Notes to Pleasure

Advice to the Reader: These notes provide further discussion and often further references, often of specialized interest, and are not intended for readers seeking an overview or reading in a single sitting. Single notes may cover up to a paragraph in the main entry text and may address different topics in different paragraphs, so readers are invited to skim for topics of interest the main text suggests.

1. This very long note defends its inclusive use of “pleasure” and “pain” – and the naturalness of the prima facie distinction thereby drawn. It also distinguishes such uses from others. This use of “pain” is discussed in the paragraph just below, the distinction between sensation and affect salient there in the next, and the substantive contrast between pain and pleasure in the two following. The remainder of the note (flagged by a brief introductory paragraph) discusses the wide cultural and historical currency of inclusive usage of “pleasure” and semantically similar terms, distinguishes other uses, and ends with three paragraphs discussing the rejection of the inclusive use and concept by some ‘ordinary language philosophers’ of the mid-twentieth century. Throughout a broader linguistic and cultural perspective is attempted, in contrast to their practice of drawing universal conclusions about pleasure exclusively from their intuitions about current English usage, in keeping with then-current British philosophical fashion, although these writers typically had broader linguistic evidence ready to hand.

Inclusive affective use of “pain”, contrasting with inclusive use of “pleasure”, is old in English (probably as old as the narrow use for pain sensation [OED, ad loc.]), however metaphorical it may seem now. No alternative has enduringly replaced “pain” in this everyday use; it is, however, often helpful to alternate “suffering” or “distress” with it, to make clear the shared meaning one intends. As Locke’s similar supplementary use of “uneasiness” (n. 2 below) shows, this problem is nothing new. (It has led some to prefer Hobbes’ now-obsolete use of “displeasure” [e.g., Schroeder 2004] – or even the nineteenth century coinage “unpleasure”, imitating the use of “Unlust” in German [defended as the only English opposite of “pleasure” in Rachels 2004]. Both are unidiomatic in living English and further seem to controversially [see two paragraphs down] prejudge that affective pain is really related to pleasure as its contrary or polar opposite.) Common speech aside, there is a history of similarly inclusive usage in a longstanding and continuing theoretical discourse, beginning in ancient Greek and Latin. “Pleasure” and “pain” have long been the established English translations used in continuing this discourse. Thomas Aquinas relevantly distinguishes between two uses of the Latin “dolor”, a narrow one restricted to bodily pain and an inclusive one covering thought-mediated sorrow (“tristitia”) as well (ST 1a 2æ 35,2). In ancient Greek philosophy the most standard term for inclusive affective pain, “lupē”, is associated more with the grief of bereavement than with bodily pain. (Stoics, accordingly, used a different term when contrasting bodily pain with pleasant sensory experiences [Long and Sedley 1987, Vol. 1, p. 421; Cooper 1996a/1999, p. 245/415; Cooper 1998/1999, pp. 75, 401n13/454]). They, however, used “hēdonē” ambiguously to contrast with both, meaning sometimes affective pleasure but sometimes pleasant sensory experiences, similarly to uses (2) and (4) distinguished six paragraphs below. Cicero (2001 translation) notes this and disambiguates when translating into Latin [de finibus III, 35].)

The distinction between sensation and affect was sometimes obscured in the associationist psychology and dawning neurology of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries despite a long-term trend toward recognizing the distinctiveness of affect culminating in Kant’s making Feeling a separate faculty alongside Cognition and Desire (Kant 1790/2000; see the Bibliography note on this). The distinction between affective feelings and sensations became a special subject of controversy among introspectionist experimental psychologists of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. Some classified affective feelings with sensations or even identified them with specific bodily sensations (Gardiner, Metcalf, and Beebe-Center 1937, pp. 337–39; Titchener 1924, Lectures II and III; see n. 2, ¶3 below for more). But a distinction between affective distress and pain sensation is recovered already in Bertrand Russell 1921, pp. 69–72, following the neurologist Henry Head (cf. Trigg 1970, pp. 2ff.; Aydede 2000). This distinction seems now well established in science and philosophy, although some resistance from philosophers remains (e.g., Helm 2002). The dissociable sensory and affective components normally associated in bodily pain seem each to have their own psychological and physiological reality. For further discussion see Aydede 20013, §§ 5 and 6.1, which also links to comprehensive pain bibliographies at its end. For further discussion of the sensory/affective distinction, focused more on pleasure, see §1.1, ¶2 and n. 2 below ad loc.

Contemporary psychologists’ contrast of positive affect with negative affect allows that these may not be magnitudes that can be added together or represented as in opposite directions along a single natural dimension. Indeed, David Watson and his collaborators, prominent contributors to the relevant psychological literature, have throughout argued that they are not. He believes himself to be indicating two orthogonal (separable and independent in mathematical analysis) dimensions of affect. (See Watson 2000, pp. 26–33 and 44–54, for his reasons and for references to the psychological literature.) The use of “positive” and “negative” to partition affective states is decades older; the idea of such partition is ancient and so is recognition of its difficulties and subtleties. Plato argues that many emotions typically involve feelings of both pleasure and pain (Philebus 47E1–50C9) and Aristotle (likewise quoting Homer’s Achilles, Iliad xviii:108–10) allowed in his early Rhetoric that this is the case at least for anger (because it typically involves taking pleasure in thoughts of conspicuous revenge, and not only pain at the thought of an undeserved conspicuous slight, Rhetoric II, 2:1378a31–b9) and also that some of what intuitively count as passions or emotions (pathē) need not involve occurrent pleasure or pain (Cooper 1996a/1999). The basic distinction between feeling good and feeling bad is, so far, a very well supported and almost universally recognized one. (The claim, in a paper written jointly by a senior philosopher and a social psychology graduate student, that no single distinction in this area is central to affect, seems uninformed on the relevant harder science; see the Bibliography note on Solomon and Stone 2002.) “Valence” is also used in psychological literature to mark the same contrast between affective pleasure and affective pain, or distress. (For further discussion, see n. 29 below.)

Once pleasure and pain are thought of as independent realities, neither of which consists in the mere absence of the other, and that, for all we know intuitively, might be based in different biological states or neural systems, Watson’s position should not be that surprising – even to a hedonist who supposes that only pleasure is intrinsically good and only pain intrinsically bad. The appearance that pleasure, or feeling good, must be the contrary of pain, or feeling bad, and so must pro tanto (i.e., to the extent it is present) exclude pain, may derive from the semantic polar opposition of good and bad. But even if this semantic opposition enters into the analysis of the concepts pleasure and pain, that would not imply that feeling or experience that is (or seems) intrinsically good must psychobiologically exclude feeling or experience that is (or seems) intrinsically bad, any more than it follows merely from this same semantic opposition that good music and bad cannot simultaneously fill the same space or affect the same person. Whether and how a person can have mixed good and bad feelings is an old empirical question. From Plato’s discussion of the pain of hunger’s correlation with pleasure in eating (Gorgias 495D2–497D7) to contemporary discussions of temperament and mood, it has been argued that the correlations between pleasure and suffering do not support their absolutely or even pro tanto excluding each other, as someone’s sitting and standing or something’s speed and slowness do. The cumulative psychological evidence, both on occurrent feeling and temperament, that they do not always (even pro tanto) exclude each other is plausible (Thayer 1989, 1996; Watson 2000). (But cf. J.A. Russell 1991 and J.A. Russell and Barrett 1999, opponents of Watson and Thayer on this question.) Differences in brain physiological basis (see §3 below on pleasure and Rainville 2002 on negative affect in pain) are relevant but not decisive, since we are dealing with phenomena ‘re-represented’ at successive levels of hierarchical brain organization rather than simply localized in one area, as is sometimes suggested (e.g., Schroeder 2004). And surely information about positive and negative affect are integrated at some level, as overall reports on how one’s feeling and everyday trade-offs when choosing between options containing both pleasure and pain clearly show. The task of telling whether we really experience a single integrated affective experience utility or only have the ability to report an affect-free representation used in forming a single decision utility will not be an easy one (Berridge and O’Doherty, 2014). (For additional historical perspective and references on the dimensional structure of affect, see n. 29.)

The remainder of this note defends the inclusive usage of “pleasure” and semantically similar terms adopted here and distinguishes such uses from others. This may be unneeded by readers untroubled by the philosophical literature of 1949–1973 referenced in this note’s last three paragraphs. Those willing to provisionally accept this inclusive usage without evidence that it is widespread and grounded in natural ways of categorizing experience (and thus not to be dismissed out of hand as a mere philosophers’ confusion or tendentious invention) may wish to skip now to this note’s last paragraph.

The inclusive usage seems to mark a natural attractor in human semantic or conceptual space. Inclusive uses of terms such as “pleasure” run through an historically connected discourse in European languages from ancient Greece to the present, often using Greek “hēdonē” and “chara”, Latin “voluptas”, “laetitia”, and “delectatio”, and their descendants and translations in modern languages. Similar uses seem to occur elsewhere, as sometimes in the Buddhist Sanskrit contrast of “sukha” with “duḥkha” using prefixes for good and bad congruently with the English contrast of “feeling good” with “feeling bad”. And the linguist Anna Wierzbicka suggests, on the basis of broader linguistic evidence, that all languages can express feeling good, with those lacking a special lexical item using ones for good and feeling (which seem everywhere present) together for this (Wierzbicka 1999, pp. 279–82, 292–93). Cross-cultural evidence on the categorization of emotions, summarized in J.A. Russell 1991, also tends to support a culturally universal category of positive affect. Such inclusive or generic usage is thus not easily dismissed as a mere philosophers’ invention. (To what extent such categorization is a true guide to something deeper in our nature is the larger question that is a principal subject of §§ 2 and 3 below.) Inclusive uses are not restricted to high theory. Ordinary speech, song, and lyric poetry use them freely as well.

Many terms used for (1) inclusive or generic pleasure have related uses in which they denote (2) pleasant, or at least typically pleasant, experiences, sometimes especially sensory experiences or to (3) someone’s being placated or pleased by, or pleased or satisfied with or about, someone or something. Latin origins in verbs tied to (3) may leave traces in nonaffective uses of “pleasure” and cognate terms. (For example, the placita of Roman law, medieval, and modern law were agreeable only in that they were things agreed to or accepted by the parties or authorities concerned; they were thus marked as expressions of decision or consent, rather than of merriment or of feeling contented. Later and current nonaffective uses of cognates are noted four paragraphs below.) “Pleasure” and its cognates displaced from common speech, in their inclusive usage, older English words that were becoming tainted by impolite associations; e.g., “lust” (see OED, ad loc.).

Beyond these uses involving mental states, acts, or processes involving positive affect, there are related uses in which (4) the particular or typical occasions, causes, or objects on which instances of these psychological phenomena depend may be called “pleasures” and the like. (On the parallel Greek usage of “hēdonai”, see Owen 1971–72, a landmark paper applying this distinction to the interpretation of Aristotle’s two discussions of pleasure in the Nicomachean Ethics. Analogous English usage permits an annoying person, job, fact, or circumstance to be called “a pain”.) For discussion of various uses of “pleasure” and overlapping terms in English, see Perry 1967, pp. 41–73. For usages in other languages, see, besides standard dictionaries and lexicons, such as those listed in the Bibliography, the discussion of various uses of “sukha” in Pali Buddhist texts by Buddhaghosa, 1920–21 translation, I, i, pp. 52–54.

“Physical pleasure”, “bodily pleasure”, “sensory pleasure”, and “pleasures of sensation” may be used for the sensory part of the range of (2) or for restrictions of either (1) or (4) to cases involving that. For many ancient and medieval writers and for their modern followers such as Descartes and Brentano, such uses involve an implied contrast with pleasure in or caused by thinking, judging, or willing. (Notes 19–21 below provide citations.) Differences in higher cognitive involvement also lie behind joy being often classified as an emotion, involving more explicit positive evaluation of something (e.g., Duncker 1941, pp. 401–2), rather than with pleasure as a mere feeling. Thomas Aquinas uses the cognate “gaudium” for the intellectually-caused species of pleasure (delectatio): Summa Theologiæ 1a 2æ 31,3, following a distinction transmitted through translation from the Arabic of ibn Sina (‘Avicenna’), citing his De Anima IV, 5, 2iva. (This is the psychological part, al-Nafs, of Kitab al-Shifa’, the chief philosophical work of this important Islamic physician and philosopher who lived in Central Asia and Persia, 980–1037.) Cf. the similar distinction in Buddhist texts discussed in § 3.3, ¶3. For Hobbes and Locke also joy is pleasure of the mind (Hobbes, 1651/1994, I,vi,¶12; Locke, 1700/1979, II,xx,7). And Aquinas (ST 1a 2æ 35,2 and 36,1) similarly distinguishes between the genus, inclusive pain (dolor), and its intellectually caused species, sorrow (tristitia). Still the tradition, with common sense, regarded pleasure and pain as single topics. Thus Plato and Aristotle, despite their insistence on the diversity of pleasure and their use of the distinction between pleasure of the body and of the mind, still treat pleasure as a single subject and use ordinary terms inclusively when discussing it (§2.2).

However, during the vogue of ‘ordinary language philosophy’, between 1949 and 1973, some philosophers writing in English rejected the inclusive conception of pleasure on the basis of claims about the disparate usage of relevant expressions in contemporary English, often emphasizing differences between “enjoying (activities and experiences)” and “being pleased” (by states of affairs or the like). See, for example, Kenny 1963, p. 55; Perry 1967, especially pp. 214–17; and contrast Gosling 1969 on “being pleased” with Taylor 1963, pp. 8–9 on uses of “being pleased with ...” signifying dispositional contentment that may obtain absent any occurrent positive affect, similarly to use (3) of three paragraphs above. (Fred Feldman’s account of pleasure as a pure propositional attitude that need involve no affect may respond in part to this use; Feldman 2004, discussed in §2.3.2 below.) William of Ockham, in discussing a similar ambiguity in the Latin cognate “complacens” of the everyday Latin shared by medieval European elites with diverse first languages, notes a similar sense in which someone might be said to be pleased (complacens) without taking pleasure (delectat, cognate with “delight”) (2001, Q. 3, 3b ii, pp. 379/411–12). See three paragraphs above for the likely origin of these uses, signifying dispositional, attitudinal, or behavioral acquiescence (or perhaps absence of negative affect), rather than positive affect, toward the content concerned, in their shared linguistic history. See Goldstein 1985 for critical discussion of the 1949–1973 literature and its method, Aydede 2000 for a longer, more general and sympathetic discussion, and Trigg 1970 for its most substantial contribution, of which only Ch. VI focuses on pleasure (as discussed briefly in n. 2, ¶4, below).

Whatever the details of such usages may be, a longstanding human theme and concern should not be dismissed solely on the basis of local usage – and still less on the basis of linguistic intuitions about this produced as needed by philosophers engaged in arguing a point. Writing from a broader linguistic perspective, Wierzbicka and Harkins (2001, p. 17) have noted modern spoken English’s unusual scarcity of ‘active’ intransitive verbs for feeling and emotion and its preference for using ‘passive’ adjectives instead for these. In this linguistic climate, ‘enjoying activities’ and ‘being pleased by something’ may seem to exhaustively divide pleasure’s territory and thus to show that some ulterior activity, content, or object is logically required in every case (e.g., Perry 1967, pp. 214–17). But as Gosling observed looking back over this literature, that “feel pleased” requires a complement seems nothing deeper than an English grammatical demand (1969, p. 153), perhaps in this case connected with the etymology of “pleasure” noted four paragraphs above. Others had put much weight on such grammatical matters; for example, Ryle had concluded from “enjoy” being a transitive verb, requiring an object, that enjoyment cannot exist on its own, as a matter of conceptual necessity (1954a, p. 61). But it had not always been so with commonly used English terms occupying much the same semantic space. Jolly English hosts of centuries past who bade their guests ‘rejoice, make merry, and be of good cheer’ were not, by grammatical necessity, also inviting them to find suitable objects to do these toward, since there was in each case an established intransitive use. Neither need the “wine that maketh glad the heart of man” (Psalms, 104:15, King James Version) provide an object or content in so doing, either in ancient Hebrew, the King’s English, or that of psychopharmacology. These points are worth noting, since while the mid-twentieth-century philosophical literature is fading from memory, it is still sometimes assumed that it showed all inclusive usage artificial and illegitimate, “enjoyment” a more philosophically respectable substitute for “pleasure”, or pleasure to always consist in an ‘attitude’ like belief and desire, necessarily taking an intentional or even a propositional object, as a matter of something deeper than parochial grammatical necessity. (The question of whether pleasure has intentional structure will come up again, briefly later in this section and then throughout §2.3.)

Following inclusive usage, “pleasure”, “joy”, their cognates, and near synonyms will often be used freely and almost interchangeably here, guided by idiomatic usage – while leaving open how much deeper psychological unity and diversity such inclusive usage and its narrower cousins conceal or reveal. We shall in §§3.2 and 3.3 consider scientific evidence bearing on this substantive question, on which ordinary language provides only a small part of the total evidence – and any single term’s or language’s use over an historically short time a very small part indeed.

2. Locke 1700/1979, An Essay concerning Human Understanding, II, xx, 1. Beyond his account there in Chapter XX, see his hedonistic views of motivation and practical reasons in II, vii, 2-6 and II, xxi, 39-46. Hume allows that experiences of pleasure may be “very different” so long as they “have only such a distant resemblance, as is requisite [on the empiricist view of the formation of such concepts that he shared with Locke] to make them be express’d by the same abstract term” (A Treatise of Human Nature iii, i, 2; cf. Smith 1790/1976, Labukt 2012). Kant like Locke regards pleasure (Lust) as admitting of no precise intrinsic verbal definition, but offers indirect causal and functional characterizations (1790/2000, p. 33/Ak. 20:231; see Bibliography note for more on Kant). Locke, in contrast, often omits pleasure’s traditional direct connection with motivation, but only because he believes that pleasure’s equally conceptually primitive evil twin, ‘uneasiness’ (i.e., pain, II, xx, 15), plays the predominant or even sole direct role there, with pleasure motivating mainly or solely by way of the painfulness of its represented lack (II, xx, 6; II, xxi, 31–47, 59, 64), at least in our needy earthly state (II, xxi, 46).

The simple picture of pleasure and further hedonistic views which Locke share had common ancient antecedents with other views Locke and his followers also shared. Epicurus’ ancient hedonism, atomism in physics, and empiricism about knowledge had been revived and Christianized in the Renaissance (see text translations in Kraye, 1997, Part VI) and then promoted by Gassendi (1592–1655), who through his writings and followers in continental Europe influenced Locke. The Epicureans, however, may not have explicitly distinguished between sensory states and affective ones, although a similar distinction may be presupposed on some interpretations of their fragmentary literary remains (e.g., Cooper 1999a; for more references, see n. 30).

Locke thus seems not to identify pleasure with any bodily sensation proper and the same may well be predominantly true of his tradition, despite broad use of the word ‘sensation’ and frequent attributions of ‘the sensation view of pleasure’ in the literature. Some who use such language in rejecting it, however, intend in doing so to include (and perhaps to ridicule by this characterization) feeling views such as Locke’s actual view as well and thus to reject the simple picture of pleasure and its experiential core generally (e.g., Anscombe 1957/1963, p. 77, discussed in §1.2 and accompanying n. 5 below).

Descartes, despite his varying and sometimes misleading use of terms, seems consistently to distinguish mere pleasant sensation from the soul’s contingent and variable affective reaction to it, even when he is well translated as calling the former “pleasure” (in a use close to use 2 of n. 1, ¶8) and the latter delight or joy of the soul. Descartes thus approximates to the point credited to Ryle in the text, but in a Stoic-influenced psychology and dualist metaphysics for which sensory, appetitive, and many affective processes (all on his view involving union of immaterial mind and material body) present special difficulties. Relevant short passages include: Treatise on Man (CSM I, p. 103; AT XI, p. 144). Discourse on Method (CSM I, p. 141; AT VI, p. 59). Meditation VI (CSM II, pp. 52, 53; AT VII, pp. 74, 76). Principles of Philosophy I, §48 (CSM I, p. 209; AT VIII–I, p. 23) and IV, §§190–91 (CSM I, pp. 281–82; AT VIII–I, pp. 317–18). Letter to Princess Elisabeth, 6 Oct. 1645 (CSM III, pp. 270–71; AT IV–II, pp. 309–12). And, most especially, Passions of the Soul II, §§91 and 94 (CSM I, pp. 360–62; AT XI, pp. 396–400) and also II, §137 (CSM, I, p. 376; AT, XI, p. 430). Since Descartes (CSM III, p. 271; AT IV, p. 312 and Passions II, 94, cited above), philosophers have been accusing others of confusing tickles and other sensations proper with pleasure, although it is not easy to find theorists who explicitly did so, except in the late introspectionist psychology discussed in the next paragraph. Ordinary language often uses the same terms on both sides of this divide; see uses (1) and (2) of n. 1, ¶8 above. And philosophers, including Descartes himself, do, too. (In trying to make Descartes’ usage, in translation, more consistent than his French usage, in their passage last cited, CSM translate “plaisir” [used by him here, unlike in some other places, to mark the affect side of the divide and explicitly as interchangeable with “joie”, joy] as “enjoyment”, rather than by the cognate “pleasure”.)

However, in the heyday of the neurology-influenced introspectionist experimental psychology of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, when the reduction of affects to sensations proper, with specific sensory transducers and nerve tracts, seemed a reasonable scientific project (e.g., Nichols 1892, pp. 404–5), the empiricist philosopher and introspectionist psychologist Karl Stumpf actually classified sensory pleasure with sensations (Chisholm 1987; Titchener 1908, pp. 82–121, provides lengthy quotations, discussion, and criticism), Bourdon identified ‘sensations of pleasure’ (supposedly analogous to sensations of pain) with unlocalized faint tickling supposedly involving special tickle receptors in the skin (Titchener 1908, pp. 81–82; Bourdon 1893), and, finally, the early twentieth century introspectionist psychologist Nafe identified pleasure wholly with bodily sensations of specific kinds (Beebe-Center 1951, p. 257; Gardiner, Metcalf and Beebe-Center, 1937, p. 339; Beebe-Center 1932, pp. 74–5, 347–9 and more generally for discussion of the relevant literature of late introspectionist psychology, pp. 67–89). Controversies over such results, using trained introspectors as subjects, and often not reproducible by other introspectionist laboratories with their own trained subjects, helped lead to introspectionist psychology’s demise. However, bright, light, or warm feelings in the chest, apparently similar to those reported by Nafe, have been reported recently by social psychologists interviewing subjects said to be experiencing a positive affect of moral elevation (Haidt 2003, p. 864). These are presumably autonomic symptoms, like the sinking feelings in the gut that may accompany distress. But those suffering autonomic failure experience affect despite this loss (although without the amplification somatic feedback may bring), thus refuting purely autonomic theories of affect. Ryle’s (or Descartes’, preceding paragraph) point in the text, so far, seems correct: any sensation proper may be enjoyed or not, and might even become an annoying nuisance during an otherwise enjoyable experience, and is thereby shown not to be pleasure. Such sensations may be ‘sensations (symptomatic) of pleasure’ on a par with feelings (symptomatic) of indigestion. But just as those feelings are not one’s indigestion, these sensations are not the pleasure itself. While this seems right at least to a first approximation, an appreciation of how science may change our psychological categories bars our sharing Ryle’s complete confidence in intuitions based in them. A.D. (Bud) Craig (2002, 2009, 2015) provides new evidence for the distinctiveness of interoceptive bodily feeling from other sensation and connecting it, by way of its re-representation, with affect, in ways that that might be used to make a case against a sharp sensory/affective distinction while maintaining a distinction between affectively toned and affectively neutral bodily sensations instead. However, his claims for the necessity of anterior insular cortical activity for positive affective experience are not generally accepted and may involve denying this to young children and animals; a role rather in its cognitive integration and control seems more likely.

Affective pleasure or pain may, thus or otherwise, in whole or part, be regarded as representing bodily states, by virtue of responding to the fulfillment of needs or to good bodily conditions, as such, if only in an austere functional and information-processing sense (not involving such information being accessible by a subject as such), as warranted by studies of the relevant physiological systems, their connections, and likely functions. Hypotheses of Plato (§2.2.1) and Descartes (see, additionally and especially Passions of the Soul, II, 93 & 95 (CSM pp. 361 & 362; AT pp. 398 & 400) may be thus understood. This would also be a minimalist way of understanding the recent suggestions of Antonio Damasio (1994, chs. 8 & 9; 1999 passim; 2003, pp. 85–90, 105–8, 111–12, 137–38; Adolphs and Damasio 2001, pp. 28–30; cf. Craig 2002, 2009, 2015), on which the relevant information-bearing affective states may be unlike the states we standardly count as bodily sensations in that their bodily informational content is typically beyond the ability of human subjects to report. Even on this minimalist reading, however, Damasio such interpretations of affective neuroscience remain of interest for intentional accounts of pleasure (§2.3 below) and representational theories of mind (e.g., Tye 1995, pp. 128–30). The areas important in affect do not include the primary somatosensory cortex. Still, their being able to produce chills and shivers ‘of pleasure’ (Damasio 2003, pp. 102–3) gives one pause. However, if these are, as it seems, somatic symptoms that may be either liked or disliked, Ryle’s point and our distinction between sensation proper and affect would still apply. (See Trigg 1970, Ch. VI, pp. 102–24 for a clear statement of the case for there not being sensations of pleasure on a par with sensations of pain; also Aydede 2000.) It is, however, possible that the distinction between sensation proper and affect, defended so far above, is like much else in the brain (including cognitive processing) a matter of degree. Feelings of hot and cold, as Craig (2002) points out, seem to have especially close connections both with affect and with homeostatic need or drive states. And feelings of nausea seem especially hard to like, however generally persuasive Ryle’s claim may be. Distinguishing cold cognitive representation, affect, and motivation may even so be possible, if not always by distinguishing between psychobiological occurrences, then between their naturally specifiable properties or relations. This tripartite distinction has not yet been shown to be founded only in our cognition, in our natural/intuitive theory of mind.

3. Late nineteenth and early twentieth century introspectionist psychology had aimed to discover the supposed basic introspectible elements of conscious experience and validate them using reports of specially trained subjects. But such reports had proved too plastic and easily biased by different laboratories’ training to settle contested questions, such as whether pleasure and pain are specific sensations, elements of mind of a kind distinct from sensations, or ‘hedonic tones’ incapable of independent existence but qualifying other introspected elements of mind (Beebe-Center 1932; Alston 1967, pp. 333–34). From a contemporary scientific point view, while the sensation/affect distinction seems plausible, questions about which experiential features are mental atoms and which their essential and which their accidental properties seem idle relicts of psychology’s High Introspectionist past. Features seem typically to arise separately, preconsciously, and locally and then sometimes to be bound in more global integrative processing, rather than there being experiential substantial particulars in which their ontologically dependent features inhere. (For a psychologist applying this threefold Aristotelian distinction between substances, essential properties, see Duncker, 1941, 399–400 and note the tension with what he actually introspects on p. 404. For a philosopher’ claim that it is logically necessary that pleasure inhere in some experience with nonhedonic qualities, see Broad, 1930, 235 and 228ff. more generally.)

In time the project of distinguishing invariant kinds of basic element given as such in conscious experience was rejected as untrue to the contextual plasticity shown by experiential reports. Not long afterward introspection as a formal method of academic psychological inquiry was abandoned, too. Having rejected the claim of introspection to be the one true method for experimental psychology, and lacking the methodological pluralism by which we now seek a consilience of evidence converging from a wide variety of methods and sources (e.g., from brain imaging, computational modeling, and self-report), psychology and related areas of economics and philosophy took a sharp behaviorist turn.

4. Ryle: 1949, Ch. IV, esp. pp. 107–10, principally followed in the text; cf. 1954a, especially pp. 58–61 and 1954b, especially pp. 136–38. The view accorded qualified praise in his 1954a, p. 60, ¶1 may be Aristotle’s. Further discussion is provided in the Bibliography notes to these. A possible explanation for the difficulty of introspecting pleasure, which had earlier led to the rejection of experiential views of pleasure in psychology which lies behind the views of Ryle and his followers, is offered in §1.3, last two paragraphs.

The view that pleasure is not a conscious experience had become fairly standard in psychology classrooms and literature during the increasingly behaviorist 1920s, 1930s, and 1940s, in the wake of the collapse of the introspectionist project described at the end of §1.1 above. The prevalent methodology emphasized that the concepts of psychology, as of other sciences, are constructed, rather than given in experience. See Beebe-Center 1951, pp. 255–59 and 295–96, which parades these views as proud achievements of the past decades, with quotations and references. That subjective experience might even so contribute something to this construction and be part of a psychological concept’s reference seems not to have been considered.

5. G.E.M. Anscombe, Intention, 1963/1957, pp. 77–78. A shorter version appears in the seventh paragraph of her widely reprinted “Modern Moral Philosophy”, 1981b/1958, which appears in her 1981a, Vol. 3, at p. 27. (Her moral animus against utilitarianism and its relation to her dismissive treatment of pleasure are there explicit.) Others of the same era also put much emphasis on the concept’s ordinary language explanatory role, sometimes to the point of seeming to reduce the term’s meaning to its conversation-stopping force, as when the answer, “For pleasure,” blocks the further question, “What for?” E.g., Nowell-Smith 1954, pp. 111–115 127–32. (Contrast Moran 2004, discussed toward this section’s end, who takes the same answer to commit one to being able to specify, on demand, exactly what one finds pleasant and how.) Cf. Kenny, 1963, pp. 34–45, where the point is made but its overemphasis criticized (at pp. 140–41), as also in Gosling (1969). The observation that we never ask for a further motive beyond enjoyment is credited by Aristotle to an argument of Eudoxus. (NE X,1:1172b20–23).

Anscombe explicitly draws on Wittgenstein’s views of mind, drawing a parallel between Wittgenstein’s rejection of an experience picture of meaning in his Philosophical Investigations and her own rejection of the simple picture of pleasure. For a taste of Wittgenstein’s own much more tentative and less dismissive late work on affect, see his Philosophical Investigations, §244 and p. 189 and, from his notebooks, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol. 1, ed. G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright (Oxford: Blackwell, 1980) §§449–453, 807 and 896.

Anscombe’s strongly but sparsely stated dismissal of hedonism and of pleasure was influentially accepted by John Rawls, A Theory of Justice, 2nd ed., 1999 [passage unchanged from 1st ed., 1971]), pp. 489–90, n. 28 [1st ed., p. 559, n. 27]). Rawls’ main argument in this section (§84. Hedonism as a Method of Choice), for the conclusion that hedonistic utilitarianism provides no general decision procedure for ethics that removes the need for deliberative judgment, does not depend on Wittgenstein’s views, but as Rawls notes may be supported on premises seemingly granted by the hedonistic utilitarian Henry Sidgwick (1907) just as well. The upshot of Rawls’ discussion is that granting that pleasure is no introspectible homogeneous magnitude, as Sidgwick does, removes what Sidgwick elsewhere regards as hedonistic utilitarianism’s decisive advantage over pluralistic moral common sense – its specifying a single end (maximizing total pleasure) that, in principle, determines what ought or may be done in each case, epistemic difficulties aside. (Cf. III, xi with III, xiv of Sidgwick 1907.)

Sidgwick, having failed to find any special introspectible quality distinguishing his experiences of pleasure (1907, pp. 127–31), characterized pleasure as “Desirable Consciousness or Feeling of whatever kind” (p. 402). His hedonistic methods come down to judging comparative desirability, guided by affective memory. This seemed to Rawls not to track an independent truth about value but rather to deliberatively construct one. That was not Sidgwick’s intention. “[E]thical Hedonism has chiefly a negative significance; for the statement that ‘Pleasure is the Ultimate Good’ will only mean that nothing is ultmately desirable except desirable feeling, apprehended as desirable by the sentient individual at the time of feeling it” (1907, p. 129). Sidgwick thus intended momentary cognitive perspectives on desirability to constrain the correctness of judgments of value made at remote times. Hence he took the risks of error in comparisons of pleasure experienced at different times seriously (1907, II, iii), as he could not have done had his method given deliberation a more autonomous good-constitutive role, as Rawls came to do. What are aggregated are not quantities of a homogeneous felt quality (which Sidgwick doubts) but experiences’ momentarily apprehended degrees of desirability. Deliberation is limited to the role of a hypothetical transtemporal (and ‘transworld’, across possible situations) ideal observer-and-desirer, choosing so as to maximize the aggregate of desirabiliity, known from momentary experiential perspectives (from which hedonic experience is, presumably, thought of as inseparable) and then imperfectly represented in actual, non-ideal memory. Sidgwick 1907, I, ix, 3, pp. 109–13 and pp. 127–31, on which see Christiano 1992 and the further discussion in n. 18 below.

The eminent psychologist Daniel Kahneman in the 1990s was similarly realist about magnitudes of momentary pleasure and had a similar project of establishing ‘objective utility’ on the basis of momentary hedonic experience. But he moved the definition of pleasure (“instant utility”) in a motivational direction, much as had Victorians criticized by Sidgwick (Kahneman 1999, p. 4; Sidgwick 1907, pp.  125ff.), without the subtlety of Sidgwick’s final normatively constrained position, which is also ignored or by many philosophical interpreters. (See, however the good treatment in Schneewind 1977, 316 ff.) Kahneman advanced his project by experimentally demonstrating errors in hedonic memories, using third person observations and self-reports at the time to test these. He also attempted to explain such errors systematically (Kahneman, Wakker and Sarin 1997; Kahneman 1999, 2000; Kahneman and Tversky 2000).

Supplementing memory by more objective methods may thus increase our confidence that there is a real difference between determinate intrinsic features of momentary experience and the reflective and comparative hedonic judgment and deliberation that discover and use evidence about these. Observing facial expression, posture, and behavior provide some objective evidence and connections with neuroscience and behavioral science may provide more – without abandoning the epistemic primacy of the judgment of the experiencer at the time of experiencing on which Sidgwick insists. (See, generally, his Methods 1907, I , iv, 4; II, ii, iii and vi, which last is most relevant for deciding how Sidgwick would regard this response to Rawls.) NeoSidgwickian responses to Rawls also might use hedonic deliberation and even introspective access to pleasure only to help fix the reference of “pleasure” – rather than as definitive about its presence, magnitude, or nature. Such approaches would fit well with allowing pleasure without awareness, as in n. 27 and the accompanying text at the end of §2.3.4.

6. Helm 1994, 2001a, 2001b, 2002. Helm’s larger view may have relativist consequences (Hursthouse 2002) that Anscombe would reject. And John McDowell, not Anscombe, seems to have been the formative influence on his work. Helm’s views seem more at home as an account of the more cognitively implicated and culturally embedded human emotions, which presumably suggested the view. Anscombe, moreover, wished to distinguish concept-involving emotions from pleasure (but perhaps only from pleasure not caused by thought, if her views were here, as in some other matters, close to those of Kenny [1963, p. 55] and Aquinas [ST 1a 2æ 31, 3]). With Helm, all emotion counts as pleasure or pain (as in large part, but not in all cases, for Aristotle; see Cooper 1996a/1999) and is treated similarly.

7. In taking such a view, rather than a global, externalist functionalist view (e.g., David Armstrong 1968 and Hilary Putnam in papers of the same period, reprinted in Putnam 1975, especially chs. 18 and 21) we might follow Aristotle better than Anscombe or they succeeded in doing, following the interpretation of Jessica Moss, whose 2012 integrates her scholarly articles on Aristotle of the preceding years. On her reading, Aristotle was as thoroughly empiricist in his moral epistemology as in his account of the emergence of higher cognition from sense perception, and the process begins in the nonconceptual appearance of their own good through pleasure which all animals have. Aristotle, however, was a teleologist as well as an empiricist, and this may make the induction to a conceptual representation of own good and good from nonconceptual pleasure less problematic than on a less teleological contemporary view. See, however, Elijah Millgram’s 1997.

8. Walther von der Vogelweide, “Elegie”, from the middle of the second stanza. The Middle High German text of lines 21–23, 26–29 and my own verse translation, which omits line 23 to facilitate verse translation, follows. (Lines should be read across the break, which marks a caesural pause.)

swar ich zer werlte kêre dâ ist nieman frô:
tanzen, lachen, singen zergât mit sorgen gar:
nie kristenman gesach sô jæmerlîche schar….
uns sint unsenften brieve her von Rôme komen,
uns ist erloubet trûren und fröide gar benomen.
daz müet mich inneclîchen (wir lebten ie viel wol!),
daz ich nû für mîn lachen weinen kiesen sol.
Wherever in the world I turn no one’s joyous there:
Dancing, laughing, singing are quite collapsed from cares…
Letters without charity for us from Rome arrive:
Sorrow is allowed us but all joy is denied,
So that (we always lived so well!)   I’m troubled so inside,
That I now must choose not to laugh but cry.

Textual Note: The complete poem, a very famous one, is available in many editions and anthologies. I follow a version widely printed at least from the nineteenth century until the late twentieth. Recent editions may diverge, notably in omitting “lachen” in line 22 (but not in line 29), which, however, has some manuscript support.

Historical Note: The ‘letters from Rome’ concern the Papal excommunication of the Holy Roman Emperor Frederick II Hohenstaufen in 1227. The cause was his delay in joining the Sixth Crusade – in which he in time negotiated the peaceful transfer of most of Jerusalem with its Christian shrines to Western Christian rule, while Muslim rule continued over the Sanctuary precinct with al-Aqsa Mosque. This brought peace for a time, despite protests from religious authorities on both sides.

9. Darwin 1998, p. 210. While talking is not pleasure, it is often facilitated by pleasure, perhaps through spreading activation in the left cerebral cortex (cf. Bartolic et al. 2001). For an informed proposal that a category for smiling/laughing is a linguistic/cultural universal, see Wierzbicka, 1999, pp. 282–3, 305. For a book on laughter by a scientist aimed at a general audience, see Provine 2000. For a scientific paper announcing the discovery of laughter in the ultrasonic vocalizations of laboratory rats, see Panksepp 2000b.

10. Darwin (1998), p. 211. Darwin’s evolutionary account of emotional expression as in large part “innate and instinctive” (p. 22) is in this edition brought up to date by Paul Ekman, a major contributor to its scientific revival, with references to recent scientific literature and commentary informed by this throughout and especially in his Afterword. The literature to that date, and also Ekman until then, had mainly supported a single positive basic affect but several negative ones, sadness, anger, fear, and disgust. That near-consensus is now vanished: see Izard 1991, especially Chapter 4, for a division with two basic positive emotions, joy and interest, following Tomkins 1962; neuroscience that may underly such a distinction is discussed in §3.3 below. For conjectures and evidence that there may be more than two basic positive affects than these see Panksepp 1998, 2000a, 2014 and Panksepp and Biven 2012; Fredrickson 1998; Ekman 1999a, p. 55; Haidt 2003; Hejmadi, Davidson, and Rozin 2000; Prinz 2004, pp. 155–56; Tracy and Robins 2004; Campos and Keltner 2014. Still any distinctions between positive affects do not seem as strongly marked as those between plausibly discrete negative emotions such as sadness, anger, fear, and disgust. While cross-culturally validating short lists of discrete basic emotions by translating subjects’ identifications of emotions from photographs in their own emotion terms into English, as practiced by Ekman and others in his tradition, has been methodologically criticized (see Ekman 1999b for some summary accounts with his replies), such criticism even if correct would not invalidate the category of positive affect, which is strongly supported crossculturally and uncontroversial, even if there is differentiation within it and uncertainty about how deep in the neural and experiential constitutions of pleasure and pain it goes. See Wierzbicka 1999 (pp. 279–82, 292–3, 305–7) and Harkins and Wierzbicka 2001 for a taste of some of the relevant ethnographic and linguistic literature, which is but a very small part of the relevant evidence. (The precise nature of the distinction between positive and negative affect is not yet resolved; see n. 1, ¶¶4 and 5 above and n. 29 below.)

11. For an entry to the relevant scientific literature, see Preston and de Waal 2002. Some research reviewed there suggests that perception or representation of emotion in others requires evoking the affect, to some degree, in oneself, because of overlap among the responsible neural systems. Emotional contagion, as when an infant is distressed by another’s distress, without fully distinguishing self from other, may, with the addition of cognitive resources for making this distinction, result in the development of empathy. And so it may be with the acquisition of a concept of pleasure applicable both to others and to oneself as one among others. Studies of autism, in which deficiencies in labeling one’s own emotions seem connected with problems in precise attributions to others, may support such a view. For a review, references, and interdisciplinary peer commentary, see Preston and de Waal 2002.

12. “[W]e cannot be occupied objectively and subjectively at the same instant ....” (Bain, 1876, pp. 437–8). Cf. J.S. Mill’s report of William Hamilton’s view that sensory knowledge and sensory pleasure are inversely proportional (1872/1879, p. 435). Similar thinking seems to go back at least to the mid-eighteenth century work of Johan Georg Sulzer (Gardiner, Metcalf, and Beebe-Center 1937, p. 260). While the efficacy of distraction in relieving suffering may be no news, still it is good to see it neuroscientifically confirmed (Drevets and Raichle 1998). That a similar effect holds for positive affect (which facilitates some cognitive tasks in the longer term; Fredrickson 1998, Isen 2002, Bartolic et al. 2001) has not been so clear. Research on rthe brain’s default networks may make it so and seems of great theoretical importance besides (Gusnard et al. 2001, Fox et al. 2005). It may also explain the seeming paradox that focusing one’s attention on one’s pain, like distraction from it, may lessen affective suffering. But this is relatively new and developing science, and its interpretation, here and in the main text, should be flagged as tentative and its applicability as uncertain.

13. Philebus 31D–32E, Republic 585B–586B, Timaeus 64A–65B. Van Riel 1999 and 2000 have very useful accounts of Plato’s view and the relation of Aristotle’s to it that I have in part followed here. The affective neuroscientist Jaak Panksepp, in the first textbook on that subject, makes a proposal similar to Plato’s and discusses relevant science (1998, pp. 181–86).

Plato may be interpreted as taking all pleasure to be intentional (§2.3), but perhaps only because it quasi-perceptually represents psychobiological restorations in a way partly analogous to that in which sense perception generally is about what it presents. Daniel Russell (2004), in interpreting Plato, goes further, by applying a distinction explicit in the later ancient and medieval tradition, and again nowadays (see n. 22, below), between pleasure as a feeling (or ‘sensation’) and pleasure as an emotional attitude, which is for Russell always directed toward something being the case (D. Russell, 2004, p. 4), as in the account discussed in §2.3.2 below. But Plato may have regarded these as belonging to the same affective natural continuum, perhaps always intentional (whether about things, features of perceptual experience, or states of affairs), but not regimented by construal as uniformly directed even toward propositions even for the more intellectual range of cases (which may lead to problems, as we shall see in §2.3.2). (All intentional accounts of pleasure, however, must omit any moods they construe as contentless [as many seem to be], making pleasure always a response to something it represents, rather than more inclusively [n. 1 above]). For Russell, as for Helm and Moran (§1.2), (emotional) pleasure is holistically value- and concern-laden. This seems to be no part of Plato’s general account of pleasure (and it seems to be a single and general, rather than a ‘disjunctive’, account that he offers). Even the ‘pure pleasure’ allowed into the good life in the Philebus (51B–52B, 63E) includes pleasure in simple sights, sounds, and smells, which infants and animals free of virtue- and evaluative-thought-involving projects share. (The distinction between pure and impure pleasure thus cuts across any bodily-or-sensory pleasure versus intellectual-or-emotional pleasure divide.) With these tentative caveats, Russell’s book is an excellent place to look for further citations and creative interpretation of Plato’s many treatments of pleasure, of varying date, with an eye to their connections with his moral views and to developments in later Platonist thought, beyond the summary account of a supposed single mature Platonic view offered here. Long discussions of Plato’s writings on pleasure, in the context of the history of ancient Greek thought on the subject, may be found in Gosling and Taylor 1982 and Wolfsdorf 2013, which latter also seeks to interpret and criticize ancient views by comparison with contemporary philosophical literature, on which his views often differ from those expressed here.

14. For references to Descartes’ sketchy and perhaps only partial functional view of pleasure, on which Spinoza presumably built, see n. 2, ¶2, above (and especially CSM II, p. 57; AT VII, p. 83 from Meditation VI and the Passions passages cited there).

Spinoza: 1677, III, Proposition 11, Scholium; cf. III, Definition II following Proposition 59. (Spinoza’s Latin term is “laetitia”. This is explicitly used inclusively. Two recent translators into English, Parkinson and Shirley, translate by “pleasure”, but Curley by “joy”, following Descartes’ predominant usage of French cognates.)

Kant: 1800, 1974 translation, p. 100; Academy edition, VII, pp. 231–32. For further citations of Kant’s views, see the Kant 1790/2000 entry in the Bibliography.

15. Late antiquity: See Emilsson 1998, van Riel 2000, and Knuuttila 2004.

Recent Philosophy: Ryle, 1949, 1954a, 1954b; his view is that pleasure is not an episode but, at least in the cases of enjoyment he emphasizes, a kind of dispositional interest or attention in one’s activities or experiences. For more, see n. 4 with its corresponding text and the Bibliography notes to his works.

Welfare Economics: Amartya Sen, e.g., 1985, develops a nearly Aristotelian view of human well-being, based in functionings of capacities, mainly for the purpose of discussing distributive justice.

16. Csikszentmihalyi, however, unlike Aristotle, distinguishes enjoyment (his subject, supposedly experienced in ‘flow’) from pleasure, which he regards as a passive state often connected with Platonic restorations (1990, pp. 45–48). Flow experiences are ones in which one loses one’s sense of self, engaged in one’s use of skills that are proportionate to the challenges they meet, which absorb one’s full concentration and reward it with immediate feedback (1996, pp. 111–13, lists nine comditions), Csikszentmihalyi, in his wise books, seems to overplay his hand, by connecting flow to both enjoyment and to the perfecting of skills (e.g., 1990, p. 65), whereas exercising already perfected skills seems often more enjoyable than perfecting them, which may be hard work – and also by suggesting at times that achievement in the presence of concentration is better correlated with positive affect or a species of it (enjoyment of activities) than it is, although he at times acknowledges that quite simple and unskilled activities may give moments of flow, too. In his 1997 he acknowledges that self-ratings of happiness are higher for eating and socializing than for activities he more approves of (USA ed., pp. 36–37 [UK ed., pp. 34–35]; see also pp. 101 [98] and 117–122 [115–119]). Csikszentmihalyi says that the self-report method, on which his research program has been based, is unsatisfactory; but that is the evidence he has, and it seems to indicate that flow correlates with self-reports of concentration best, with those of enjoyment fairly well, but with self-ratings of happiness not that well at all. (However, since the exercise and development of skills he recommends often brings deferred benefits, including ones for affect, his advice may still often be good from a long-term hedonic point of view, even when the required training and practice are not enjoyable at the time.) The distinction between flow and happiness may relate to that between dopaminergic engagement and opioid bliss discussed in §3.3 below.

17. For the criticism of Aristotle: Mill 1872/1979, pp. 430–36 . I have in the text supplied much of the explanation of Aristotle’s views and of the force and historical context of Mill’s criticism, which in the original is directed largely at quotations from his book’s target, William Hamilton, whom Mill took to represent Aristotle’s view of pleasure. (Hamilton’s philosophical reputation did not long survive Mill’s criticisms, with the delayed result that this major philosophical work of Mill’s has followed its target into obscurity.) A very similar counterexample about a smell is given by Anthony Kenny, followed by an Aristotelian response (1963, pp. 146–50).

For similar objections to the effect that excellence of music and of the listener’s auditory and musical capacity are neither necessary nor sufficient for the pleasure of listening to music, see Brentano 1921/1969, 26a, p. 156 and 1929/1981, I,iii,5/p. 14 (not even with attention added) and van Riel 1999 and 2000a. The case of listening to music, while mentioned by Aristotle, seems to be an especially difficult one for his theory and to be well suited to making Mill’s point. Musical and auditory excellence in a listener combined with excellence of work and performance need not yield great pleasure, for all the excellence of the faculties and objects concerned, unless these are defined in terms of affective expressiveness and its successful communication. See Madell 2002 for a different account of pleasure in listening to music and a general account of pleasure discussed critically in §3.1, ¶3, below. To turn to the different case of pleasure in musical performance, orchestra members are often bored during well-practiced and technically near-flawless performances of familiar works. (As van Riel points out in another context, Aristotle’s attempts to address loss of pleasure with repetition and practice [NE X,4:1175a3–10] are unconvincing.) Audiences similarly find such performances less pleasant than those the conductor has managed to vary and thus make new and appealing to the performers. (I draw here on a presentation by Ellen Langer of her empirical research.)

For the normative agreement with Aristotle: Mill 1871, Ch. 2, ¶¶5ff. The evaluative argument aims to prove only the higher ‘quality’ (by which Mill means excellence in rank and choiceworthiness of the ‘higher pleasures’; see the OED, ad loc. quality, 8), rather than, as in Plato and Aristotle, also their greater pleasantness – but on the same ground of the authoritative choice of intellectuals who are supposedly uniquely qualified to judge by virtue of their past acquaintance with experiences of both kinds. Systematic errors in affective memory (Kahneman 1999 and 2000), however, would provide grounds for skepticism about the adequacy of any actual hedonic memory representations relied on in such judging, even if the intellectuals’ impartiality and freedom from self-deception is granted. While Mill also believes pleasure is experientially heterogeneous, he marks that as a separate point. It is, however, likely that both he and Aristotle (whom in these respects Mill seems to follow) believed all pleasure to be nevertheless experientially similar, despite differences both experientially and in value. Neither seems to doubt that there are typically differences in quantity of pleasure that are not just differences in choiceworthiness, despite epistemic dependence on how they strike experiencers (even if for Aristotle these experiential differences in degree of pleasure track with differences in the degree to which something appears good [cf. Moss 2012]). Their positions are thus different from Rawls’ discussed in n. 5.

18. Sidgwick 1907, I, ix, 3, pp. 109–13 and pp. 127–31, on which see Christiano 1992. For more on Sidgwick’s view, see n. 5 above. Broad, 1930, pp. 237–38. Derek Parfit apparently adopts the view that Broad only suggests: pleasure is experience wanted or liked at the time (1984, p. 493). Cf. Edwards 1979, pp. 73–74 and Warner 1987, p. 129. Sidgwick is better read along the lines of Moss’s reading, discussed in n. 7 above, of Aristotle, Sidgwick’s model in writing his Methods (1907, xix–xx). Sidgwick is explicit that this apprehension as desirable is cognitive (1907, 129) and seems to see it as limited to “intelligent beings” as pleasure is not (127). It is therefore highly misleading to characterize Sidgwick as proposing that pleasant experiences are unified only as the objects of an attitude, where this suggests a conatively relational (if not voluntarist) constitution of pleasure as such, where Sidgwick clearly intends, rather, contingent cognitive recognition (or at least judgment, 319) of its goodness to be the concept’s, but not the phenomenon’s, foundation. Pleasure on his view is feeling that does (or would, were there cognitive capacity) present in its moment as good and desirable. In contemporary language, this seems more to fix the term’s referent than to offer a theory of pleasure’s nature. But this is all that, for his purpose of characterizing his hedonistic “methods of ethics”, was required.

19.See, e.g., Emilsson 1998 and Knuuttila 2004, pp. 98–100, on Plotinus, an extreme case of this; on the more moderate and medievally influential Ibn Sina (Avicenna), see Knuuttila 2004, pp. 218–22.

20. The deep background includes the Christian Bible’s “God is love” (agápē, translating Hebrew ahabha; Latin Vulgate caritas), at 1 John 4:16 (cf. John 13:34 and 15:9–12) in its context, 4:7–21, of expansive interpretation of the Hebrew Bible’s commandments of love, Leviticus 19:18 and Deuteronomy 6:5, emphasized at Matthew 22:36–40, Mark 12:28–31 and Luke 10:25–28. Early Christians might thus view their mutual love as participating in God’s. Augustine interpreted the first text as literally identifying love with the Holy Spirit, the third person of the Christian Trinity (De Trinitate, VI, 5). The Augustinian tradition of thinking of pleasure as willing (X, 10 & 11) and of all willing as love lies behind later Christian philosophical accounts of pleasure, such as Ockham’s and Brentano’s, discussed in §2.3.1 below.

William of Ockham 2001 (c. 1317–26), especially pp. 384–86 (420–22) and Question 3, pp. 373–90 (403–28), generally; McGrade 1981, 1987. This last provides a very useful brief account also of some other fourteenth century views, with further references. Those referred to unnamed in the text are, first, Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham, and then Robert Holkot (spelled Holcot occasionally, as in the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy entry), on all of whom I rely wholly on McGrade 1987, especially pp. 77–78. I owe thanks to Professor McGrade also for much generous early help in revising this note and the accompanying text; he is innocent, however, of the final result. Knuuttila observes that Ockham largely follows John Duns Scotus (2004, pp. 268–73; for Scotus’s examples used similarly to distinguish pleasure from the loving on which it depends as a quality, see pp. 270–71). However, for two differences between Scotus and Ockham, see Hirvonen 2004, pp. 127 and 149; Ch. 4, pp. 107–70 is relevant more generally.

The picture of affective states as involving assent of the rational mind to presentation of something as good or bad goes back to the Stoics (see n. 30 for references). Ockham has a more complicated picture. Following Augustine, the will’s acceptance or rejection may go against the evaluative judgment of the intellect. And like Scotus, he makes pleasure a natural but not an exceptionless result of loving acceptance, it seems for a combination of empirical, theological, and Aristotelian reasons. (Pain, or distress, may block pleasure in an act. Appropriating Aristotle, pleasure is not an act but can be blocked by the act on which it depends being impeded, and pain blocks pleasure in this way. And this allows that the devil in his painful damnation gets no pleasure from lovingly accepting any fulfillment of his desire, consistently with the theological tradition.)

Western medieval discussions often take off from passages in Augustine where “fruitio” is defined as clinging to something with love for its own sake (De Doctrina Christiana [On Christian Instruction/Doctrine], I,4) and discussed further as the attitude we should have only toward God, De Trinitate X, 10; cf. Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiæ 1a 2æ 11. Augustine defines pleasure as assent toward what we will when cherishing/enjoying/possessing (“fruendo”) it (City of God XIV, 6). Ockham’s and others’ views seem to have emerged in theological debate centrally concerned with loving acceptance (appropriately, only of God) as the supremely ultimate object of one’s love (“fruitio”, traditionally translated “enjoyment”) and pleasure in this. The view seems to apply also to the relation of pleasure to other acts of will on which it may depend (including Ockham’s ‘middle acts’ that merely take their objects to be noninstrumentally or intrinsically good, without taking them to be, or not to be, most supremely and ultimately good and desirable).

Ockham observes, in passing, that pleasure may be said, strictly speaking, not to have an object (since it is not an act), as the act of loving on which it depends does (2001, p. 401 (445). Kant’s discussion of the relations of aesthetic pleasure and judgment (e.g., Kant 1790/2000, §9) has provoked similar philosophical discussion about its proper interpretation, on whether this involves such pleasure itself having intentionality or else its being distinct from judgments that alone have this. See Ginsborg 2014, §§ 2.31 and 2.33.

21. Mulligan 2004, pp. 83–86 summarizes Brentano’s earlier views as well as the later ones discussed here. Chisholm 1986, 1987 and Katkov 1940, pp. 178–87 provide clear exposition and complementary interpretations (see the Bibliography note on Katkov comparing these; Mulligan 2004 is compatible with Katkov’s reading) of Brentano’s later views, easier to read than Brentano’s late dictated works. Brentano 1929/1981: Part I, iii, 5 and 7, pp. 14 and 16; Part II, 1, 28; p. 59. Brentano 1921/1969, §§25–26a, pp. 154–56, for the treatment of intellectually caused pleasure interpreted in Chisholm 1987, pp. 61–63. The untranslated German of Brentano 1907/1979, n. 39, pp. 35–40, is also important; see the Bibliography note on this.

Brentano presumably draws, however indirectly, on medieval Aristotelian scholastic sources, such as those mentioned in n. 20, just above, for his view of reflexive loving. He had a thorough grounding in scholastic philosophy and aspired to found a modern Christian philosophy on this model. However, he was also strongly influenced by Descartes and by the British empiricists as well.

22. Attribution of propositional attitudes at least sometimes may be only a pragmatic way of speaking innocent of any substantive claims for an ontology of facts or propositions or any attribution of combinatorial representational powers of mind. For an early example of such a perspective, see Churchland 1979, pp. 100–107, for whom abstract objects are used to conveniently index psychological events, as numbers are used in physical science, without any commitment to these abstract objects being involved substantively in either physical or psychological structure.

23. Feldman 1997c/1988, 2002. Cf. Sumner 1996, pp. 88–91, 106–110, who however consistently uses “enjoyment” for the attitude, reserving “pleasure” for ‘sensations’ that are supposed to be among enjoyment’s objects, while Feldman distinguishes between ‘propositional’ or ‘attitudinal pleasure’ (which in his 2002 he identifies with enjoyment) and the ‘sensory pleasures’ that figure among its objects. Recent philosophers’ explicit classification of pleasure as an attitude seems to begin with Nowell-Smith (1954), pp. 111–15, on which see the Bibliography annotation and Perry 1967, pp. 204–14. Nowell-Smith’s ‘pro-attitudes’ lump together conative and affective states that figure in explanations of choice.

24. For reports of experiments showing affect coming loose from what under normal conditions would have been its object, see Berridge and Winkielman 2003, pp. 185–87; Murphy and Zajonc 1993; Murphy, Monahan, and Zajonc, 1995. For a later perspective on the two latter, see Zajonc 2000; for the theoretical view that inspired them, see Zajonc 1980 and 1984. For a warning about the use of “nonconscious” and the like in writings of Zajonc and his collaborators, see the Bibliography annotation to Zajonc 1994. For later perspectives on the interpretation of these experiments, see Clore and Colcombe 2003 or Clore, Gasper, and Garvin 2001.

25. Cf. Plato (more likely, a compilation of his school), Definitions 413b10 (on agápēsis, which bridges the semantic space between loving, wanting, welcoming, affection, enjoying, and contentment with); Augustine, CD XIV, 6, where pleasure is said to be possessing/cherishing/enjoying (fruendo) assent to what we will; Augustine, De Trinitate VIII, 8, love loving others and itself; Sidgwick, 1907, pp. 110–11, 127–31, discussed in n. 5 above; Brentano, §2.3.1, ¶2 and n. 21 above, loving one’s experiencing of something; Bertrand Russell 1930/1980, pp. 155–57/110–111 (end of Ch. X), friendly interest in persons and things; Feldman, 1997b/1988, especially p. 97, welcoming; Frijda, 2001, pp. 76–78, accepting a stimulus.

26. On Nyāya and Vaiśesika criticisms of views defended by Buddhists, see Matilal 1986, ch. 9, “Pleasure and Pain” and Halbfass 1997. A relevant passage from Jayanta Bhaṭṭa’s Nyāyamañjarī is translated in Potter 1977, p. 356, ¶56. (I thank Arindam Chakrabarti for introducing me to this literature.)

Moore 1903, pp. 87–89. While Moore followed Brentano in adopting an intentional (act/object or attitude/content) analysis of conscious states generally, in this case he intends to be directly following Plato. The possibility of such separation of bare affect from cognitive awareness may arise in Plato, who although he at Timaeus 64A–65B seems to take conscious feeling to be required for pleasure, in the passage cited by Moore writes of pleasure as though it is separable from full cognitive awareness – but valueless to the subject then (Philebus 21BC, 60DE). Aristotle seems to take a similar view of pleasure during sleep (Rhetoric I,11:1370a15–16; EE I,5:1216a2–5; Politics, VIII, 4:1339a16–18), although it is unclear whether or how this can be accommodated to his views of pleasure discussed in §2.2.2. But Locke seems to deny the very possibility of pleasure during sleep (Essay II,i,11). The sometimes peaceful appearance of sleepers, that sleep is often desired and the process of falling asleep welcomed, and that sleep typically leaves one refreshed, as pleasure typically does, pull toward allowing that sleep is pleasant. Perhaps the difficulty of thinking of sleep experiences as owned by subjects, when they neither are cognitively aware of them at the time nor remember them later, counts decisively for Locke against such pleasure in sleep being anyone’s pleasure and therefore against its being pleasure at all. However, perhaps taking place in an organism is ownership enough. And on a neoBuddhist or neoHumean view that requires no subject beyond particular experiences, even an isolated experience of the right kind might unproblematically be pleasure on its own, however unowned by any continuant subject of experience.

27. Berridge and Winkielman 2003. That affective processes underlying pleasure may proceed without awareness is widely allowed in recent scientific literature; e.g., LeDoux 1996; Berridge 1996; pp. 19–21; Berridge 1999; pp. 525–37; Winkielman and Berridge 2003; Berridge 2004; Winkielman, Berridge and Wilbarger 2005; Damasio 1999; Shizgal 1999; Frijda 2001, pp. 75–78; Davidson 2003. However, usually no distinction such as Block’s is intended, but only that neural, cognitive or behavioral components of emotional response, without any consciousness of any kind, may thus occur. (Lane 2000 is an exception; he seems to be working with a distinction and vocabulary similar to, although not drawn from, Block’s.) Contrast Locke, for whom such “[t]hings in their present enjoyment are what they seem; the apparent and real good are, in this case, always the same. For the Pain or Pleasure being just so great, and no greater, than it is felt, the present Good or Evil is really so much as it appears” (Essay, II, xxi, 58). “Therefore, as to present Pleasure and Pain the Mind, as has been said, never mistakes that which is really good and evil; that which is the greater Pleasure, or the lesser Pain, is really as it appears” (II, xxi, 63). Cf. the similar Epicurean view as reported in Cicero, de finibus I, 33 and 55. But cognitive processing is a matter of degree and there may be room for pleasure or pain to be felt and matter to our well- or ill-being without any cognitively sophisticated appearing or seeming. There seem to be distinct verbal, psychological, and practical questions at issue here: whether the word “pleasure” is to be tied to full cognitive awareness, whether immediate feeling of some kind may be present unnoticed in various ways, and, if so, what rational or moral claims our own (or is it unowned?) unnoticed pleasure and pain, and similarly unnoticed fetal or animal pleasure and pain, have on our prudence, conscience, compassion, and care. See Ekman and Davidson, 1994, Question 8: “Can Emotions Be Nonconscious”, pp. 283–318, for discussion of that issue and also the Bibliography note to Zajonc 1994, which appears in that section. Gerald Clore’s contribution there takes the view that emotion is (as a conceptual matter) conscious; “feeling” is used with a similar implication by Damasio (1999, 2003) Craig (2002, 2009, 2015) and now by Berridge and his collaborators. But scientists generally agree that conscious affects include or involve component processes that may exist in the absence of consciousness or at least of full awareness; the view that pleasure’s nature is exhausted by its being perceived as such seems unrepresented, at least among scientists, nowadays. But again, the difference with Locke may be in large part verbal; emotion and pleasure, for the scientists, include totally nonconscious processes.

28. Sidgwick, 1907, pp. 125–27. Sidgwick’s quotations are, respectively, from Herbert Spencer and Alexander Bain. Daniel Kahneman’s (1999, p. 4) definition, in terms of strength of a disposition to continue, faces similar problems – as also do Richard Brandt’s (1979, pp. 40–41) and Derek Parfit’s (1984, p. 493). Excitement certainly seems not reducible to pleasure; someone excited can be either happy or having a panic attack. Alternative accounts of activation or arousal exist. One is that this is a single psychologically basic dimension independent of pleasure (J.A. Russell; e.g., in his 1991 and in Russell and Barrett 1999). On another, its magnitude derives from those of positive affect and negative affect summed together (David Watson; e.g., in his 2000). But there may well be multiple ‘arousal’ or ‘activation’ systems in the brain, some often closely connected with affect or motivation but others not. For further references and discussion, see n. 29 below and the accompanying text in §3.3.

Vasubandhu, the Kashmiri-educated Buddhist from Peshawar (c. 400 C.E.), whose Abhidharmakośa (1923–31) is a foundational psychological text for Northern Buddhists, avoided defining pleasure (sukha) in terms of current desire by defining it instead through desire for it arising after it has stopped (1984, p. 66). This allows calm, desireless pleasure, but remains relational and seems silent about states that are unending or otherwise not followed by others. And it seems to be falsified by Plato’s example of a fragrance that we enjoy but do not miss once it is gone. (But perhaps there is a very short-term desire in such cases that goes unnoticed especially when we have other things to experience or do. And if only a typical functional connection or causal tendency were intended, the earlier counterexamples might be handled as well. However, such a relational characterization would not provide a real definition of an intrinsically constituted state, such as pleasure would be on the simple picture and, it seems, on some Buddhist views as well.)

Bertrand Russell, in his behaviorist-influenced 1921, also accomodates inactive pleasure by analyzing pleasure relationally and negatively, as the property of mental occurrences consisting in their stimulating no reflex or voluntary movements that do not tend to prolong the stimulating occurrences themselves (1921, pp. 71–72). This seems too broad, if it includes states of freezing in fright and of motionless depression. It seems also too narrow, if it excludes anything that causes a consummatory act that ends the appetitive motivation that formerly sustained it, as eating, drinking, and male sexual activity typically do. Swallowing may be caused by tasting, but that does not show that the taste was not pleasant, although more prolonged savoring may show that someone enjoys something more – and similarly for the other cases. (Since events in a complex system typically have many effects, and these effects will as well, doubly negative analyses such as Russell’s seem especially unpromising.) Purely behavioral or motivational analyses, it seems, will not do. To the extent that ones in terms of accepting or attending to a stimulus come closer to the mark (Frijda 2001, pp. 76–78), this may be because they build pleasure into the account rather than analyzing it in other terms. Russell came close to this in his 1930/1968, pp. 155–57/110–111, as detailed in n. 25 alongside similar views. The accompanying text at the end of §2.3 is also relevant.

29. Similarly in 1896 Wilhelm Wundt, the founder of German experimental psychology, proposed a three-dimensional theory of affect, with excitement/depression and tension (or action-tendency)/relaxation, figuring alongside pleasure/pain. This last Gefühlston dimension became hedonic tone in English translation and under that name and later as valence became standard in psychological literature. (Appeal to this as an uncontroversial feature of affective experience in Katz 1986, p. 47, without citation, was misunderstood in Kagan 1992, 172–3, as original, with the result that one or both of these are credited for the idea in recent philosophical literature.) For discussion and interpretation of changes in Wundt’s views before and after this first edition, see Titchener 1908, Ch. IV. For similar neurologically-supported more recent views, see Heilman 2000 and Heller, Koven, and Miller 2003, which also raises doubts about the adequacy of dimensional approaches to affect. Controversies over the number of dimensions, which axes to privilege, and whether pleasure and pain are opposites (or instead, perhaps, to be identified, respectively, with Wundt’s action-tendency and depression, which would approximate to David Watson’s view) have continued to the present day. For literature of the debate on the dimensional structure of emotion space, see the special section of the Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 76:803–64 for May, 1999 (Diener 1999) and, for an application with bearing on our topic, Depue and Collins, 1999. James Russell is a leading exponent of positive and negative affect (pleasure and pain) as polar opposites; John Cacioppo (see his 1999 and Ito and Cacioppo 1999 and 2001) among the opponents (while acknowledging that the two tend to exclude each other at high intensities) as are David Watson and Robert Thayer, discussed in n. 1, ¶¶4 and 5 above. This controversy may be settled at some levels by the advance of neuroscience, but cultural and individual differences, which interact with sex and gender, may defeat any single overall answer – at least at the level of self-report. (For example, it is sometimes said that traditionally Chinese women have been socialized to be indifferent to, or even to feel bad about, their own feeling good.)

30. Epicurus’ precise interpretation is sometimes difficult and controversial due to loss of most of Epicurus’ own writings. For the mainly fragmentary surviving writings see 1994 and Long and Sedley 1987. For further discussion supporting varying interpretations, beyond that cited in §2.23 above, see Merlan 1960; Gosling and Taylor 1982, Ch. 19, pp. 365–96; Mitsis 1987; Striker 1993; Preuss 1994, Ch. Six (which discusses earlier interpretations at length before giving his own). On the Stoics, see Long and Sedley (texts in §§57 and 65, in both volumes), Seneca 1917–25, Sorabji 2000, Nussbaum 1994 and 2001.

31. Aristotle (NE I,viii:1099a24–31 and EE I,i:1214a1–6) criticizes a poem (sometimes credited to Theognis of Megara) for stating that the most pleasant thing is to attain what one desires. Modern Western society and philosophers (e.g., Hobbes, De Homine, 11, ¶15; 1658/1991, p. 54), in contrast, have often privileged desire in their views of human nature and value. The modern disparagement of calm and contentment as complacency and the talk of ‘change’ as if all change were good reverse the predominant bias in favor of stability and calm in many traditional societies and past civilizations, expressed, for example, in Plato’s and Aristotle’s view of the best life and society. For recent social criticism advocating increasing appetites to achieve ‘pleasure’ (rather than habituating ‘comfort’), see the economist Tibor Scitovsky’s The Joyless Society (1992/1976), Ch. Four, “Pleasure Versus Comfort”. The science used there is rather old; Kahneman 1999, pp. 13ff., provides some critical discussion and references toward what would be needed for an updated appraisal. Scitovsky seems to suppose that pleasure derives from a single underlying arousal dimension; pleasure is return toward an optimal level of this (much as it is return to something like homeostatic equilibrium for Plato, §2.2.1 above).

32. Buddhist Canon, 1995 trans., Majjhima Nikāya, 39:¶¶16–18 (pp. 368–69), 111: ¶¶5–10 (pp. 899–900); 119:¶¶19–21 (pp. 953–54). Buddhist Canon, 1974/1900 trans: Dhammasaṅgaṇi, ¶¶9–10 (pp. 9–11). Buddhaghosa (using lost ancient commentaries) 1979, Ch. iv, pp. 90–197, especially pp. 148–75 and most particularly ¶¶94, 100, 139, 154, 182–83. The desert traveler example useful for understanding the distinction between pīti (joyful interest, rapture, zest, happiness – derived from prī-, the Indo-European origin of many words thematizing pleasure and love [see Watkins 2000, Monier-Williams 1899, Rhys Davids 1922–25] including the modern German Freude [joy], Freund [friend], and Frau [wife]) and sukha (used here in a narrow and contrastive sense: pleasure, bliss, or happiness) may be found in ¶100, and in the longer form I have mainly followed, in Buddhaghosa’s less widely available 1920–21, iv, 1 (vol. 1, pp. 154–56). Cf. the corresponding account from the northern Buddhist tradition, which likewise has sukha sometimes without joyful interest but not joyful interest without sukha, Vasubandhu, 1923–31, Ch. II, 8a (French trans.: “plaisir” without “joie”, vol. 1, pp. 114–15; Pruden English trans., vol. 1, p. 161).

33. These lines from Voznesensky’s “Oza”, quoted here in my own translation, may be conveniently found, in their Russian original with an English translation, in Antiworlds and the Fifth Ace: Poetry by Andrei Voznesensky: A Bilingual Edition, Patricia Blake and Max Hayward (eds.), New York: Basic Books, 1967, pp. 238–39.

Copyright © 2016 by
Leonard D. Katz <>

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