases of known perceptual illusion, it might seem to me that p, even though I don’t believe that p. Something like the above Sellarsian dilemma can be run with this distinction in hand: sensations without seemings are insufficient to justify beliefs; and seemings without sensations would be subjectively too similar to mere hunches to justify beliefs (Lyons 2009). The seemings internalist can reply by arguing that seemings alone, even construed as just one component of perceptual experience, can indeed justify beliefs (Tucker 2010), or by rejecting this composite view, insisting that a seeming is a single, unified state, whose perceptual phenomenology and conceptual content are inextricably linked (Chudnoff & Didomenico 2015).

Seemings internalism as formulated above claims that the content of the experience is the same as the content of the belief, thus rejecting premise (3) of the Sellarsian argument. There may be variations close enough to still count as seemings internalism that deny (2) instead, allowing experiences with nonconceptual contents to justify beliefs. The standard schema would have to be modified:

If S has a perceptual experience as of p*, then S is prima facie justified in believing that p.

One would, of course, want to say more about the relation between p and p*. Although his concern is not with nonconceptual content, Nico Silins (2011) defends a view much like seemings internalism, where the experiences are not required to have the same contents as the beliefs.

A second problem is that of alien sense modalities (Bergmann 2006). There are possible creatures with sense modalities and experiences that are foreign to us: echolocation, electroreception, etc., and presumably these creatures can be justified in their alien perceptual beliefs. If metaevidential beliefs are not necessary for perceptual justification, then these same experiences ought to justify us in those same beliefs. Intuitively, however, a sudden electroreceptive experience would not justify me in believing there was a medium sized animal about three feet behind me. In fact, a famous objection to a different (reliabilist) theory seems to apply equally well to seemings internalism. Norman (BonJour 1980) has no reason for thinking that he has reliable clairvoyant powers, but one day he has a clairvoyant experience as of the president being in New York; intuitively, he is not prima facie justified in believing that the president is in New York, yet seemings internalism seems to imply that he is. The clairvoyance objection is normally pressed against reliabilist theories, not on the basis of the reliability component, but rather on the basis of their rejection of the Metaevidential Principle, a rejection that is shared by seemings internalism. One might reply that Norman’s experience is not exactly perceptual; perhaps this might offer a way out, especially if one could explain why it isn’t perceptual and why that should make a difference. Some versions of seemings internalism restrict their claims to perception (Pryor 2000), although some (Huemer 2007) apply to seemings much more generally.

Another potential problem is that seemings internalism is insensitive to the etiology of the experience, although it intuitively seems that this should matter. If the only reason Jack looks angry to Jill is that she has an irrational fear that he would be angry, then her perceptual experience as of angry-Jack should not carry its usual evidential weight (Siegel 2011). This problem is sometimes framed in terms of the “cognitive penetration of perception”, a controversial empirical issue in the philosophy of perception. In general, experiences that result from wishful thinking, fear, and various irrational processes should not have the same evidential import as do experiences with a more respectable etiology (Markie 2005, Siegel 2013). But seemings internalism makes the experience itself sufficient for (prima facie) justification and thus leaves no role for etiology to play. One response to these sorts of cases is that if it genuinely looks to Jill as if Jack is angry, then the only appropriate thing for Jill to do is believe that he is angry (Huemer 2013). This is compatible with there still being something else epistemically lacking in Jill; e.g., she presumably doesn’t know that Jack is angry (even if he is). Chris Tucker (2014) argues that cognitive penetration problems are a worry for everyone, not just for seemings internalists.

This last concern in particular calls into question a phenomenal determination principle, assumed by all the epistemological views canvassed so far, which holds that the phenomenal character of an experience completely determines which beliefs that experience directly justifies: two agents cannot be alike with respect to their phenomenology and yet differ in which beliefs are directly (prima facie) justified for them. The phenomenal determination principle has some intuitive plausibility, but so does its denial. Cognitive penetration cases (Markie 2005, Siegel 2011) purport to offer cases where two agents have the same phenomenal states but different direct justification, and certain responses to the new evil demon objection to reliabilism (Lyons 2012) try to undermine intuitive support for the phenomenal determination principle.

A different worry concerns the basing relation. Doxastic evidential justification is generally thought to require that the belief be based on the justifying evidence, where basing is some kind of psychological relation (which psychological relation is a matter of some controversy--see the entry on the epistemic basing relation). This makes it a partly empirical question whether we typically or ever actually do base perceptual beliefs on experiences. Although it seems intuitively plausible that we do, Jack Lyons (2020) argues that the empirical facts about the contents of perceptual experiences and about the time course of conscious experience and perceptual categorization render this claim unlikely.

A final worry for seemings internalism is one that we encountered above in section 3.1.2 in connection with a different view: the proposal seems to be an ad hoc attempt to get the desired nonskeptical answer without further justification for the principle. What is it about seemings, after all, that makes them able to generate justification? The desire that p has propositional content but doesn’t justify the belief that p; the unjustified belief that q has assertoric force but doesn’t justify the belief that q (Lyons 2008, Ghijsen 2014); imaginings can have phenomenal force but don’t justify beliefs (Teng 2018), and so on. Chudnoff 2018, 2021 holds that some seemings have a particular phenomenal character (“presentational phenomenology”), namely that of seeming to put us in direct contact with an extramental reality. But he holds that only some seemings have this phenomenology, and it’s only these that confer direct justification, so this view won’t give most seemings internalists all they want. Pollock’s (1986) epistemological theory of concepts addresses this worry by claiming that it is part of the concept of, e.g., red that a certain perceptual experience (or seeming) is a prima facie reason for the belief that x is red. Most recent proponents of seemings internalism have not embraced this part of Pollock’s view.

3.1.6 Seemings Externalism

Some of the problems facing internalist evidentialist theories are at least ostensibly solved by going externalist. A view we might call “seemings externalism” holds along with seemings internalism that perceptual beliefs are justified when based on a fitting experience but is externalist about the fittingness relation, allowing that what makes for fittingness need not be accessible by reflection nor need supervene on the nonfactive mental states of the believer. This sort of view is premised on the rejection of the phenomenal determination principle articulated above. Assuming that experiences are necessarily conscious and that conscious states are necessarily accessible, seemings externalism nevertheless imposes an internalist constraint on perceptual justification: one component of justification must be an accessible mental state of the agent. But the rest of the justificatory story is thoroughgoingly externalist. To date, this sort of view has been developed in two ways, one reliabilist and one functionalist.

An example of the first approach is Alston’s (1988) internalist externalism. He requires that every justified belief have some ground, or evidence, and that this ground be accessible; that is the internalist element. He claims, however, that what makes a ground (good) evidence for some belief is that the ground reliably indicates the truth of that belief, and this fact is one that need not be accessible to the agent; this is the externalist element. (See Comesaña 2010 for a similar view.) Although Alvin Goldman is best known for the reliabilist (etiological) theory to be addressed in section 3.2, he also (2011) has developed a reliabilist/evidentialist “synthesis”, where experiential evidence plays a central role in perception. (He does not, however, require that all justified perceptual beliefs be based on some experience.) He offers a two-factor reliabilist proposal for understanding evidence, which combines process and indicator reliabilism (see entry on reliabilist epistemology); for e to be evidence for h (i) e must be among the inputs to a reliable process that outputs h, and (ii) there must be an objective fittingness relation between e and h, that is, e must reliably indicate the truth of h, in the sense of making h objectively likely to be true. Both components, (i) and (ii), are externalist in both the mentalist and accessibilist senses.

The second approach says that an experience fits the belief that p if it’s the function—in a biological or teleological sense—of the state to indicate p (Plantinga 1993, Bergmann 2006, 2013). On this view, there need not be any necessary or intrinsic connection between a certain kind of experience and the belief it justifies, and the belief need not even tend to be true whenever the experience is undergone; all that’s required is that this belief be the proper response to the experience, in the sense that a properly functioning agent (or an agent whose perceptual/doxastic system is functioning properly) will form that belief in response to that experience.

Objections to these views are typically just specific applications of objections to the relevant externalism: reliabilist and teleological theories more generally. For instance, clairvoyance objections (BonJour 1980) aim to show that reliability is not sufficient for prima facie justification, and new evil demon arguments (Lehrer & Cohen 1983, Cohen 1984) insist that reliability is not necessary (see the entry on reliabilist epistemology). One way to run the new evil demon argument is to image an experiential state that seamlessly transitions from reliably indicating p to not reliably indicating p; intuitively the agent remains justified throughout and should not change their mind or suspend belief halfway through (Smithies 2019, Pautz 2020). Functionalists might have resources here that reliabilists do not, unless these arguments are sufficient to establish a general internalism. However, they face the additional problem of the Swampman (Davidson 1987, Sosa 1993), who is a randomly occurring (therefore, lacking in any biological functions) molecular duplicate of a normal person; intuitively he seems to have justified perceptual beliefs, although this cannot be accounted for in terms of function, at least on some views about functions. Perhaps, however, Swampman can fairly quickly acquire some functions as the result of interactions with his environment (Graham 2019) and thereby have justification fairly soon after his appearance, even if not immediately.

3.2 Etiological Approaches

If experiences have justificatory power only when reliability or proper function are added into the mix, one might wonder if it’s better to just omit any reference to experience and instead simply analyze perceptual justification directly in terms of reliability or proper function. Indeed, these make up two prominent etiological approaches to perceptual justification and knowledge. A third etiological approach is an inferentialist one. All three reject the Metaevidential Principle and access internalism.

Goldman (1979, 1986) argues that justification results from the operation or exercise of a cognitive process whose operation is objectively likely to yield true beliefs; the process must really be reliable in this sense, but the agent need not be aware of that fact.[5] (To be ultima facie justified the agent must not have reasons to think the process unreliable.)

A reliabilist theory of perceptual justification falls out from a reliabilist theory of justification in general, the simplest version of which is one that holds

(SR): a belief is prima facie justified iff it is the result of a reliable cognitive process.

By claiming that reliability is sufficient for perceptual justification, the theory allows for justification in the absence of experiences or anything else that the agent might use as evidence for the belief. It allows that blindsighters and zombies could have perceptual justification. (Blindsight is a real phenomenon where patients with damage to early visual cortex are capable of forming reliable perceptual judgments in the absence of perceptual experiences; philosophical depictions of blindsight tend to be somewhat fictionalized. Zombies in philosophical parlance are creatures otherwise just like us but lacking conscious experiences altogether.) It is nonevidentialist in the further sense that even where some link in the causal chain happens to count as an evidential state for the cognizer (i.e., one on which they might base a belief), that state’s status as evidence is irrelevant to its epistemic role, so long as it still makes the same contribution to the reliability of the overall process.

A different kind of broadly reliabilist theory emphasizes skills or competences, rather than cognitive processes (Sosa 1991, 2007, 2021). Skills will likely be individuated in different ways than cognitive processes, and reliability might be assessed differently for different skills (as one does with performances more generally: a skillful driver must almost never wreck the car, while a skillful batter might strike out more than half the time). Nevertheless, the view is still reliabilist in that skill is a matter of having a high enough propensity to believe truly. Ernest Sosa’s influential development of this view distinguishes “animal knowledge”—a belief is true because competently formed—from “reflective knowledge”—where the subject has true-because-competently-formed belief that a lower order belief is true because competently formed. Concepts of animal and reflective justification are easily derived from these. Although Sosa denies the Metaevidential Principle for animal knowledge/justification, he embraces it for reflective knowledge/justification.

One reliabilist theory that aims at perceptual justification in particular holds that it is not merely reliability that gives perception its epistemic force but also the fact that perceptual beliefs have a distinctive psychological provenance. In particular, they are the outputs of (weakly) “modular” perceptual processes (where what counts as a perceptual module is spelled out in architectural terms, rather than in terms of phenomenology or the agent’s background beliefs; Lyons 2009). This “inferentialist reliabilist” theory (so-called not because of its treatment of perception but because of its treatment of some nonperceptual belief) claims that reliability is only sufficient for the (prima facie) justification of the outputs of modular processes, but that the reliabilist can and should impose inferential requirements (understood in reliabilist ways) on other beliefs. Though the view is designed as a version of reliabilism, a mentalist internalist could accept the modularity part and drop the reliability part, claiming that the outputs of perceptual modules are thereby prima facie justified whenever held, irrespective of either experience or reliability.

In addition to or instead of reliability, one could endorse a functionalist view about the justification of perceptual beliefs. Tyler Burge (2003, 2020) and Peter Graham (2012, 2019) are the most prominent proponents of this sort of view in its non-evidentialist mode. Both hold that the belief-forming process need not be reliable, but it must have the (teleological) function of producing reliably true beliefs. This requires that the process be (/have been) reliable in normal conditions—i.e., the conditions where producing a particular result led to the establishment of that result as the function. For Burge, however, the functions derive from the fact that percepts and beliefs are representational states, and it’s an a priori condition on any representational state that it has the function of representing correctly; thus the view is that perceptual justification (he calls it “entitlement”) requires that the perceptual process and its elements be reliable in those conditions in which the contents of those elements was fixed. For Graham, the functions result from the empirical fact that the processes have done the organism (or its ancestors) some practical, biological good.

These views are fully externalist, but there is a kind of etiological view that is compatible with mentalism. An “inferentialist” theory holds that perception involves an inferential or quasi-inferential process and that perceptual beliefs are justified or not, according as the inferential moves pass muster vis-a-vis whatever the ordinary standards are for inference more generally. The inference to be evaluated can be unconscious and of the Helmholtzian sort that perceptual psychologists talk about (Siegel 2013, 2017), or it can be a move from conscious, person-level contents, like low-level sensory contents, to high level perceptual categorization beliefs (e.g., ‘there’s a cat’) (Markie 2006, 2013; McGrath 2013, 2018). The latter option ends up being a version of the evidentialist theories discussed above (usually a conservative kind of modest foundationalism) and won’t get repeated treatment here; but the former is a distinctive theory of perceptual justification. Susanna Siegel takes her inferentialism so far as to claim that nondoxastic perceptual experiences are themselves epistemically evaluable and can be effectively unjustified, if their etiology is an inferentially bad one. Although the inferentialist can make explicit appeal to experiences, one can also develop an inferentialism that assigns no significant role to experience as such (Ghijsen 2021), and in any case, the experience is merely one link in the inferential chain on the basis of which the perceptual belief is evaluated. (As stated above, the evidential, etiological, and world-involving approaches were not held to be mutually exclusive.) One putative counterexample to Siegel’s inferentialism involves an agent who believes for no good reason that the woods around them are full of snakes, and this irrational belief affects their perceptual experiences in such a way that they are now better at spotting snakes that are actually there (Lyons 2011). Intuitively, the agent is justified in their perceptual beliefs, despite an irrational inferential etiology.

As with the seeming externalist views, the standard clairvoyance, new evil demon, and Swampman objections to reliabilist and functionalist theories are leveled against these theories of perceptual justification. Proponents of the phenomenal determination principle (section 3.1.5 above) will reject all of these views as incompatible with that principle (Smithies 2019, Pautz 2020). A closely related issue concerns agents who don’t have any experiences. Because these theories allow perceptual justification in the absence of any experience, they will allow zombies and blindsighters to have perceptual justification, so long as their perceptual processes are reliable, or functioning normally, or drawing rational unconscious inferences, and so on. Intuitions on this matter seem to be divided; some authors think this consequence is a virtue of such views (Plantinga 1993, Lyons 2009, Tucker 2010), though others think it is clearly a vice (e.g., Smithies 2019, Johnston 2011).

3.3 World-involving Approaches

The theories considered so far all consider the justification of a particular belief to be independent of whether the agent is veridically perceiving on that occasion, or is hallucinating or being deceived by a Cartesian demon, etc. (although some of these views would allow that widespread and persistent deception reduces reliability, and certain kinds of hallucination might involve a different relevant etiology from normal veridical perception). On a world-involving view, the mere fact that the agent is veridically perceiving means that the agent has a kind of justification that no hallucinating subject could have. Such a view is sometimes also referred to as “epistemological disjunctivism” (Pritchard 2012), though some proponents reject this label (Schellenberg 2018). On this sort of view, the agent in the “good” case (veridical perception) has the best sort of empirical evidence one could hope for: the world itself is made manifest through perception; the agent in the “bad” case (hallucination) has either no justification at all (Byrne 2014, 2016) or a different and presumably inferior kind of justification (Williamson 2000, Millar 2011, 2019, Schellenberg 2013, 2018).

Common to the various forms of epistemological disjunctivism is the idea that, normally, when you see a barn, you thereby know that there’s a barn in front of you. This can be understood in two very different ways. On the “evidential” construal, the relevant seeing is a non-doxastic, non-epistemic factive experiential state, on which your belief that there’s a barn is based. This state can be understood along the lines of metaphysical disjunctivism (section 2.1.4, 2.3.3 above), as a world-involving relation of a subject to a perceptual object; or it can be understood as an internal (e.g., representational) state that has a different epistemic potency when it’s veridical. On the “constitutive” construal, your seeing that there’s a barn just is your knowing that there’s a barn, since seeing that p is a determinate of the determinable, knowing that p. The first kind of seeing is consistent with the agent being in fake barn country (see entry on epistemology), or having good reasons to believe they’re being deceived, or suspending belief about whether there’s a barn; the second kind of seeing—assuming that defeaters and environmental luck block knowledge, and that knowledge requires belief—is not.

The pioneer of this general approach is John McDowell (1982), although it is difficult to know just what view he endorses. There are hints of metaphysical disjunctivism and an evidential construal of seeing, especially in earlier writings, although he has long insisted that one does not see that there’s a barn in fake barn country. One possibility is that McDowell’s talk about seeing is simply a particular kind of “conclusive reason” (in the sense of Dretske 1971) (Graham and Pederson 2020).

One key motivation for a world-involving approach is the idea that if the warrant (/evidence/justification) that we have in the good case is no different from the warrant we have in the bad case, then it must be in itself neutral between these possibilities and thus can’t justify, say, the belief that there’s a real table there, rather than a hallucinated table—at least, not without a hefty contribution from background knowledge (McDowell 1982, 2011, 2018). A second motivation is the claim that some or all evidence is factive. Some epistemologists hold that all evidence is factive, in the sense that only true things can serve as evidence (Williamson 2000, Littlejohn 2012, Byrne 2014); this would preclude hallucinations from conferring evidence on perceptual beliefs. Schellenberg (2013, 2018) argues that successful exercises of perceptual capacities yield a special, superior, kind of evidence—“factive evidence”—which is absent in cases of hallucination, though she thinks hallucinations do provide another kind of evidence (section 3.1.4 above).

Direct world-involvement theories tend to be instances of modest foundationalism (section 3.1.4 above), holding that perceptual knowledge and justification are direct, and therefore denying the Metaevidential Principle, at least in a form that holds that the metaevidential knowledge/justification is prior to the perceptual knowledge/justification. Some proponents also reject the No-Good-Reason Claim, holding that in veridical perception, not only is the world manifest to us, but so is that fact (Pritchard 2012, McDowell 2011), even though the good case and the bad case are in some sense indistinguishable. This would support a form of access internalism, though an unusual one and one that some other internalists will find unsatisfactory (Smithies 2013). Although mentalist internalism is defined in terms of nonfactive mental states, McDowell’s defense of epistemological disjunctivism has always been motivated by a kind of internalism, and he thinks that states of seeing, though factive, satisfy whatever needs our internalist intuitions demand. Other versions of the view are staunchly externalist (Williamson 2000, Schellenberg 2013).

The biggest objection to this general approach is that it doesn’t allow or doesn’t illuminate perceptual justification in cases of error, at least not in cases of hallucination. Those with more conventional internalist intuitions will think that some or all hallucination victims will be just as justified as veridical perceivers (even though the former won’t be in a position thereby to know). In fact, the New Evil Demon objection to reliabilism (section 3.1.6 above, entry on reliabilist epistemology) takes this as an obvious starting point, and many externalists have crafted or modified their theories to accommodate this intuition (Goldman 1986, 1988, Graham 2012). Some disjunctivists have tried to blunt the impact of this objection by suggesting that there’s another kind of justification or another route to justification available in the bad case. Schellenberg (2013, 2018) allows that there’s a degree or dimension of justification available even in the bad case; and Williamson (2000) suggests that sufficiently sophisticated hallucinators have introspective knowledge that things look F, and this affords them inferential justification for thinking that something is F.

4. Conclusion

The epistemological problems of perception have traditionally centered on the threat of skepticism, in particular, on the “veil of perception” implicated by a well-known metaphysics of perception, which threatens to lead to skepticism. Although much of the history of philosophy has involved attempts to find metaphysical solutions to this problem, recent decades have seen a proliferation of dedicatedly epistemological theories, offering more direct responses to these concerns. Even if we have a metaphysics in place, we will still need to make difficult decisions about the epistemology. Various evidential, etiological, and direct world-involvement theories have been proposed, including combinations of these. Each of these three admits of internalist as well as externalist variants. The result is an active and ongoing area of research in epistemology.


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Other Internet Resources


Thanks to Bill Fish and Susanna Siegel for comments on earlier drafts, and to Joe Cruz, Alvin Goldman, Peter Graham, Chris Hill, Anna-Sara Malmgren, and Tom Senor for helpful discussion.

Copyright © 2023 by
Jack Lyons <jack.lyons@glasgow.ac.uk>

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