Notes to Plural Quantification

1. Second-order logic has quantifiers that bind variables taking predicate position. These quantifiers are typically understood as ranging over concepts and relations. Monadic second-order logic is the subsystem of second-order logic which admits only quantification over concepts, not over (polyadic) relations.

2. See Boolos 1984: 432–3 [1998a: 57] for an ingenious proof, which he attributes to David Kaplan. The basic idea is as follows. Assume for simplicity that the domain consists only of critics. Then the sentence can be formalized as

\[\Exists{xx} \Forall{u}\Forall{v}(u\prec xx \amp \textit{Auv} \rightarrow v\prec xx \amp u\ne v).\]

Now reinterpret the predicate Auv as the arithmetical predicate \(“u = 0 \vee u = v + 1”.\) The resulting sentence

\[ \Exists{xx} \Forall{u}\Forall{v}(u\prec xx \amp(u = 0 \vee u = v + 1) \rightarrow v\prec xx \amp u\ne v) \]

can be seen to be true in all and only non-standard models of arithmetic, by letting \(xx\) be all and only the non-standard elements of the model. But it follows from the compactness theorem for first-order logic that any consistent first-order theory of arithmetic has both standard and non-standard models. Hence the original sentence cannot be formalized in a first-order language.

3. For further discussion of this and other attempts to analyze plural locutions in non-plural terms, see, e.g., Oliver and Smiley 2001 and Yi 2005.

4. Although most contemporary work on plural quantification appears to have been inspired, directly or indirectly, by the work of George Boolos, there is also a substantial pre-Boolosian literature on the topic. Pluralities are closely related to what the early Bertrand Russell called “classes as many,” as opposed to “classes as one”; see Russell 1903, esp. Sections 70, 74, and 104, as well as Klement 2014 for discussion. Simons 1997 argues that Stanislaw Leśniewski in the early twentieth century anticipated many of the ideas later defended by Boolos. More recent pre-Boolosian writings on plurals include Black 1971; Stenius 1974; Morton 1975; Armstrong 1978: 32–34; and Simons 1982. For more references and historical information, see Lewis 1991: 63 and Hazen 1993: 133–34.

5. It does not suffice for the predicate \(P\) to be distributive that this biconditional is true or even necessarily true. For instance, let \(P\) be “has/have a mereological sum”. Then a believer in arbitrary mereological sums takes the relevant biconditional to the true, perhaps even necessarily so, although the predicate \(P\) is not distributive. (I owe this example to Gabriel Uzquiano.)

6. The phenomenon of non-distributive predication was noted already by Frege, who pondered the sentence “Siemens and Halske have built the first major telegraph network” and suggested that in it,

“Siemens and Halske” designates a compound object about which a statement is being made, and the word “and” is used to help form the sign for this object. (Frege 1914: 227–8)

7. Even this extended language will only capture the core features of the plural locutions of English and other natural languages. No systematic analysis of the syntax or semantics of plural locutions in natural language will be attempted here. For more on the complexities of plural locutions in natural languages, the reader is referred to Landman 2000, Link 1998, Lønning 1997, McKay 2006, and Schein 1993 and 2006.

8. See Rayo 2002 and McKay 2006 for plural logics that eliminate singular variables in favor of plural ones.

9. Although Boolos never formalized the theory PFO, he was clearly aware of this interpretation. See his 1984 and 1985a.

10. See Williamson 2003: 456–457, 2010: 699–700, 2013: 245–251, and 2016; Rumfitt 2005: sect. VII; Uzquiano 2011; and Linnebo 2016; see Hewitt 2012a for criticism. See Florio and Linnebo 2021, ch. 10 for a development and formal proofs of relevant arguments involving plurals and modals, and Roberts forthcoming for a defense of a definitive modal logic of plurals involving, but going beyond, the principles (10) and (11). These two principles are assumed and put to philosophical use in Bricker 1989: 386–390 and Forbes 1989: 93–102.

11. I will, for related reasons, not discuss a proposal due to Taylor and Hazen 1992, according to which English contains ordered lists of referring expressions, as in “London, Paris, and Berlin are the capitals of England, France, and Germany” and associated quantifiers. See Hewitt 2012b for a related proposal.

12. For one useful discussion of the question of logicality, see Rayo 2007.

13. However, the “non-trivial mathematical truths” alluded to above will then have to be expressed by meta-language quantification over dyadic predicates rather than by object language quantification over dyadic relations. Besides, since (as A.P. Hazen pointed out to me) the monadic second-order theory of the successor operation is decidable, the amount of mathematics that can be obtained in this way is very limited. See Büchi 1962.

14. A further problem is that the neo-logicist construction of the natural numbers makes essential use of empty concepts. But it is doubtful that it makes sense to talk about empty pluralities.

15. Some philosophers fail to take this tradition into account or find it unnecessary to do so. They thus move directly from the claim that certain locutions incur no controversial ontological commitments of the kind incurred by singular first-order quantifiers to the claim that these locutions incur no controversial ontological commitment whatsoever. For some examples, see Boolos 1984 and 1985a, and Rayo and Yablo 2001.

Copyright © 2022 by
Øystein Linnebo <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free