Process theism typically refers to a family of theological ideas originating in, inspired by, or in agreement with the metaphysical orientation of the English philosopher-mathematician Alfred North Whitehead (1861–1947) and the American philosopher-ornithologist Charles Hartshorne (1897–2000). For both Whitehead and Hartshorne, it is an essential attribute of God to be fully involved in and affected by temporal processes. This idea contrasts neatly with traditional forms of theism that hold God to be or at least conceived as being, in all respects non-temporal (eternal), unchanging (immutable,) and unaffected by the world (impassible). Process theism does not deny that God is in some respects eternal, immutable, and impassible, but it contradicts the classical view by insisting that God is in some respects temporal, mutable, and passible. The views of Whitehead and Hartshorne should also be distinguished from those that affirm that the divine being, by an act of self-limitation, opens itself to influence from the world. Some neo-Thomists hold this view and a group of Evangelical Christian philosophers, calling themselves “open theists,” promote similar ideas. These forms of theism were influenced by process theism, but they deny its claim that God is essentially in a give-and-take relationship with the world. Moreover, process theism is a genuinely philosophical theology in the sense that it is not grounded in claims of special insight or revealed truth but in philosophical reflection. Specifically, process theism is a product of theorizing that takes the categories of becoming, change, and time as foundational for metaphysics. The metaphysical underpinning of process theism is often called process philosophy, a label suggested by the title of Whitehead’s magnum opus, Process and Reality. In order to bring out this philosophy’s emphasis on relatedness, many scholars follow Bernard Loomer in calling it process-relational philosophy. Whitehead’s preferred expression for his metaphysical viewpoint is “the philosophy of organism.” This article concerns primarily the concept of God in process theism, although we shall conclude with a brief discussion of arguments for the existence of God in process thought.
- 1. Historical Notes on Process Theism
- 2. God and Creativity
- 3. Real Relations in God
- 4. Dual Transcendence in Whitehead and Hartshorne
- 5. Panentheism
- 6. Divine Power and the Problem of Evil
- 7. Divine Knowledge and the Problem of Future Contingents
- 8. Transforming Traditional Theism and Process Theism
- 9. Arguments for the Existence of God in Process Theism
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1. Historical Notes on Process Theism
Although Whitehead was Hartshorne’s senior by thirty-six years, the two men began seriously to develop their ideas about God in written form at roughly the same time. In his Harvard doctoral dissertation (1923), Hartshorne argues for the existence of a God that is the eminent exemplification of relational and social values. Whitehead’s writings on the concept of God appear only after 1924, when he moved to America. Between the publication of Science and the Modern World (1925) and Process and Reality (1929)—a time of intense creativity for Whitehead—he articulated his metaphysical system, including the concept of God. During Whitehead’s first year at Harvard, Hartshorne was in Europe for his second year as a Sheldon Traveling Fellow. When he returned to Harvard in 1925 he was given the dual assignment of editing the papers of Charles Sanders Peirce and of serving as Whitehead’s assistant. After 1940 Hartshorne became the primary conduit for Whitehead’s theistic ideas. Indeed, the elaboration and defense of process theism fell largely to Hartshorne and his students at the University of Chicago (1928–1955), Emory University (1955–1962), and the University of Texas at Austin (1962–2000). So great was Hartshorne’s influence that some scholars try to rescue Whitehead from a too Hartshornean interpretation. This fact should serve as a warning that Hartshorne’s version of process theism is not the same as Whitehead’s. We shall see that Hartshorne’s treatment of theism owes much to Whitehead’s metaphysics while departing from it in ways that the Englishman would not accept.
Hartshorne accepted the task of chronicling process theism’s history and showing its importance as a significant alternative to classical theism, pantheism, atheism, and other lesser known options in philosophical theology. His 1953 anthology (republished in 2000), Philosophers Speak of God, edited with the help of his student William L. Reese, is a massive critical study of the varieties of concepts of God as they relate to process theism. The book includes selections from and commentaries on a wide range of thinkers from Western and Eastern traditions, both well-known and obscure. It is safe to say that Hartshorne’s vigorous efforts on behalf of process theism are the single most important factor in eroding the consensus among philosophers that an eternal, immutable, and impassible deity should be considered normative for philosophical theology. More recently, Daniel Dombrowski has examined the history of the concept of God through the lens of process philosophy (Dombrowski 2016).
Philosophers Speak of God demonstrates that Whitehead and Hartshorne are not the sole representatives of process theism, although they are its chief exponents. Buddhism, with its twin emphases on impermanence and dependent origination, is arguably the most sophisticated ancient form of process philosophy. Buddhist philosophers criticized the notion of a timeless absolute without, however, developing a form of process theism (e.g. Arnold 1998). Whitehead remarks that his concept of God has more richness than the Buddhist concept of nirvana and that his philosophy of religion could be viewed as an effort to “true up” the Buddhist idea (Johnson 1983, 8). Hartshorne maintains that aspects of process theism are in Plato’s later writings—specifically, the Sophist, the Timaeus, and the Laws—but they are never brought together into a coherent theory. Hartshorne sees process theism as providing the needed coherence (Dombrowski 2005 and Viney 2007).
In the generation immediately preceding Whitehead, C. S. Peirce (1839–1914) and William James (1842–1910) closely anticipated process theism and served as important influences on its development. There was also a cross fertilization of ideas from some of Whitehead’s contemporaries: Henri Bergson (1859–1941), Samuel Alexander (1859–1938), and William Ernest Hocking (1873–1966)—Hocking was one of Hartshorne’s teachers at Harvard. Philosophers and religious thinkers who independently formulated aspects of process theism in the twentieth century include: Bernardino Varisco (1850–1933), Nicholas Berdyaev (1874–1948), Mohammad Iqbal (1877–1938), Martin Buber (1878–1965), Pierre Teilhard de Chardin (1881–1955), Edgar Sheffield Brightman (1884–1953), Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888–1975), Sri Aurobindo (1892–1950), Hans Jonas (1903–1993), and Abraham Joshua Heschel (1907–1972).
Because process theists reject the idea of a deity whose moral character is ever questionable, John Stuart Mill’s essay, “Theism,” is not an anticipation of process theism. By parity of reasoning, Peter Forrest’s proposal of a God that grows from pure power to pure love is not a version of theism that process theists would find appealing (Forrest 2007). Some of the central themes and arguments of process theism, however, are evident in less well-known thinkers scattered throughout history. One can mention the names of Levi ben Gerson (1288–1340), Fausto Socinus (1539–1604), Friedrich Wilhelm Schelling (1775–1854), Gustav Theodor Fechner (1801–1887), Rowland Gibson Hazard (1801–1888), Jules Lequyer [or Lequier] (1814–1862), Lorenzo D. McCabe (1817–1897), and Otto Pfleiderer (1839–1908). Some might count G. W. F. Hegel (1770–1831) as a forerunner of process theism, but his case is not clear. The idea of development is central to Hegel’s thinking about the Absolute Spirit. On the other hand, his philosophy was more influential in ushering in what he himself called “the death of God” than in providing a clearly articulated theistic alternative to classical theism (cf. Küng 1980, 138–42). It is also ironic that it was much less in the positive influence of Hegelian idealism than in the negative reactions to it that process philosophy, and by implication process theism, matured in the twentieth century.
Philosophers and theologians who have published a monograph defending some variety of process theism informed by Whitehead or Hartshorne include: Henry Nelson Wieman (1884–1975), Bernard Meland (1899–1993), Paul Weiss (1901–2002), Norman Pittenger (1905–1997), Daniel Day Williams (1910–1973), John Moskop, William L. Reese, John B. Cobb, Jr., Schubert Ogden (1928-2019), Edgar A. Towne (1928-2018), Eugene H. Peters (1929–1983), Bowman Clarke (1927–1996), Joseph Bracken, Burton Z. Cooper, Marjorie Hewitt Suchocki, Gene A. Reeves, Lewis S. Ford (1933-2018), André Gounelle, Rem B. Edwards, Delwin Brown (1935–2009), David A. Pailin, Franklin I. Gamwell, Forrest Wood, David Ray Griffin, James A. Keller, Jorge Luis Nobo (1940-2019), Tyron Inbody, Carol P. Christ, George L. Goodwin, Barry Whitney, Santiago Sia, Jay McDaniel, George W. Shields (1951-2020), Donald Viney, Catherine Keller, Daniel A. Dombrowski, Anna Case-Winters, Kurian Kachappilly, Gregory A. Boyd, Roland Faber, Thomas Jay Oord, Donna Bowman, Derek Malone-France, Monica A. Coleman, and Julia Enxing; Williams, Reese, Cobb, Ogden, and Peters were Hartshorne’s students at Chicago; Clarke and Edwards studied with him at Emory; Nobo was Hartshorne’s student at Texas.
2. God and Creativity
The question of the metaphysical relation of God and creativity is a watershed between process theism and more traditional forms of theism. Process philosophy, modifying a statement from Plato’s Sophist (247e), affirms that the most concrete real beings—in Whitehead’s language, actual entities—are characterized by the power to act and to be acted upon (Plato says real beings act or are acted upon). In process metaphysics no actual entity is wholly determined by the activity of another; or phrased positively, every actual entity retains some power of self-determination, however minimal or slight it may be. According to this view, to have power in relation to others is to have power in relation to other entities with some degree of power. This is process philosophy’s doctrine of universal creativity. Hartshorne says, “To be is to create” (Hartshorne 1970, 1, 272). The logic of the matter does not change if God is included in the metaphysical scheme. For process theism, God is the supreme or eminent creative power, but not the only creative power. Thus, process theists speak of God and the creatures as co-creators (Hartshorne and Reese 1953 [2000, 140]; Hartshorne 1967a, 113).
Process theism’s doctrine of creativity differs from that of classical theism according to which God alone is genuinely creative. Thomas Aquinas says that in the proper sense of the word, only God creates (Summa Theologica I, Q 45, a. 5). Aquinas explains that to create is to bring something from nothing, and this is possible only for deity. This is the famous doctrine of creatio ex nihilo, or creation from no pre-existing material. This ex nihilo creation is logically distinct from the claim that the universe is temporally finite. Aquinas, for example, treats the questions whether God is the creator and whether the universe had a beginning under separate headings. Aquinas is clear that he accepts the temporal finitude of the universe as a matter of faith, from revelation, and not because of rational argument. On the other hand, like other traditional theists (Gottfried Leibniz for example), Aquinas holds that God could have created a temporally infinite universe, but it too would have been created ex nihilo.
Process theists generally, though not unanimously, deny that the universe had a first temporal moment. Those wishing to demonstrate the compatibility between process theism and Jewish and Christian Scripture commonly follow David Griffin’s arguments that the Bible neither requires nor implies an absolute beginning of the universe (Griffin 2001b, 109–114). There is still the objection, however, that by conceiving both God and the creatures as creative, process theists seem to destroy one of the most meaningful contrasts between God and the world: God as creator and the world as created. Indeed, Whitehead says, “It is as true to say that God creates the World, as that the World creates God” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 348]). One must, however, separate Whitehead’s poetic expression from his philosophical meaning. In process theism, as in traditional theism, the existence of God is in no way precarious, in no way dependent upon the activity of other entities; likewise, process theism and traditional theism are in agreement that non-divine individuals are contingent (they can fail to exist)—in the case of non-angelic beings, they are born and they die. In Whitehead’s and Hartshorne’s form of theism, God’s existence is everlasting, but the existence of any particular creature is not. Nevertheless, the creatures, being lesser creators, create something in God, if only the knowledge of their own activity. For process theism, the activity of the creatures makes no difference to God’s existence, only to God’s experience of them.
Implicit in traditional theism’s doctrine of creation are the ideas that God’s creative act and God’s knowledge of the world are non-temporal. Augustine, for example, in the Confessions (book XI, chapters 13 and 14), considers it nonsensical to ask what God was doing before the creation of the world; God, in creating the universe, brings time—and with it, relations of before and after—into existence; thus, it is no more meaningful to ask what came before the first moment of time than it is to ask on a spinning sphere what is north of the north pole. In traditional theism, the temporal world is spread out before God who can see it in its entirety from an eternal vantage point. As Boethius says in The Consolation of Philosophy (book 5, prose 6), eternity is the complete, simultaneous and perfect possession of everlasting life. Process theism takes a contrary view that time is the process of creation. In other words, the order of beings in time is the process whereby beings are created. For process metaphysics, there is no eternal act of divine creation that fixes the world in existence and there is no eternal perspective from which the universe can be considered a finished product. Furthermore, the “creative advance,” as Whitehead calls the universe, is inherently open-ended and growing, like a line to which tiny segments are continually being added. Where Aquinas could liken God’s prescience to a man viewing a caravan of travelers from a high tower, Hartshorne says, “There is not (either now or eternally) a fixed totality of travelers for God to survey, but a new totality each moment” (Hartshorne 1970, 135).
Whitehead remarks that, “In all philosophic theory there is an ultimate which is actual in virtue of its accidents” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 7]). In process thought, this ultimate is creativity. It would be misleading, however, to speak as though creativity were “the ultimate reality” according to process theism (Hick 1990, 49). Creativity is not a metaphysical agency that produces anything; rather, it is the character of every concrete fact, from the humblest flicker of existence in non-divine actual entities to God. Whitehead’s pithy summary of process philosophy is, “The many become one, and are increased by one” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 21]). Creativity, then, is the ultimate metaphysical principle. A principle, however, is not a real being. Whitehead explained to his student A. H. Johnson that God is not a principle but an actuality (Johnson 1983, 5). That which is best described, in process theism, as the ultimate reality, is God. For Whitehead and Hartshorne, God should not be treated as the exception to metaphysical principles; otherwise, apart from an appeal to putative revelations from God, there could be no reasoned discourse about the divine. Whitehead and Hartshorne strive to conceive God as the chief exemplification of metaphysical principles. In process theism, the divine or eminent form of creativity provides the basis for cosmic order and achieved value. In Whitehead’s words, God is “the poet of the world,” leading it with tender patience by the divine vision of truth, beauty, and goodness (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 346]).
Process theism is critical of the traditional metaphysical question, “Why is there something rather than nothing?” In process thought, the proposition, “Something exists,” is a necessary truth (Hartshorne 1971). Insofar as traditional theism maintains the doctrine of the necessary existence of God, it too accepts the necessity of something existing. Therefore, the difference between process theism and traditional theism is not in whether something necessarily exists, but in the nature of the necessarily existent. According to traditional theism, the totality of non-divine entities is a multiplicity in need of grounding in a primordial unifying activity—the “pure act” (actus purus) of existing that is God. Process theism refuses to give a privileged metaphysical status to the one over the many. In Whitehead’s words, “The term ‘many’ presupposes the term ‘one,’ and the term ‘one’ presupposes the term ‘many’” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 21]). Taking creativity as the category of the ultimate is an attempt to keep the one and the many on equal metaphysical footing by taking reality itself as necessarily social. God, considered as the ultimate reality in any version of process metaphysics, necessarily exists as a social being in dynamic interaction with all non-divine entities.
Clearly, treating creativity as the ultimate metaphysical principle has far-reaching consequences for the concept of God and of God’s relations to others. It is not possible, in process metaphysics, to conceive divine activity as a “supernatural” intervention into the “natural” order of events. Process theists usually regard the distinction between the supernatural and the natural as a by-product of the doctrine of creation ex nihilo. In process thought, there is no such thing as a realm of the natural in contrast to that which is supernatural. On the other hand, if “the natural” is defined more neutrally as “what is in the nature of things,” then process metaphysics characterizes the natural as the creative activity of actual entities. In Whitehead’s words, “It lies in the nature of things that the many enter into complex unity” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 21]). It is tempting to emphasize process theism’s denial of the supernatural and thereby highlight what the process God cannot do in comparison to what the traditional God can do (that is, to bring something from nothing). In fairness, however, equal stress should be placed on process theism’s denial of the natural (as traditionally conceived) so that one may highlight what the creatures cannot do, in traditional theism, in comparison to what they can do in process metaphysics (that is, to be part creators of the world with God).
3. Real Relations in God
Process theists generally regard the notion of creation ex nihilo, as explained above, as going hand-in-hand with the idea that the relations between God and the world are one-way relations. God creates, but the creatures lack all creative power, the one wholly uncreated, the other wholly uncreative (Hartshorne 1970, 9). It is not within the ability of any creature, according to this view, to make a difference to God. Aquinas’s way of expressing this asymmetry is to say that the relation from God to the creatures is real (for it makes a difference, all the difference, to them) whereas the relation from the creatures to God is rational, or in the mind only (for the existence of the creatures makes no difference to the being of God) (Summa Theologica I, Q 13, a. 7). Aquinas borrows, and places in a Christian context, Aristotle’s terms of “pure act” and “unmoved mover” to apply to God. To say that God is pure act is to say that anything God could be, God already is—there is no potentiality in God for any type of change. To say that God is the unmoved mover is to say that the divine moves others but is unmoved by another—this includes the idea that God is impassible, literally, without feeling or emotion.
In the view of process theism, the denial of real relations in God renders classical theism paradoxical to the point of incoherence. According to classical theism, God has perfect knowledge of a contingent and changing world, yet nothing in God could be other than it is. The one condition, however, contradicts the other (cf. Hartshorne 1948, 13–14; Viney and Shields 2020, 147-150). If any event is contingent then it could be otherwise—for example, this bird at this place and time is singing rather than sleeping; but if the event could be otherwise, then God’s knowledge of the event could be otherwise—knowing this bird at this place and time as singing rather than as sleeping. The contingency implied for God’s knowing is not that God might have been ignorant of something but that the thing that God knows might have been different. An infallible knower necessarily knows whatever exists; it does not follow, however, that what exists is necessary unless one adds the premise, taken from classical theism, that nothing in God could be other than it is. Process theism jettisons the premise that there is nothing contingent in God. The only other non-atheistic alternatives, say process theists, are to follow Aristotle and deny that God knows the world or to follow Spinoza and deny that nothing in God or in the world could be other than it is (Hartshorne 1976, 12). What is impossible is a God with no contingent aspects knowing a contingent world.
The denial of real relations in God also has paradoxical consequences for the concept of divine goodness. If God is unaffected by the creatures, then God is impassible, not moved by their suffering. Anselm, in Proslogion chapter VIII, asks how God can be compassionate towards the creatures without feeling sympathy for them. His answer—in effect a kind of theological behaviorism (Dombrowski 2006, 140)—is that the creatures feel the effects of divine compassion but that God feels nothing. This leaves unanswered how non-sympathetic compassion is possible. Aquinas provides a less obviously question begging reply. He says that to love another is to will the good of the other; God necessarily wills the good of the other, so God is love (Summa Theologica I, Q 20, a. 2). Process theists do not deny that love requires willing the good of the other, but they maintain that it requires something more, or at very least that there are greater forms of love of which willing the good of the other is a necessary aspect. Divine love is more than beneficence; it includes sensitivity to the joys and sorrows of the beloved. This idea is expressed in Whitehead’s depiction of God as “the great companion—the fellow-sufferer who understands” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 351]). Hartshorne points out that Anselm’s God can give us “everything except the right to believe that there is one who, with infinitely subtle and appropriate sensitivity, rejoices in all our joys and sorrows in all our sorrows” (Hartshorne 1948, 54).
Closely related to the problem of passionless love, for classical theism, is the question of the world’s value. The denial of real relations in God, coupled with the concept that the world and its creatures have no value except as it is borrowed from God, implies that that total reality described by God-and-the-world contains no more value than that described by God-without-the-world. This view has two unhappy consequences. First, it implies that there is no value in God’s creating the world—nothing is gained, or lost, in God’s decision to create. Second, it implies that there is no value in God’s interaction with the creatures. Process theists point out that these ideas do not square with analogies drawn from human experience. There is value in giving one’s love to another, as for instance, bringing children into the world and loving them; there is also value in one’s love being received and returned, as when the children mature and cherish relations with their parents. Yet, one cannot love another unless the other exists, or once existed. Thus, if there is a value in love, it requires the existence of the other, not merely the idea of the existence of the other. Process theism rejects the counter-intuitive claim that the world as actually existing has no more value than the world as possibly existing. By parity of reasoning, process theism rejects the view that it is no better for God to create the world than to contemplate the possibility of creating it.
Perhaps the most disastrous consequences of the denial of real relations in God, as far as process theists are concerned, are the problems that it poses for free will and creaturely suffering. For classical theism, the creative or causal relation flows one way only, from God to the world. The world and its creatures are products of a unilateral divine decision that things should be one way rather than another. Hartshorne poses a dilemma for this view. Either biological parents are part creators of their children or they are not. If they are then God alone is not the creator. On the other hand, if parents are not genuine creators of their children then the creatures never create anything and we don’t know what “create” means, for parents having children would seem to be a paradigm of creation—note the word “procreative” (cf. Hartshorne 1987, 88–89). Classical theists accept precisely the implication that Hartshorne finds absurd, namely, that the creatures never create anything. The Thomist, for example, holds that one’s parents are not creative; they are the vehicles whereby matter-energy is rearranged so as to form (not to create) a new human being. Strictly speaking, for Aquinas, what God creates is your-parents-having-you. Your parents had no part in your creation.
Aquinas’s theory poses complications for human freedom. The reality described by your-parents-having-you includes the decisions they make in having you. God, in creating that reality, also creates those decisions. Aquinas says that God’s will is perfectly efficacious—that is, what God wills comes to pass. Therefore, your parents’ decisions in your-parents-having-you must occur. Would this view of decision making jeopardize human freedom? Aquinas, representing classical theism, says no, but Hartshorne, representing process theism, says yes. In Aquinas’s view, one’s free decisions have two sufficient explanations, one’s own will and God’s will. In other words, God brings it about not only that one freely decides something, but what one freely decides (Summa Theologica I, Q 19, a. 8). Process theists counter that multiple freedom (whether between God and the creatures or among the creatures) implies the possibility of wills coming into conflict or being in harmony. Hartshorne says, “Risk and opportunity go together, not because God chooses to have it so, but because opportunity without risk is meaningless or contradictory” (Hartshorne 1970, 238). If this is true, then it must be possible for the will of the creatures to be at cross purposes with the divine will. We have already seen that classical theists and process theists agree that God wills the good of the creatures. Human beings, however, do not always will their own good, or the good of other people. In those cases, on the classical view, God brings it about that people freely decide not to will the good of others. Process theists argue that this makes God responsible for evil and suffering in a way that contradicts divine goodness. On the classical view, for example, the crimes that disfigure human history are the fault of human beings, but they are also God’s doing.
Classical theists are not without responses to these criticisms. One well-known reply, used by Augustine and Aquinas, is to invoke the distinction between divine permission and divine causation of human wickedness and suffering. On this view, the evil in the world is permitted by God in order to bring about a greater good. For example, the Exultet of the Easter Vigil, sometimes ascribed to Ambrose of Milan, speaks of the sin of Adam and Eve as a blessed fault (O felix culpa!) that made possible the sacrificial death of Christ. Process theists argue that there can be no distinction between permitting and causing in a being that creates the universe ex nihilo. On the principles of classical theism, whatever is divinely “permitted” is also divinely created to be as it is (cf. Griffin 1976, 63–64 and 82–83)—this is one of the few points on which process theism agrees with John Calvin (Case-Winters, 1990, 71). On the process view, creaturely decisions are themselves acts of creation, which means that the universe is a joint product of God and the creatures. Process theists do not see how, in creation ex nihilo, creaturely decisions that God permits are not orchestrated by God so as to fulfill the purposes God has for them. Albert Einstein is reported to have said that God does not play dice with the universe. Although he was not a classical theist, his view on this issue is in accord with that philosophy. God may, as it were, allow or permit the dice to fall where they may, but only if they fall as God desires them to fall; this seems different in name only from playing with loaded dice. Hartshorne replies, “Einstein’s rejection of a ‘dice-throwing God’ was a great man’s error. And human individuals are some of the dice …” (Hartshorne 1967a, 113).
4. Dual Transcendence in Whitehead and Hartshorne
The dominant theological position in the West, which we have been referring to as classical theism, denies all relativity to God. One might suppose that the Christian doctrines of the Trinity and the Incarnation of God in Christ would temper disbelief in divine relativity. The trend, however, was to argue that these doctrines do not conflict with the denial of real relations in God. Claims of revealed truth aside, the core doctrine has been that God, to be God, must be in all respects absolute and in no respects relative. As goes the contrast between absolute and relative, so go other metaphysical contrasts. Theists traditionally held that God is in all respects creator, active, infinite, eternal, necessary, independent, immutable, and impassible and in no respects created, passive, finite, temporal, contingent, dependent, mutable, or passible. This view can be interpreted either as a doctrine about the nature of God or as a thesis about the parameters of responsible discourse about God (in the latter case it is called the via negativa, or negative path). Hartshorne complains that, on either interpretation, traditional theology is guilty of a “monopolar prejudice,” placing God (or talk about God) on one side of polar contrasts and the world on the other. It is monopolar insofar as deity is characterized by only one side of each pair of contrasts; it is prejudicial insofar as it holds to the invidious nature of the contrasts. As Hartshorne notes, “One pole of each contrary is regarded as more excellent than the other, so that the supremely excellent being cannot be described by the other and inferior pole” (Hartshorne and Reese 1953 [2000, 2]).
Classical theists certainly made provisions for speaking of God in ways that suggested divine passion and even mutability. As Paul Gavrilyuk argues, for the Church Fathers, divine impassibility was less a denial of God’s emotional life than it was a qualifier that ruled out “passions and experiences that were unbecoming of the divine nature” (Gavrilyuk 2004, 16). In a similar vein, Michael Dodds emphasizes that Aquinas did not construe divine immutability as an attribute of God nor did he think that it implies inertness or stagnation. Nevertheless, Dodds, interpreting Aquinas, maintains that immutability “seems to signify divine being (esse) more appropriately [than mutability] since it more clearly indicates its distinction from all other things and its transcendence of all human thought and language” (Dodds 2008, 157–158).
Process theists also emphasize our limitations in knowing the reality of God, but they are not persuaded that it is best signified by only one pair of the metaphysical contraries. If one is willing to concede that God should not be conceived as immutable in the bad ways that creatures are unchanging, why may not God be conceived as changeable in the good ways that creatures are, with the proviso that God’s excellence necessarily surpasses all else? Hartshorne notes that ordinary language provides scanty support for and abundant evidence against the superiority of one pole over the other. We have already seen that process theism finds positive value in God’s love being active as well as passive; it is as important that God wills the good of the creatures as that God is affected by their joy and suffering. Here is another of Hartshorne’s many examples, expressed with some humor:
The venerable dogma, ‘agent is superior to patient’, is not derived from the study of knowledge. Indeed, it is not derived from any careful examination of ordinary cases. To speak is to be agent, to listen is to be patient, and those who want to show their superiority by speaking without listening are not trustworthy authorities in the theory of value. (Hartshorne 1970, 231–32)
Hartshorne’s larger point is that the pairs of metaphysical contraries are not related as superior to inferior, but that there are admirable and deficient manifestations of both sides. He sums this up in the principle of the non-invidiousness of the metaphysical contraries (Hartshorne 1970, 268). If this principle is correct, and if God is conceived as the eminent embodiment of value and supremely worshipful being, then God must be conceived not in monopolar terms but as dipolar, exemplifying the admirable forms of both pairs of metaphysical contrasts. For example, rather than saying that God is in all respects active and in no respects passive, the alternative is to say that God is active in some respects and passive in other respects, each in uniquely excellent ways. This is one meaning of the expression “dipolar theism”; in light of other meanings to be given to “dipolar” in discussions of process theism, it is perhaps clearer to use Hartshorne’s expression for this idea: dual transcendence, that is to say, God as the supreme embodiment of each pair of metaphysical contraries.
The most elegant statement of dual transcendence is in the closing pages of Process and Reality, a line of which we have already quoted. The complete quotation reads like a litany:
It is as true to say that God is permanent and the world fluent, as that the World is permanent and God is fluent.
It is as true to say that God is one and the World many, as that the World is one and God many.
It is as true to say that, in comparison with the World, God is actual eminently, as that, in comparison with God, the World is actual eminently.
It is as true to say that the World is immanent in God, as that God is immanent in the World.
It is as true to say that God transcends the World, as that the World transcends God.
It is as true to say that God creates the World, as that the World creates God.(Whitehead 1929 [1978, 348])
We saw above in the discussion of divine creativity that Whitehead indulges in poetic expression and that understanding his meaning requires looking more closely at his metaphysical categories. Above all, however, what is required is a way of making principled distinctions between different aspects of God so that the doctrine of dual transcendence does not collapse into contradiction. Let us examine the different ways in which Whitehead and Hartshorne attempt to save the doctrine of dual transcendence from incoherence.
4.1 Whitehead on the two natures of God
In Whitehead’s philosophy, every actual entity has a physical and a mental pole. For this reason, Whitehead speaks of actual entities as “dipolar” (thus, a second meaning of the word). The physical and mental poles are aspects of every real being (actual entities) but they are not real beings themselves. In other words, Whitehead is not a mind-body dualist. It is also important to note that, for Whitehead, human consciousness is a higher form of mentality but not the only form. Thus, Whitehead does not claim that every real being is a conscious entity. As with Leibniz, Whitehead recognizes a continuum of mind-like qualities ranging from very primitive feelings to the most advanced form of self-awareness. Whereas Leibniz speaks of every real being—he calls them monads—as having apperception and appetition, Whitehead speaks of every actual entity as prehending, or grasping or taking account of, its environment and as striving to realize the subjective aim of coordinating its prehensions in some determinate fashion. In Process and Reality, Whitehead uses the word “feeling” as a synonym for prehension to indicate the vector character of feelings—a feeling is always a feeling of something. Whitehead’s belief in a continuum of mental qualities fits neatly with evolutionary theory where it is commonplace to conceive differing forms of organic complexity as associated with differing levels of mental capacity. For example, the frontal cortex of a human brain allows for more advanced mentality than one finds in a chimpanzee, whose brain is not as complex.
Whitehead is fully aware that there is an imaginative leap in applying these categories to God, but he believes the application can be done in a disciplined and systematic fashion. Whitehead conceives God as an actual entity. In God, the physical and mental poles are called the consequent nature and the primordial nature respectively. As with the physical and mental poles of actual entities, so the two “natures” are distinguishable but inseparable aspects of deity. That is to say, neither can exist apart from the other and each requires the other. The primordial nature is God’s envisagement of all possibilities; in the idiom of Leibniz, it is God’s knowledge of all possible worlds. It is called “primordial” because it represents what could be in a sense not tethered to the actual course of events. It is logical space, deficient in actuality apart from the consequent nature says Whitehead. The consequent nature is God’s prehensions of the actual processes of the world. Conversely, it is the world’s influence on God. It is called “consequent” because it is consequent upon, or dependent upon, the decisions of non-divine actual entities (Whitehead calls them actual occasions). The consequent nature is the record of all achieved fact, a perfect memory of what has been—Whitehead speaks of the “objective immortality” of the world in God. The two natures work in concert in the process of God’s interaction with the creatures. The deity receives the world of actual occasions into its experience; then, comparing what has actually occurred with the realm of pure possibility, God informs the world with new ideals (new aims), customized for each actual entity, for what realistically could be achieved. Whitehead sometimes refers to this aspect of the process as the superjective nature of God. It is God’s relevance for the world as a “lure for feeling,” urging the creatures to strive for whatever perfection of which they are capable.
Each of the statements in Whitehead’s “litany” can be interpreted in terms of the interaction between the two natures and God’s interaction with the world. God is permanent in the sense of everlastingly envisioning the realm of possibility; the world is permanent as objectively immortal in God’s memory. God is fluent in constantly acquiring new experiences of the world and the world is fluent in the rhythm of the birth and death of actual occasions. God is one in being a single actual entity; but God is many in the graded relevance of possibilities provided for each emergent occasion. The world is one in virtue of God’s experience of it; the world is many because of the plurality of occasions that make it up. God is eminently actual in comparison to the world by achieving a unification of worldly occasions in the consequent nature that is beyond any of them taken singly; but the world is eminently actual in comparison to God’s primordial nature, which is not concrete, although it is as infinite as the entire range of possibility. God and the world are immanent in each other in that each experiences the other; yet God and the world transcend each other by being realities whose experiences are not entirely determined by the other. Finally, as we have seen, God creates the world by informing it with possibilities (technically speaking, God provides “initial aims” for every nascent occasion). The world creates God, not by bringing God into existence, but by creating something in God, namely the material for what shall become objectively immortal.
4.2 Hartshorne on existence and actuality
Hartshorne develops the concept of dual transcendence by drawing a distinction of logical type between, on the one hand, an individual’s existence and enduring characteristics and, on the other hand, the actual states of the individual. Using an example dear to his ornithological interests, Hartshorne says, “That I shall (at least probably) exist tomorrow is one thing; that I shall exist hearing a blue jay call at noon is another” (Hartshorne 1962, 63). The logical relationship between the two sentences “I shall exist tomorrow” and “I shall exist tomorrow as hearing a blue jay call at noon” is that the second cannot be inferred from the first, but the first can be inferred from the second. The relation of entailment between the sentences is a function of the information provided in them. Both sentences speak of the individual’s existence, but only the second sentence speaks of the experience that the individual is having. Hartshorne argues that this logical relation between the sentences reflects an ontological difference between the bare fact of one’s existence and the actual states in which one exists. Existence, says Hartshorne, is abstract compared to actuality, which is the concrete. What is true of existence is also true of one’s defining or enduring characteristics. The state of affairs described by “Hartshorne existing as an ornithologist” is abstract compared to the state of affairs described by “Hartshorne existing as an ornithologist hearing a blue jay call at noon.” The more abstract statement leaves more details concerning the individual’s actuality to be defined. Unless strict determinism is the case—which would require that there is only one future that is genuinely possible—the ornithologist can exist tomorrow without hearing a blue jay call at noon (perhaps he will hear another bird, or none at all).
In effect, Hartshorne lays out a three-fold distinction between what a thing is (its essence or defining characteristics), that a thing is (its existence), and the particular manner in which it exists (its actual states or actuality). Hartshorne maintains that this distinction, familiar enough in ordinary experience, is applicable to God and is the basis for speaking of dual transcendence in deity. Between the cases of God and the creatures, however, there are important differences. Human existence and character are fragile and subject to variation. God’s existence and character, on the other hand, are not insecure, unstable, or transient; in a word, they are not contingent. Hartshorne agrees with traditional theism that God exists without the possibility of not existing (sometimes called necessary existence or existence a se) and that God is necessarily supreme in love, knowledge, and power. A closely related point is that, in the divine case, existence and essence are identical, whereas they are not the same thing in the creatures. Aquinas speaks of the “existential composition” of the creatures to indicate that no creature necessarily exists. Hartshorne agrees with Aquinas about this. Since, in God, existence and essence are the same, Hartshorne customarily abbreviates the distinction among existence, essence, and actuality to that between existence and actuality.
The importance of the distinction between existence and actuality is to demonstrate that the necessary aspects of deity do not preclude God having contingent aspects, provided they do not conflict with the necessary ones. We saw previously, in the discussion of real relations, that there must be contingent aspects of the divine being if it is to have perfect knowledge of contingent things. Aquinas resists this conclusion, in part, because he sees contingency as a kind of metaphysical virus that infects the very existence of the one of which it is a characteristic. He says that a being whose substance has any admixture of potency is subject to decay (as in physical creatures) or annihilation (as in the case of angels) (Summa Contra Gentiles I, ch. 16, para. 2). The logical type distinction between existence and actuality ensures that contingencies in God pose no threat to the deity’s necessary existence. Thus, Hartshorne says, “That God exists is one with his essence and is an analytic truth … but how, or in what actual state of experience or knowledge or will, he exists is contingent in the same sense as is our own existence” (Hartshorne 1948, 87). It is also part of Hartshorne’s theory that God’s character or essence is supremely excellent. Thus, the contingencies in the divine actuality do not include the possibilities of God being selfish, cruel, or wicked as they do in the human case.
The mention of angelic existence in the previous paragraph brings up a point seldom noticed in discussions of process theism. Aquinas approximates the Hartshornean distinction between immutable existence and mutable actuality in what he says about the nature of angels. (Thomists might say that Hartshorne approximates Aquinas.) Aquinas holds that angels are not subject to natural decay or destruction for they are incorporeal. Like God, their existence is not affected by the flow of time. They are, however, capable of certain kinds of change. While their existence is constant, they have free will and their knowledge can increase, and in a certain sense, they can move from place to place. Aquinas says that between the unqualified changelessness of God’s eternity and the qualified changeableness of corporeal existence, there is the qualified immutability of angelic being. The technical expression for this is æviternity, which is the mean between the extremes of eternity and time (Summa Theologica I, Q 19, a. 5). One is almost tempted to say that God, as conceived by Hartshorne, is æviternital, except for three important differences: (1) angelic existence is unaffected by time, but it is still contingent, unlike the existence of Hartshorne’s God; (2) angelic freedom includes the freedom to be wicked and Hartshorne does not view that as an option for God; (3) angels are entirely nonphysical, but Hartshorne argues, as we shall see, that God has a body of sorts in the universe itself.
Hartshorne often refers to his theism as “neoclassical” to indicate both its affinities with and its departures from classical theism—it retains much of what is “classical” in classical theism, but adds something that is new (neo). Classical theism holds to the necessity, eternity, infinity, independence, immutability, and impassibility of God. Hartshorne agrees that God can be so characterized, but only with respect to the divine existence and essence. Hartshorne adds that God’s actuality is contingent, temporal, finite, dependent, mutable, and passible. Indeed, Hartshorne agrees with Whitehead that all achieved value is necessarily finite in the sense of not exhausting all that can be. Whitehead makes the point that the limitation of God is a necessary condition of God’s goodness.
[God] gains his depth of actuality by his harmony of valuation. It is not true that God is in all respects infinite. If He were, He would be evil as well as good. Also this unlimited fusion of evil with good would mean mere nothingness. He is something decided and is thereby limited. (Whitehead 1926 [1997, 153])
It is noteworthy that Whitehead does not say that God is not infinite, but that God is not infinite in all respects. Thus, dual transcendence does not entail that God is in no sense infinite. Hartshorne locates the infinity of God primarily in the unlimited capacity to influence, know, and care for the creatures in any conceivable world.
One may rightly demand an answer to the question: If God is finite in some respects, what prevents there being a reality that surpasses God? Hartshorne’s response is that there is indeed a possible reality that surpasses God in any actual state of the divine existence, but what can surpass God is only a subsequent actual state of Godself. Hartshorne calls on Gustav Fechner’s distinction between “surpassable by others, including self” and “surpassable, but only by self.” It is only the latter phrase, according to Hartshorne, that applies to God. This is what Hartshorne calls R-perfection (for relative perfection), a form of perfection that permits a contingent actuality in God that is unsurpassed by all others, excluding self. This is by way of contrast with A-perfection (for absolute perfection)—which applies to the divine existence and essence—which is to be unsurpassable by all others, including self. To speak of God as having dual transcendence is to say that God is both R-perfect and A-perfect, but in different respects. Thus, one of Hartshorne’s preferred definitions of God: “the self-surpassing surpasser of all” (Hartshorne 1948, 20).
Hartshorne’s version of dual transcendence is quite different from Whitehead’s. To be sure, Whitehead and Hartshorne are in firm agreement, and are at pains to emphasize, that the relations between God and the world are symmetrical. In addition, both philosophers regard God as supremely worshipful not only with respect to the divine absoluteness but also with respect to the divine relativity. Indeed, one of the main objectives of Hartshorne’s book The Divine Relativity (1948) is to show that only by having an eminent form of relativity can the deity qualify as worshipful. Nevertheless, Hartshorne conceives God as an individual who endures through various actual states. In the technical language of Whitehead’s philosophy, this makes God a “society,” that is to say, a collection of actual entities extended in time, each member of which shares a defining characteristic, passed along from one moment to the next. All enduring objects are societies of actual entities; moreover, no actual entity endures through various states. Whitehead’s God is not an enduring object but a single actual entity. To speak of Whitehead’s God as dipolar is to indicate that God has a physical and a mental pole. This sense of “dipolar” is different from the meaning that Hartshorne commonly gives the expression. Hartshorne does not deny that actual entities are dipolar, nor does he deny that there are physical and mental aspects of deity, but his God is dipolar in having an enduring character embodied in successive states, the character being abstract compared to the concrete actual states—this gives us a third meaning of “dipolar” (cf. Griffin’s rather different view on the meanings of dipolarity in God, Griffin 2001a, 150). Hartshorne says, “Unlike Whitehead, I … define God as an enduring society of actualities, not a single actuality. Here I think Whitehead was just mistaken” (Hartshorne 1967b, 287).
Whitehead indicated that he considered the possibility of God being an enduring object, and thus a society, but rejected it on the grounds that God’s consequent nature loses nothing of the past whereas societies are characterized by partial loss of the past (Johnson 1983, 9). This argument is curious, for it would seem to apply to actual entities as well as to societies. No non-divine actual entity preserves its entire past without distortion and loss; yet Whitehead attributes to deity—in the doctrine of objective immortality of the past in God—what no other actual entity can accomplish. In reply to a question from Vergilius Ferm, Hartshorne notes that the unique excellence of retaining the past perfectly in memory must be no less true if God is an actual entity than if God is a society (Rome 1964, 324). He argues that the consequent nature of God is itself abstract, for it is the generic property of being somehow actual or affected by others (Hartshorne 1972, 75–76). Thus, Hartshorne proposes that Whitehead would be more true to his own metaphysics by conceiving God as an enduring object, and thus as a society, rather than as a single actual entity. Hartshorne acknowledged that his own theory is not without its problems. Not least of these is how to coordinate the concept of a divine temporal world-line with the relativistic view of space-time in contemporary physics (Hartshorne 1970, 123–125; Sia 1990, 276; cf. Griffin 1992). Suffice it to say that the question whether God is best conceived as a single actual entity or as an enduring object is a major parting of the ways between process theists. Griffin, for example, refers to the idea of God as a single everlasting actual entity as Whitehead’s “greatest blunder” (Griffin 2001a, 152). Nevertheless, Whitehead’s view has a number of able defenders, including Jorge Nobo and Palmyre Oomen (Nobo 1989; Oomen 1998).
The doctrine of prehension, developed by Whitehead but also enthusiastically endorsed by Hartshorne, insures that the world is, in some sense, part of God. Actual entities, by virtue of their prehensions of one another, are internally related to their predecessors and externally related to their successors. Whitehead’s “organic” philosophy can thereby affirm both that an individual is in the world and the world is in the individual. This generalization applies equally to God, but with differences that allow for a clear distinction between the divine and the non-divine. Whitehead maintains that events in the world have a specific locus with reference to God, but God has no locus with reference to the world (Johnson 1983, 9). Hartshorne says that God is the one individual conceivable a priori—God is individuated by, though not exhausted by, concepts alone (Hartshorne 1948, 31). This is because God’s scope of interaction is universal whereas the scope of interaction for any creature is localized. To be God is to causally affect and be affected by every real being; to be a non-divine entity is to causally affect and be affected by some, but not all, creatures. Whitehead and Hartshorne also say that God and the creatures differ in the quality of interaction. For example, any non-divine individual’s knowledge of others is imperfect and partial whereas God’s knowledge is without defect (Hartshorne 1967, 40).
While both philosophers deny that God has location within the universe, they consider God to be in some sense a physical or material being. Since process thought affirms the goodness of God, it is clear that it denies the ancient Manichean and Gnostic ideas that there is something inherently evil in being material. Even so, in order to fully appreciate the process view, it is well to keep in mind that Whitehead and Hartshorne reject the traditional concept of matter as devoid of any activity or feeling—Whitehead refers to the traditional view of matter as “vacuous actuality.” Because actual entities are dipolar, all of them have a physical aspect, but none are entirely lacking in psychic qualities, although in most cases these qualities are negligible. Thus, in process thought, being physical does not mean having no mind-like qualities. The closest anticipation of process ideas about mind and body are in Leibniz, although process thought denies Leibniz’s view that the monads have no “windows.” Leibniz maintains that no monad enters into the internal constitution of another; Whitehead’s doctrine of prehension insures that actual entities are internally related to their predecessors.
A common criticism of process theism is that it conceives God as “needing” the world. In one sense this is true, but in another sense it is false. It is true that, in process metaphysics, the structure of reality is social, and necessarily so. Thus, it promotes a social view of God—God as necessarily related to non-divine actualities. On the other hand, the process God does not require any particular universe in order to exist. Whitehead speaks of a succession of “cosmic epochs” which are, in effect, different universes where the very laws of nature are different. God presides over each universe as its eminent creative power, making possible all localized expressions of creativity, but no universe sustains God’s existence. Hartshorne makes a similar point by comparing God’s existence and actuality to a set that necessarily has members. “To say that a class could not be empty is not at all to say that its particular members are necessary” (Hartshorne 1970, 144). From the perspective of process theism, the criticism that God “needs” the universe is, at best, simply another way of raising the question of how best to conceive the necessarily existent: Is it, or is it not, social in nature?
Trinitarians sometimes argue that a social concept of ultimate reality can be formulated if God is necessarily related to the divine self. Process theists, especially those who are Christians, are not averse to this suggestion. Nevertheless, if this is to be taken seriously as a philosophical proposal, then there can be no mere appeal to the “mystery” of the Trinity. Some effort should be made to retain the primary meaning of “social” as multiple entities in a network of relations, some of which are internal and some external. That is to say, a genuinely social concept of reality is one in which the multiple identities of each of the interrelated and interacting entities are not absorbed into each other. Whitehead and Hartshorne claim to do this apart from the Christian doctrine of the Trinity, but there is no reason a priori to suppose that Trinitarian metaphysics cannot be one version of process metaphysics, or that the latter could not be adapted to the former (Boyd 1992; Inbody 1997, ch. 8; Bracken and Suchocki 2005).
Whitehead and Hartshorne part company concerning the proper analogy for conceiving the God-world relation. Hartshorne modifies Plato’s world-soul analogy in the Timaeus (30a–34c). In Plato’s myth, the eternal demiurge creates a universe that is a living creature, animated by a soul. Hartshorne argues that the best philosophical interpretation of the myth is to consider the demiurge and the world-soul as two aspects of the same deity (Hartshorne & Reese 1953 [2000, 55]). If this is correct, then Plato affirms a version of dual transcendence, with one aspect of God being the universe. According to this interpretation, Plato came close to Hartshorne’s view that, “the world is God’s body” (Hartshorne 1941, 185; Dombrowski 2005, chapter 1). This is not to say that God has a location within the universe, but that the location of the universe is in God, for the divine being-in-becoming is all-inclusive. Hartshorne borrows a word invented by Karl Krause (1781–1832) to express this view: panentheism—everything (pan, all) is in (en, in) God (theos, God) (Cooper 2006, 121). Panentheism is a mediating position between pantheism and classical theism. For pantheism, the world is identical to God; for classical theism, the world is completely external to God; for panentheism, the world is within God.
Hartshorne makes qualifications to Plato’s analogy. Whereas Plato apparently conceives the soul-body (or mind-body) relationship as a one-to-one relation, Hartshorne, following modern biology, argues that it is more plausible to construe it as a one-to-many relation. The human body is a hierarchical society of thousands of kinds of cells. Thus, Hartshorne maintains that God is related to the universe in a manner similar to the way that a person is related to the cells of his or her body. In an important respect, Whitehead can make a better claim than Hartshorne that the relationship of God to the World is one-to-many. Whitehead’s God is a single actual entity whereas Hartshorne’s God is a society. Thus, if it is a question of the relations of actual entities, then the God-to-World relation in Hartshorne’s theism is a many-to-many relation. Hartshorne’s point requires clarification: God, a single enduring object, is related to every non-divine actual entity and society. Clarity on this point brings out another comparison. By conceiving God as an actual entity, Whitehead weakens the analogy between God and a person. Donald Sherburne shows that in Whitehead’s metaphysics, persons are enduring objects of a specific type (Sherburne 1969). Therefore, Hartshorne’s view of God as an enduring object apparently provides more of a basis for speaking of God as a person.
Randall E. Auxier and Gary L. Herstein (2017) maintain, on the contrary, that a Whiteheadian view is friendlier to conceiving God as a person than Hartshorne’s view. Their argument turns on the idea of negative prehensions, that is, experience which “eliminates [certain data] from feeling” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 23]). According to Auxier and Herstein, one cannot be a person or experience temporal passage apart from negative prehensions, which, they say, allow distinctions both between what was and what might-have-been and between what will-be and what might-be (Auxier and Herstein 2017, 243 and 265). Hartshorne consistently rejected the idea of negative prehensions in God whereas Whitehead, at least in some of his statements, seemed to allow for them. The metaphysical issues run deep; suffice it to say that Hartshorne distinguished the actual and the possible in ways that diverged significantly from Whitehead (see Ramal 2010, 139–157).
To speak of God as a person is, of course, an analogy. A person’s feelings cannot be entirely separated from the feelings of cells in the body—damage to the cells hurts the person. In a similar fashion, God is affected by what affects the creatures. On the other hand, God knows—in Whiteheadian language, God prehends—each “cell” of the divine body in a perfectly distinct fashion whereas others experience their cells en masse, much as one sees the green of the grass but not each blade. Another difference, as we have seen, is that God is not located within the universe as are non-divine individuals. Hartshorne turns this difference to his advantage by following a suggestion in Plato. He says that Plato’s argument concerning the spherical nature of the universe adequately explains why the divine body has neither internal organs nor sense organs. Bodily organs in the creatures, including a central nervous system, are needed to mediate with an external environment, but there is nothing external to the universe (Hartshorne 1984, 134). God’s only “environment” is internal to God. Thus, the world-soul analogy does not entail that God has a brain or any other bodily organ that one finds in the creatures. In addition, the lack of an external environment for God means that there can be no threat to the divine existence from such a source. The “harm” done to God by creaturely suffering can never be fatal.
Whitehead’s view of God as a single actual entity is arguably one factor that prevented him from taking the Platonic analogy as a serious proposal. His remarks on the topic are entirely negative. He called the Timaeus Plato’s “most unfortunate essay in mythology,” and he referred to the idea of the World-Soul, considered as an emanation, as “the parent of puerile metaphysics” (Whitehead 1933, 166; ch. VIII, sec. VI). Whitehead read the dialogue through the lens of neo-Platonism, conceiving the world-soul as an emanation from a wholly transcendent demiurge. Hartshorne agrees that this is not the solution to the problem of permanence and flux. However, Hartshorne sees in Plato’s myth the elements of a solution, provided the demiurge and the world-soul are not separate deities, but aspects of the same deity. For this reason, Hartshorne says that Whitehead rejected the analogy for “weak reasons” (Hahn 1991, 642).
Late in his career, Hartshorne saw other advantages to the world-soul analogy that touch on the problem of God and gender. He was sympathetic to feminist complaints about the male bias in traditional theology and he made a concerted effort in the closing decades of his life to use inclusive language (Hartshorne 1987 [2001, 258]). For example, in the 1980s he began using “He-She” when referring to God and he remarked in 1996 that he would title his third book Our Vision of God rather than Man’s Vision of God (Auxier and Davies 2001, 159). Hartshorne goes further than simply worrying about pronouns. If the world-soul analogy is combined with the parent-to-child analogy, then he argues that, “it is the mother, not the father, who furnishes by far the best symbol of deity. The fetus-mother relationship is decidedly more intimate than the fetus-father relationship” (Hartshorne 1984, 60). Hartshorne never expressed his thoughts on feminism systematically, but it is instructive that Carol P. Christ explicitly develops her feminist philosophy of religion in light of Hartshorne’s metaphysics in her book She Who Changes. Generally speaking, feminist theologians have been friendly to process thought, seeing Whitehead and Hartshorne as articulating ideas about the divine that speak to feminist concerns (Christ 2003, 4–5).
One objection to the concept of a deity whose “body” is the universe is that it implies that all values, both the good and the evil, are within God. Hartshorne counters that this is true, but not in a sense that compromises divine goodness. As a point of logic, wholes do not necessarily share the characteristics of their parts. On Hartshorne’s model, the relation of God to any non-divine creature is a relation of whole to part. Indeed, this is the basis of Hartshorne’s view of religion as the acceptance of our fragmentariness—we are fragments of the cosmos, not the whole of it. Thus, Hartshorne can say that God’s goodness is not diminished if a fragmentary being is heedless of the good of others, by indifference or harmful intent. Nevertheless, precisely because of God’s goodness, the suffering and wickedness of the creatures enter God’s experience. God sympathizes with the sufferer and grieves for the criminal in losing an opportunity for creating the good. God can feel the contrast between what could have been and what is. The “what is,” moreover, is not unilaterally determined by God but is left, in part, to the creatures; we have seen that God and the creatures are co-creators in process theism. For this reason, Hartshorne, following Berdyaev, speaks of tragic and sublime aspects of divine love (cf. Hartshorne 1953, chapter 8). Whitehead agrees that, “there is a tragedy which even God does not escape” (Johnson 1983, 7).
6. Divine Power and the Problem of Evil
Process theism provides unique, if controversial, thoughts on the traditional problem of evil. Simply stated, the problem of evil comes to this: if God is all-powerful then God has the ability to prevent unjustified suffering; if God is perfectly good then God has the motive to prevent unjustified suffering; but unjustified suffering apparently exists; therefore, there is reason to believe that God is not all-powerful or not perfectly good. The argument can be taken in at least two ways. According to one interpretation, the problem of evil poses a challenge to belief in God. In other words, it is a stepping stone towards atheism. Another interpretation is that it is a challenge to rethink the attributes of God. In this case, if one considers the argument sound, it is not belief in God that one should abandon, but belief in certain concepts of God. Process theists generally approach the problem of evil in the spirit of the second interpretation. Moreover, they point out that to assume the first interpretation—that the problem of evil is an argument against the existence of God—is an invitation to beg the question against alternative proposals about the nature of God such as process theism offers.
A central contention of process theism is that the problem of evil is aggravated by flawed accounts of omnipotence commonly assumed by theists and their critics. Most theists agree with Aquinas that God cannot bring about logically impossible states of affairs, like creating a circle with unequal radii (Summa Contra Gentiles II, ch. 25, para. 14). This is not, Aquinas argues, a limitation on God but a condition of responsible theological discourse. To say, as Descartes does, that God could have made such irregularly shaped circles, is to utter nonsense according to Aquinas (Cottingham 1991, 25). Whitehead remarks that some medieval and modern philosophers got into the unfortunate habit of paying God “metaphysical compliments”—that is to say, attributing properties to God that seem to make the divine more worthy of devotion but that are contrary to sound metaphysical reasoning (Whitehead 1925, 258). Whitehead’s observation is more applicable to Descartes than to Aquinas. Indeed, process theism has no quarrel with Aquinas on this point. It is rather, the stronger claim that God can bring about any state of affairs the description of which is not contradictory, with which process theism takes issue. It is a fair question whether Aquinas held this view (see Summa Theologica I, Q. 25, a. 3). Nevertheless, it is a widely accepted view of omnipotence as Griffin makes clear (Griffin 1976, chapter 17). In a deliberate play on J. B. Phillips’ classic, Your God is Too Small, Tyron Inbody sums up the criticism of traditional accounts of divine power by saying, “Your God is too big” (Inbody 1997, 139).
Griffin warns against what he calls “the omnipotence fallacy.” This is the fallacy of assuming that if a state of affairs is logically possible—that is, its description involves no contradiction—then an omnipotent being could single-handedly bring it about (Griffin 1976, 263f). Griffin represents all process theists in considering it a fallacy, for it is their contention that there are logically possible states of affairs that no being, including God, could bring about by itself. For example, a contractual agreement between two individuals or parties is impossible unless each agrees to keep the conditions of the contract. This is expressed colloquially in English by saying, “It takes two to tango.” The example of making contracts is especially relevant since it is a theme in Jewish Scripture that God enters into numerous covenants with the creatures. The emphasis is invariably on the divine initiative in making the covenants and on God’s reliability in keeping a promise; nevertheless, when “covenant” is not simply shorthand for God’s promises, the agreements are two-sided affairs, including God’s blessings and demands and human obligations. Arguably, the logic of contracts, agreements, and covenants, does not change when one of the parties is divine. These examples are evidence that there are logically possible states of affairs that require something more than the decisions of God.
Hartshorne argues the case as follows. Suppose X and Y are agents who make decisions A and B, respectively. The conjunction, AB, is something that neither X nor Y, individually, decided, even if one of the agents is God. Suppose, however, for the sake of argument, that this reasoning does not apply in the divine case. According to this view, if X is God, then it is possible for X to decide not only A, but also AB. We can imagine that A represents God loving an individual and B represents the individual freely accepting God’s love. If God decides AB then God must also bring it about that B, that the individual freely accepts God’s love, for this is part of AB. Hartshorne responds that this view divorces the concept of decision making from any meaningful connection with lived experience. Numerous analogies have been discussed in the literature for how free creatures might be related to a deity that makes their decisions—the creatures as God’s marionettes; as androids programmed by God; as subjects hypnotized by God; as objects of God’s dreaming; as characters in God’s novel. Each analogy faces the dilemma that either the decisions of the person are not fully determined (e.g., the hypnotism case) or the person is not an actual individual (e.g., the fictional character case). In ordinary language, an individual that tries to control a relationship is called manipulative, overbearing, or colloquially, “a control freak.” Doubtless, it was considering this kind of analogy that led Hartshorne to speak of “the tyrant ideal of power” in classical theism (Hartshorne 1984a, 11). In a similar vein, Whitehead speaks of the idolatry of fashioning God in the image of imperial rulers: “The Church gave unto God the attributes which belonged exclusively to Caesar” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 342]).
James Keller argues that the traditional concept of omnipotence can only be justified by appealing to metaphysical schemes or intuitions that are no better established than omnipotence itself (Keller 2007, 131). Hartshorne goes further and says that the traditional concept of omnipotence was not coherent enough to be false (Hartshorne 1978, 86). The denial that an individual’s free decisions can be totally determined by another is what is behind the slogan—often found in discussions of process theism—that God acts by persuasion rather than by coercion. Whitehead attributes this idea to Plato’s later thought, in the Sophist and the Timaeus, and calls it, “one of the greatest intellectual discoveries in the history of religion” (Whitehead 1933, 213; ch. X, sec. III). Unfortunately, the slogan has often been misinterpreted, even by process thinkers. It does not mean that, according to Whitehead and Hartshorne, God acts only as a final cause and never as an efficient cause, as Griffin has shown (Griffin 1991, 98–99). “Coercion,” in the sense intended by the slogan, is the ability of one actual being to unilaterally bring about the decision of another actual being. In process metaphysics, no individual possesses this ability. Thus, in a metaphysical sense, it is not only God that acts persuasively and not coercively, but every actual being.
Of course, “persuasion” and “coercion” have meanings in ordinary language. To persuade is to convince others to do something of their own will. To coerce is to force one’s will upon others who are unwilling. The italicized phrases are important, for they demonstrate that persuasion and coercion presuppose the ability of the individual who is being persuaded or coerced to make decisions. Even in the case of coercion, the person being coerced retains the power to resist, even if only mentally. This indicates that coercion is an inferior form of power, used either out of ignorance or when persuasion has failed. Cobb says, “In my relations with other people, such as my children, the use of such power is a last resort which expresses my total powerlessness in all ways that matter” (Cobb 1969, 89). Thus, even if the words “persuasive” and “coercive” are taken in their ordinary, non-metaphysical, senses, it makes sense to speak of the supreme or eminent form of power as persuasive rather than coercive.
David Basinger presses the following objection. Coercion in the ordinary sense may be an inferior form of power, but there is sometimes a moral imperative to use it, otherwise we would never have a police force. Thus, a deity that possesses both coercive and persuasive power is greater than a deity that possesses only persuasive power (Basinger 1988). Hartshorne, who argues against strict pacifism, agrees that the use of brute force can sometimes be morally justified. In response to the threat of Naziism he wrote, “Freedom must not be free to destroy freedom” (Hartshorne 1941, 173). In process theism, however, coercion in the ordinary sense represents an indirect form of power that is available only for localized beings within the cosmos (Hartshorne 1948, 155). It is indirect in the sense that it is exerted on aggregates of actual entities and not on actual entities themselves, as when one person prevents another from performing a vicious act by restraining the aggressor’s body. God’s power over aggregates is nothing over and above the direct persuasive power over the actual entities that comprise them. Barry Whitney argues that there is a coercive aspect of God’s power in process theism insofar as the laws of nature are the result of a divine decision that no creature is free to abrogate (Whitney 1985, 99–114). That there should be this form of divine power—which is also a form of efficient causation—providing for an ordered world that no creature has decided, is a necessary condition for any creaturely activity, Hartshorne believes. “God decides upon the basic outlines of creaturely actions, and guaranteed limits within which freedom is to operate. That not everything can be guaranteed does not mean that nothing can be” (Hartshorne 1966, 206).
Griffin maintains that it lies at the heart of process theism’s answer to the problem of evil that God’s power is exerted on individuals rather than aggregates (Griffin 1991, 104). Theists of a more traditional bent may view this as an indication of the inadequacy of process metaphysics, for there is no provision for a run-of-the-mill coercive power in its concept of God. The idea that persuasion plus coercion is a greater form of power than persuasion alone ignores, however, a significant difference between God and the creatures. Every person has the power of persuasion and coercion (in their ordinary senses), but neither of these powers involves a violation of the laws of nature. In order to attribute both forms of power to God seems to require that God have the power to violate the laws of nature. That may not seem unreasonable since God, as traditionally conceived, acts miraculously in ways that break or suspend the laws of nature. Nevertheless, to speak, as Basinger does, of a moral imperative to act coercively is tantamount, in the divine case, to demanding that the deity contravene the very laws that, according to traditional theism and process theism, it imposed in the first place. There is an additional irony where the problem of evil is concerned. Traditional theists fault process theists for, in effect, not attributing to God the power to prevent gratuitous suffering. Traditional theists, on the other hand, attribute this power to God but are obliged to argue that God is not at fault for not using it or for using it in ways that we find utterly baffling.
A hallmark of process theism is to draw attention to the value inherent in the twin probabilities of genuine good and evil. Process thought raises the question—and answers it in the affirmative—whether a world with a probability, not merely a possibility, of genuine good and evil is preferable to a world without it. In the closing pages of Pragmatism, James raises this question by means of a thought experiment. If God asked you before the creation of the universe if you would agree to be part of a world that was not certain to be saved—where there was real adventure and real risk—what would you say? James recognizes that a world where the risk of failure is real does not appeal to everyone; but he says that the chances for success that it promises brings zest to life and makes it rational to, “add our fiat to the fiat of the creator” (James 1907, 290–291). In fairness, however, the freedom that makes life an adventure must be judged against the probabilities of debilitating diseases, natural disasters, the horrors of history, and cosmic catastrophes. Freedom is, in Hartshorne’s words, a “perilous experiment.” George Shields called this “the hard problem” of a specifically process theodicy (2014, 33). And Hartshorne admitted that if he played at questioning God, it was at this point (1984, 126).
Hartshorne says that a universe with multiple freedom or creativity is a universe where the non-identical twins of opportunity and risk are inevitable. As already noted, process theists do not believe in a God that plays with loaded dice. What James’s image adds to this picture is the idea that a world-order with the opportunity for genuine good and the risk of genuine evil is of greater value than a world-order devoid of these opportunities and risks. James’s idea also implies that, in such a world-order, the risks would be real for deity. We have already seen that process theism affirms tragedy in God. The silver linings on this cloud are: (1) God preserves the universe in the divine memory which means that the creatures contribute something to God; (2) God, considered as superject, has an inexhaustible capacity to bring order from chaos and make fresh beginnings, providing a sense of hope amidst the ruin of our lives.
The problem of evil is often presented primarily as an ethical concern, but there is an aesthetic dimension to the problem that is emphasized by process theism (cf. Whitney 1994). If a perfectly good deity would have the motive to overcome discord and wickedness, it would also have a motive to avoid triviality and boredom. This is especially the case in the universe as conceived by process theism where feeling (prehension) is a metaphysical category. The etymology of “aesthetic” is aesthesis, which means “feeling,” and process thought emphasizes that aesthetic values are fundamentally values for an experiencing subject. Moreover, the experiencing subject, in most cases, is not human. This fact is evident not only by looking at the contemporary world with its countless varieties of species, but also when one considers the nearly unfathomable stretches of time on this planet when humans did not exist. Process theism takes the non-anthropocentric, and non-relativist, stance that the experiences of non-human creatures are valuable whether or not humans value them. This is not to say that all experience is equally valuable—the experience of a cockroach can have value without being fully comparable to human experience. Process metaphysics provides for an aesthetic theory that recognizes objective criteria of value such as unity amid contrast and intensity amid complexity (see Dombrowksi 2004). The long process of evolution can be charted on a curve of ever increasing varieties and complexities of organisms with augmented capacity for valuable types of experience. As Cobb and Griffin note, the escape from triviality meant an increased risk of discord, but this brings us full circle to James’s thought experiment (Cobb and Griffin 1976, 73).
7. Divine Knowledge and the Problem of Future Contingents
The Preacher in Ecclesiastes gives eloquent expression to world-weariness by saying that there is nothing new under the sun. Nevertheless, process thought reminds us that there was once a time when the sun itself was new. We noted earlier that in process metaphysics, time is the process of creation. The universe is not a totality, fixed once and for all, but a dynamic vector growing from a determinate past into an open (partly indeterminate) future. We have also seen that process theism conceives God as being really related to the world through prehensions or feelings. If divine knowing is considered perfect, then it follows from these premises that God knows the past as fully determinate (as created), the present as the process of determination (as being created), and the future as partly indeterminate (as yet to be created). Some have criticized process theism for advocating a limited God who is ignorant of the future. Process theists reply that this is incorrect and represents a subtle begging of the question. The question is not whether God knows a fully determinate future but whether there is a fully determinate future to know. It is the nature of time, not the nature of divine knowing, that is at issue. If the future exists as partially indeterminate, unsettled, or uncreated, then a perfect knower must know it as such.
The fact that process theism construes God’s knowledge as prehensive means that it is a mistake to interpret it solely in terms of the information content of declarative sentences. This is not to say that God does not have this information, but it is well to keep in mind that omniscience, for process theism, is more akin to what Bertrand Russell calls knowledge by acquaintance than it is to knowledge by description (Hartshorne 1941, 241). Divine prehensions of the world include not only information but affective tone (Whitehead calls it the “subjective form” of prehensions); God’s knowledge is empathetic, feeling the feelings of the creatures. Again, this contrasts with the traditional account of omniscience which “attributes to God the informational content of our perceptions without the hedonistic content” (Kenny 1979, 32). E. S. Brightman (Auxier and Davies 2001, 43, 70), Henri Simoni-Wastila (1999), and Auxier and Herstein (2017, 264) argue that claiming this kind of knowledge for God is excessive, for it would mean, for example, that in knowing a creature’s fear of death, God would also fear death. Hartshorne’s response is that God feels how we feel without feeling as we feel, similar to the way in which persons can vividly remember emotions they once experienced without actually having those emotions as their own in the present experience of memory (Hartshorne 1984b, 199). This issue highlights a tension between Whitehead and Hartshorne. Whitehead speaks of an actual entity’s subjectivity as “perishing” as it becomes past, but Hartshorne insists that the divine memory preserves the immediacy of our experiences, making them objectively immortal (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 351]; Hartshorne 1970, 118).
Process theism provides an account of the mechanics of omniscience—that is, an account of how God knows the world—that fits well with analogies drawn from experience. Apart from complications introduced by quantum physics, events do not occur because we know about them; we know about them, in part, because they occur. Process theism applies the same logic to God. This account differs from traditional views in two important ways. First, many theists follow Aquinas in reversing the cognitive relation in God. For Aquinas, God knows events in the world because God is their cause (Summa Theologica I, Q. 14, a. 11). This allows Aquinas to affirm omniscience while denying real relations in God; however, it also makes an unambiguous affirmation of the contingency of creaturely decisions difficult if not impossible, as we have already seen in our discussion of God and creativity. Second, the process view contradicts the Boethian concept of eternity as a non-temporal viewpoint on temporal events. For Boethius (and for Aquinas) events in time are related to God as the points on the circumference of a circle are related to its center (Consolation of Philosophy, bk 5, prose 6; Summa Contra Gentiles I, ch. 66, para. 7). For process thought, time is more like a line being added to from moment to moment, but never complete, so there is no vantage from which it can be taken in all at once (Hartshorne 1945, 284).
There are peculiarities in traditional metaphors for omniscience that process thought rejects. God, it was said, “sees” all of time in one eternal instant; yet seeing, like knowing, requires real relations in the perceiver; moreover, one cannot see as fully actualized that which is still only possibly to be actualized, that is to say, the partially indeterminate future. It is noteworthy, however, that process theism retains one element of the traditional view. We have seen that Hartshorne attributes the laws of nature to an act of God. For this reason, God knows the extent to which the future is open—what the laws allow and what they do not allow. The process God must also be aware of the conditions that creaturely decisions set upon future actualization, opening up some possibilities and closing others.
Process theists were not the first to notice the problems that the Thomistic account poses for human freedom. William of Ockham, for example, despaired of explaining how God could come to know the future free decisions of the creatures (Shields 1993, 298). Luis de Molina developed the chief rival in classical theism to Aquinas’s account of the mechanics of omniscience. Molinism has been much discussed in recent literature and vigorously defended (Shields & Viney 2004, 241, n. 15). Molina claims that there are true statements about what any possible creature would freely do in any situation in which that creature existed. The truth of these statements, called “middle knowledge conditionals,” is decided by neither God nor the creatures; they are simply eternally true, a kind of innate divine knowledge. Molina agrees with Aquinas that the deity knows the product of its own creative activity—called “free knowledge” (Kenny 1979, 62). Using free knowledge, in conjunction with middle knowledge conditionals, God can deduce what any actual creature will freely do. The deduction has the form: “If individual X were in situation S, then X would freely decide A” (middle knowledge conditional); and “X is in S” (God’s free knowledge); therefore, “X will freely decide A.” Molina’s theory is designed to save both the freedom of the creatures and the divine immutability and impassibility. Thus, it poses as much of a challenge to process theism as does Thomism which claims for itself the same advantages.
Neither Whitehead nor Hartshorne addresses Molinism, but process metaphysics provides resources for a number of criticisms (Shields & Viney 2004, 225–233). One objection is that Molinism endows God with an innate knowledge of an elaborate set of contingent truths which have no explanation. Yet, contingent truths are precisely the sorts of truths for which we legitimately seek explanations—indeed, this is one of the marks of contingency (Hartshorne 1962, 74). A related problem is that the distinction between the possible and the actual is finessed. It is common to refer to what an actual individual would do in a certain circumstance, for one can speak of that individual’s dispositions and character as so far formed. To refer to what a possible individual would do is entirely different. Possible individuals are either fictional (like Sherlock Holmes) or they are tied to the creative powers of the actual world (like a child yet to be conceived). The properties of fictional characters are defined by someone’s imagination and so there is no fixed truth about what they would do. Arguably, persons yet to be conceived can only be said to have the properties that link them to the reproductive potentialities of actual persons. Thus, most babies have the capacity to grow up to become parents themselves. What may the first child (call it Chris) of a particular newborn (call it Kim) be like? The most that can be said with certainty is that half of Chris’s chromosomes will be inherited from Kim. To speak informatively about what Chris would do under any given circumstances presupposes uncountable human decisions and years of development beyond Kim’s own childhood.
A third and final criticism of Molinism, from a process perspective, is that it doesn’t really preserve the freedom of the creatures in the way it claims. Molina verbally accepts the idea that one is significantly free only if one could have done otherwise in the same circumstances (in the literature this is called incompatibilist freedom). For example, if Oswald’s assassination of President Kennedy was a genuinely free act then if, per impossibile, the clock could be turned back to the moments before the murder, Oswald could have decided not to pull the trigger. Alternately stated, Oswald’s not pulling the trigger in the exact situation where he in fact did pull the trigger could have become actual. In Hartshorne’s view, and as far as incompatibilist freedom is concerned, to be actually possible is to be (or to have been) possibly actual. On Molinist principles, it is difficult to see how Oswald’s not pulling the trigger in those circumstances could have become actual. It is true that, in Molina’s view, there is no contradiction in conceiving Oswald in those circumstances not pulling the trigger. But, given the set of middle knowledge conditionals about Oswald, Oswald’s not pulling the trigger happens in no world that God can create (this is not to say that if a different set of middle knowledge conditionals were true of Oswald God could not create those possible worlds). The events, however, that can become actual, that are actually possible, are events in universes created by God. Since, under the assumption of the set of middle knowledge conditionals we know to be true of Oswald, no universe that could be created by God—no possible actuality—is one in which Oswald freely refrains from pulling the trigger, Oswald’s act cannot be considered a free act. Of course, it may be the case that the set of middle knowledge conditionals concerning Oswald are such that he could have refrained from pulling the trigger had God created a slightly different universe; but it is Oswald’s freedom in the actual universe that is at issue.
The problems of the mechanics of omniscience aside, the traditional theist might argue that the process view of God’s knowledge is problematic because it either limits God’s knowledge or it violates elementary principles of logic. The argument is apparently straightforward. Every proposition of the form, “p or not-p” is true because one or the other side of the disjunction is true. To use Aristotle’s example from De Interpretatione IX, either a sea battle will occur tomorrow or it will not. Let p represent “A sea battle will occur tomorrow” and not-p, “A sea battle will not occur tomorrow.” In that case, “A sea battle will occur tomorrow or a sea battle will not occur tomorrow” is a tautology and hence true. If God does not know which side of the disjunction is true then God’s knowledge is limited. If the disjunction itself is not true then some tautologies are false. Any theory that commits one to the falsity of some tautologies flaunts the fundamental principles of logic and thereby faces a steep burden of proof.
Aristotle apparently believed that, where future contingents are concerned, “p or not-p” is true but the two halves of the disjunction have indeterminate truth values. This idea seems logically counter-intuitive. If p and not-p are indeterminate, shouldn’t “p or not-p” also be indeterminate? For a brief period, Hartshorne defended the Aristotelian idea (Hartshorne 1939), but he discovered a more parsimonious solution (Hartshorne 2011c, 123). Instead of locating the indeterminacy of the future in truth values, he focused on predicates that reflect the extent to which the future is open for any given event. Either all causal conditions are such that the sea battle will occur, or no causal conditions are such that it will occur, or it is permitted by some but not all causal conditions (cf. Hartshorne 1970, 145). It “will” occur means that all the possibilities for tomorrow which are still left open involve the occurrence in question; while it “may” occur means that some of the open possibilities involve the occurrence; and it “will not” occur means that none of the possibilities involve it (Hartshorne 1941, 100).
Although Hartshorne rejected Aristotle’s view on future contingents, his solution to the problem that Aristotle tried to solve neatly parallels Aristotle’s square. “Z will occur” and “Z will not occur” are contraries—they may both be false but they cannot both be true. The contradictory of “Z will occur” is “Z may not occur”; similarly, the contradictory of “Z will not occur” is “Z may occur.” In A Christmas Carol, Scrooge presupposes this schema when he asks the Ghost of Christmas Yet to Come, “Are these the shadows of the things that Will be or the shadows of things that May be, only?” Of this example, Hartshorne said, “There is a master of language [i.e. Dickens]. Will and May are nicely distinguished in ordinary speech” (Hartshorne & Viney 2001, 39).
Hartshorne maintains that, “the semantic analysis of truth with reference to future events should not be so formulated as to make ‘will’ and ‘will not’ the sole possibilities” (Hartshorne 2011a, 83). Following Hartshorne’s suggestion, George Shields says that, “Z will occur” and “Z will not occur” should not be symbolized in the propositional calculus as p and not-p but as p and q, where “If p then not-q” and “If q then not-p.” The conjunction of these propositions, “If p then not-q and if q then not-p” mirrors the truth value semantics of contrariety, not contradiction, which is mirrored by “It is false that ‘p if and only if q,’” or exclusive disjunction. Shields argues that it is question begging to assume that “Z will or will not occur” must be an instance of “p or not-p”. The question at issue is the formalization of future tense statements; thus, it will not do to assume that verb tense makes no difference in the formalization (Shields & Viney 2004, 220).
8. Transforming Traditional Theism and Process Theism
Whitehead says that, “Philosophy never reverts to its old position after the shock of a great philosopher” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 11]). Whether or not Whitehead and Hartshorne are considered great philosophers, they seem to have occasioned a seismic shift in contemporary discussions of the philosophy of religion in which philosophers take the doctrine of real relations in God more seriously. For example, some Neo-Thomists have taken the criticisms of process theism to heart and admitted real relations in God, contrary to the teaching of the angelic doctor (Whitney 1985, 75–81). The Jesuit philosopher W. Norris Clarke advises Thomists to “simply drop” the doctrine of the lack of real relations in God and to adopt the view that, “[God’s] consciousness is contingently and qualitatively different because of what we do” (Clarke 1979, 92). At times, Clarke almost sounds like a Whiteheadian or a Hartshornean: “God is the supreme Receiver, gathering together in His consciousness all that creatures do and responding appropriately to it” (Ibid., 93). Another example of a group of theists influenced by process thinking, are those Evangelical Christian philosophers calling themselves “open theists” or “free will theists.” While careful to distance themselves from the more heretical dimensions of process metaphysics, they have stirred controversy in their communities of faith by defending aspects of process theism (Pinnock et al. 1994; Enxing 2013, ch. 5; Rice 2020).
The extent to which theists outside the process camp accept the elements of the doctrine of dual transcendence varies greatly. Neo-Thomists like Clarke and some other theists, like William Alston, accept real relations in God but retain the timelessness, immutability, and non-corporeality of God. Clarke and Alston also affirm creation ex nihilo. Alston, who was Hartshorne’s student at Chicago, refers to his view as a “via media” (a middle path) between Hartshorne and Aquinas (Cobb & Gamwell 1984, 78f). Hartshorne responded to both Clarke and Alston (Sia 1990, 269f; Cobb & Gamwell 1984, 98f). In both replies he emphasizes, among other things, what he takes to be arbitrary divisions among contingency, potentiality, and change in their theories. To admit real relations in God is to admit contingency in God. To admit this, but to retain the concept of the non-temporality of deity, requires belief in contingencies eternally fixed in the being of God. The ordinary sense of “W is contingent” is “W could have been otherwise,” which presupposes that the future was once open with respect to W. Since there is no future in eternity, to speak of contingency in eternity is to lose one’s anchor in ordinary language which is saturated with temporal reference. Likewise, the concept of an eternal “now” has lost all moorings with experience where the present is invariably nested between past and future. Hartshorne also maintains that there are forms of value—specifically, aesthetic values—that do not admit of a maximum. It may be no more meaningful to speak of greatest possible aesthetic value than it is to speak of a greatest positive integer (Hartshorne 1970, 38 and 310; cf. Whitehead 1929 [1978, 111]). If this is the case, and if the creatures contribute to the aesthetic value of the world, then there must be respects in which, as the aesthetic value of the world increases, God increases with it. We have already touched upon this aspect of process theism which Hartshorne refers to as God’s relative perfection (R-perfection).
Openness or free will theists are closer to process theism than the Neo-Thomists or than Alston. They concur with process theists that God cannot determine a creature’s decisions without depriving it of its freedom. They also accept the process view of the nature of time; thus, for God to be influenced by the creatures means that in some respects the future is yet to be determined and God knows it as such. This provides for a straightforward concept of God responding to the creatures and for an interpretive scheme for the dominant Scriptural motif that God is in dynamic interaction with people (in answering prayer, for example). On the other hand, it is this aspect of process theism which seems most disturbing to more traditionally minded Evangelicals, for the lack of knowledge of a detailed future compromises or at least complicates the doctrine of divine providence. How, they ask, can history be the working out of a divine plan if the future is uncertain for God (cf. Hall and Sanders, 2003). Open theists believe that they can mitigate this criticism by not following process theism in the denial of creation ex nihilo. Open theists like William Hasker and John Sanders can speak of God as “a risk-taker,” but they insist that God can still perform miracles and guarantee the ultimate triumph of good over evil (Pinnock, et al., 1994, 151; Sanders 1998).
To speak of open theism as a school of thought distinct from process theism is ironic since God’s openness to creaturely influence is precisely the shared content of their views. Hartshorne referred to “the openness of God” in 1963, more than thirty years before the openness controversy erupted (Hartshorne 1987, 92). In any event, these controversies began too late for Hartshorne to respond to them. It is noteworthy, however, that he was instrumental in bringing a little known forerunner of open theism, Jules Lequyer [or Lequier], to the attention of philosophers (Hartshorne & Reese 1953 [2000, 227–230]). Because of the dominance historically of classical theism, Hartshorne viewed free will or open theists more as allies than foes, although he was fully aware of his differences from them and was not without arguments against those aspects of their views with which he disagreed (Viney 1998, 214–230). A vigorous dialogue between process theists and free will theists is on-going (Cobb and Pinnock 2000; Ramal 2010, part II).
The most contentious issue is creation ex nihilo. Whitehead and Hartshorne share a commitment to the idea that God is the supreme creative power among many lesser creators. Hartshorne is adamant that nothing is gained by endowing God with the ability to create non-creative actualities or to refrain from creating altogether. Nevertheless, process theists are criticized for failing to consider the alternative that God, the sole origin of creative power, graciously shares that power with others. Lequyer speaks of “God, who created me creator of myself”—words that Hartshorne often quotes with approval (Lequier 1952, 70; Hartshorne 1970, xi). Lequyer’s view is similar to what Nelson Pike calls “over-power,” the power to “completely determine which, if any, powers are possessed by agents other than oneself” (Pike 1983, 19). Pike avers that over-power is precisely what most classical theists ascribe to deity. Process theists generally disagree (cf. Griffin 1991, 67–68). For example, Aquinas views God as having the ability to determine the free decisions of others, but this ability is not entailed by over-power, although Pike sometimes defines over-power in these terms (Pike 1982, 151). If God has over-power in the sense of being able to determine the extent to which others can make free decisions and execute them, it does not follow that God can also determine a creature’s free decisions. The latter claim is much stronger, and it is the one that process theists attribute to most classical theists.
The process God has what might be called a second cousin to over-power. As we have seen, in process theism, God is responsible for the laws of nature and these laws determine the limits of non-divine creativity. Whitehead and Hartshorne deny, however, that God could create actual entities devoid of creative activity. Moreover, developmental and evolutionary categories are central to their thinking. It is contrary to process philosophy to imagine God with the ability to create a fully grown man or woman who did not grow to adulthood from having been a child. One’s being actual is inseparable from one’s having become actual (Hartshorne 1941, 233–234). Hartshorne would say that this is also true of God’s actual states, though not of God’s existence. These qualifications notwithstanding, one philosopher working within the process tradition advocates revisions in process theism that would move it in the direction that the critics suggest. Rem Edwards speaks of divine self-limitation in creating the creatures. For Edwards, God could create a universe of uncreative beings but chooses not to. He thinks that God could “work an occasional miracle or two.” Edwards acknowledges that, from the standpoint of “orthodox” process thought, these ideas are “process heresy,” but he prefers revising process theism in these ways in order to avoid the charge, which he regards as legitimate, that there is a “divine power-deficit” in process theism that makes its outlook “religiously intolerable” (Edwards 2001, 256).
The claim that deity sharing its creative power is an instance of self-limitation can perhaps be clarified and placed more in the spirit of process theism by referring to it as divine self-augmentation. A self-imposed handicap is one that prevents one from achieving a goal or performing a task that one could accomplish without the limitation. As Inbody notes, any divine self-limitation can be “self-unlimited” (Inbody 1997, 149). For example, a governor on a truck can be designed to inhibit the velocity it could attain without the governor. In creating other creators, however, the deity imposes no limits on what it could achieve without them. To be sure, God could have unerring knowledge of a determinate future if the creatures had no freedom, but this would not be knowledge of a future with free creatures in it. To imagine a limitation in this case would require that God could know the future decisions of free creatures, but chooses instead to put on a blindfold, so to speak. On the other hand, the existence of non-divine creators opens opportunities for cooperative effort (and conflict) that would be impossible without them. One cannot use persuasion on completely unfree beings. Thus, in creating other creators, other beings with some degree of freedom, God would be perfecting the divine power and the uses to which it can be put.
Edwards also affirms a version of the doctrine of creation ex nihilo and believes that this is compatible with process theism. Inspired by developments in speculative cosmology among astrophysicists—which he insists is really metaphysics—Edwards asks whether our universe may not be one of many actual universes existing within an infinite Superspacetime. This super matrix of co-existing but independent universes could be interpreted by process theism as the divine body, much as Hartshorne views our universe as God’s body. Edwards maintains that these ideas allow for a concept of creation ex nihilo. Within the divine Superspacetime, God can create universes from no pre-existing material. Thus, it is not necessary to conceive our own universe as created from the dying embers of a previous cosmic epoch. The initial singularity of our universe could represent an absolute beginning. This does not mean that one must jettison the claims of process theism that God is necessarily social, embodied, and creative. In Edwards’ words:
Within infinite Divine Superspacetime, God could be infinitely loving, social, embodied, and creative without being tied to a single temporal strand of spatially finite antecedent-and-successive universes. Within infinite Superspace and throughout infinite Supertime, God could create many co-existing universes out of nothing …. (Edwards 2001, 262)
Edwards notes that his suggestions are not as far removed from the metaphysics of Whitehead and Hartshorne as one might suppose. Whitehead speaks of cosmic epochs and Hartshorne argues that this involves a time beyond what is available to physics that connects various cosmic epochs (Hartshorne 1970, 53–54). Edwards views himself as amending Hartshorne’s idea to include super space as well as super time.
Edwards’ treatment of creation ex nihilo retains the essential meaning of the idea—creation from no pre-existing material—but it also suggests both less and more than the concept as it was expressed in classical theism. It suggests less in the sense that God’s creative act in traditional theism takes place in eternity. Superspacetime differs from the Boethian idea of eternity in at least this much: it is complex whereas eternity has no parts. Edwards also wishes to avoid the deterministic connotations of the traditional idea of creation. To create another creator is not to create that creator’s decisions; this is one reason Aquinas denies that God creates other creators, for he regards God as creating, with us, the decisions we make in such a way that God’s activity is a sufficient explanation of our decisions (although he denies, contrary to the charge of process theism, that this deprives us of our freedom). Finally, Edwards imports more into the idea of creation ex nihilo than was traditionally in the doctrine. As we noted in the opening section, the idea that the universe had a first temporal moment is not to be identified with creation ex nihilo since, according to traditional theism, God could have created a temporally infinite universe ex nihilo.
Edwards’ revisions of process theism are made largely, though not exclusively, in light of criticisms from those who do not share his commitment to process metaphysics. Lewis Ford revises process theism in a very different direction, mostly in response to difficulties within process metaphysics that he finds insurmountable. We have already seen that in Whitehead’s metaphysics, the way that one actual entity influences another is by means of prehensions. According to Ford, an additional mode of influence must be posited, for one must account for an actual entity’s ability to prehend. This ability to prehend is precisely its portion of creativity. Ford remains within the parameters of process metaphysics by denying that the entity’s allotment of creativity has its source outside of time in an eternal being. This leaves only three possible sources for the entity’s creativity, the past, the present, or the future. Ford maintains that past actual entities, because they are past, are devoid of any inner creativity—thus, they cannot be the source of an actual entity’s creativity. Nor can creativity simply “well up” from within the present. It is precisely an actual occasion’s present creativity that needs explanation, and it cannot pull itself up by its own bootstraps, so to speak. Ford argues, by elimination, that a future creativity must be the source of an occasion’s ability to prehend.
In process metaphysics, the future is infinite, indeterminate, and its possibilities for actualization are inexhaustible. Ford identifies God with the future so conceived, but with one important departure from standard accounts in process thought. According to Ford, God is the activity of the future. This is contrary to the views of Whitehead and Hartshorne for whom the future is the arena of possibility awaiting decision. Creative activity is confined to the present actual entity (called its concrescence) and to its effects on subsequent actual entities (called transitional creativity) (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 211]). In Ford’s view, however, the future is a soundless depth of creativity that endlessly “pluralizes itself into the many finite regions of the present” (Ford 2000, 248). This is a process whereby divine future activity is “infused” into the present actual occasion (Ibid., 253). In Ford’s view, present activity makes the past in the sense that what is done today adds to what will be the accomplished past of tomorrow. The present is not made by the past but by the divine activity of the future.
Because the divine is indeterminate, it cannot be an object of an actual entity’s prehensions. This is dangerously close to saying that God cannot be known, except that Ford understands God to fill a definite role in his metaphysics, to wit, the infusion of creativity into the present, providing for an immediacy of the divine presence in all actualities. Ford also recognizes the difficulty that his view poses for God’s knowledge of the past, and hence for divine omniscience. The physical prehensions of actual occasions are not only the means whereby the present takes account of the past, but they are also the means whereby the past persists into the present. As Hartshorne notes, Whitehead’s concept of prehension brings efficient causation and perception under a single category (Hartshorne 1984b, chapter 9). If the past were to persist into the future so as to impart knowledge to God, it would co-opt the present’s function of preserving the past. In order to avoid the idea that God is ignorant of the past, Ford posits a kind of knowledge of the past that abstracts from efficient causation. In the interstices separating the death of the past moment and the birth of the present moment, “God immediately perceives the recently emergent past and retains that memory forever” (Ford 2000, 284). Since divine memory, on Ford’s account, abstracts from efficient causal relations, it is clear that it records sequences and correlations of events; it is a fair question whether it also contains information about causal chains.
Ford recognizes that his revisions of process theism will strike some thinkers as contrary to the metaphysics that first inspired it. He correctly observes, “The notion of an active future may be regarded as oxymoronic, even as bizarre, but it is certainly unique” (Ford 2000, 316). It is indeed unique; it bears a resemblance to the Thomistic doctrine of participated being, albeit tailored to the categories of process philosophy, as modified in various ways by Ford. In Thomism, the creatures can exist only by participating in and channeling the infinite creativity of God. In Ford’s revised process theism, non-divine actual entities can exist only by borrowing the influx of future divine activity into the present. The parallel with Thomism breaks down insofar as Ford denies that God’s activity explains what the actual entities do with their portion of creativity. Ford can affirm the freedom of the creatures vis-a-vis God’s activity since deity does not function as a deterministic efficient cause as it does in Thomism and other forms of traditional theism. In Whitehead’s and Hartshorne’s theism, there is an efficient causal dimension to God’s creativity, but it is not deterministic. We have already noted that the process God’s fixing of the laws of nature is a form of efficient causation, but Whitehead and Hartshorne agree with most current scientific thinking that those laws are stochastic.
9. Arguments for the Existence of God in Process Theism
Our task has been to explain the concept of process theism, not to argue that the God of process theism exists. Nevertheless, a few words are in order about the approaches that process theists take to justifying belief in the existence of God. We noted in opening that process theism does not privilege claims to special insight or revealed truth (cf. Keller 2007, chapter 6). This is not to say that some theologians have not found process thought congenial to their interests (e.g., Ogden 1963; Cobb 1965; Griffin 1973). Whitehead and Hartshorne did not view themselves as apologists for a particular faith, but neither did they simply dismiss religious experiences as uninformative. Whitehead warns against narrowness in the selection of evidence. He says, “Philosophy may not neglect the multifariousness of the world—the fairies dance, and Christ is nailed to the cross” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 338]). They add, however, that the claims that religious people make, individually (as in the case of mystics) or collectively (as in the case of religious organizations), are subject to human fallibility. There may be a God who is infallible but human beings are not, and every putative revelation is sifted through an imperfect human filter (Hartshorne 1984a, 41). As far as justifying religious belief is concerned, Whitehead and Hartshorne try to navigate between appeals to blind faith and knock-down proof. In metaphysics, says Whitehead, “The proper test is not that of finality, but of progress” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 14]).
If process theism is not based on revelation, neither is it based on naïve appeals to science, including the social sciences. It is no more characteristic of process thought to give a “scientific” argument for the existence of God than to give a reductionistic account of religious belief by means of a theory in sociology, psychology, or more broadly, what F. LeRon Shults calls “the biocultural study of religion” (Shults 2018). As far as Whitehead and Hartshorne are concerned, the working assumptions of the sciences are no more or less open to question and clarification than the working assumptions of religion. Process thought teaches a modest skepticism about the competencies of science that is arguably in the spirit of science itself. Indeed, the theory of actual entities and their prehensions is Whitehead’s alternative to the metaphysical worldview that developed as a result of the dramatic successes of early modern science—Whitehead calls it “scientific materialism.” The theory of actual entities is a response to the idea that the “stuff” of which the world is made is devoid of mind-like qualities—Whitehead refers to this as “vacuous actuality.” The theory of prehensions is a response to the idea that bits of matter can exist at definite places and times without any essential reference to other places and times—Whitehead refers to this as “simple location.” The fact is that Whitehead wrote relatively little about God and a great deal about how his philosophy of organism resolves problems of metaphysics and epistemology inherited from a prior age.
Process theism is not based on religious doctrine or theology and it is not a scientific theory; it is a product of metaphysics, or what Whitehead calls “speculative philosophy.” It is, however, metaphysics “in a new key,” to borrow a phrase from Susanne Langer. Whitehead says that, “Speculative philosophy is the endeavour to frame a coherent, logical, necessary system of general ideas in terms of which every element of our experience can be interpreted” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 3]). Metaphysics, so defined, is an audacious enterprise, for experience is open-ended and every claim to knowledge is perspectival and conditioned. If metaphysicians strive for a comprehensive vision of things, they must continually remind themselves that there is no standpoint within the world from which to speak confidently for eternity. Whitehead and Hartshorne reject the idea that metaphysics proceeds best by deducing theorems from self-evident axioms. To be sure, inferences must be made from the categories of one’s metaphysics, but it is the categories themselves that are continually on trial. The court in which metaphysical proposals are judged is the community of philosophers, stretching through history and into the future. Whitehead and Hartshorne, heavily influenced by Plato, practice philosophy as a dialogue with great minds, past and present. Hartshorne, taking a page from Karl Popper, says that, “Objectivity is not in the individual thinker but in the process of mutual correction and inspiration” (Hartshorne 1962, ix).
When it comes to the “God question” Whitehead says that he is not offering proofs. “There is merely the confrontation of the theoretic system with a certain rendering of the facts” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 343]). Having established to his satisfaction an alternative to scientific materialism—that is, the philosophy of organism—he asks whether that philosophy’s categories require reference to God. Ford suggests that Whitehead was surprised to find that they do, for he began his reflections on the philosophy of nature as an agnostic (Ford 1977, 27). In keeping with his sensitivity to the history of philosophy, Whitehead characterizes his discussion as adding another speaker to David Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. If Whitehead has an “argument” for the existence of God it is implicit in the dual attempt (1) to show the reasonableness of process metaphysics and (2) to show the conceptual necessity of God for its overall coherence. Rudolf Carnap says that it is one thing to ask what one’s metaphysics commit one to and it is something else to ask what commits one to one’s metaphysics. Whitehead asks both questions.
Ford rightly says that, in Whitehead’s writings, the problem and nature of God is nowhere explored for its own sake (Ford 1970, 393). Moreover, during the period when he was introducing the concept of God into his metaphysics, beginning in 1925, the very concept of God was in flux. For these reasons, there is an inherent flexibility in reconstructing arguments for God’s existence from Whitehead’s work, and this is reflected in the critical literature. Hartshorne identified six arguments implicit in Whitehead’s metaphysics (Hartshorne 1972, 78–88), but others find fewer (Sherburne 1971) or more (Griffin 2001a, chapter 5). Ford attempted to derive the existence of God analytically, as a theorem from the set of axioms in Whitehead’s categoreal scheme in Process and Reality; his much abbreviated version of Whitehead’s reasoning is this: “Actual entities either belong to God or to the World. Given the World, God must exist. Given God, the World must exist. Since one or the other must exist, both must” (Ford 1970, 393). Interestingly, the God to which Ford’s reconstructed argument concludes is a single non-temporal actual entity, and no mention is made of developments in Whitehead’s idea of God after Process and Reality.
More traditional forms of reasoning can also be found in Whitehead. There cannot, to be sure, be a cosmological argument in the classical sense for Whitehead rejects the traditional idea of divine creativity, but he does see a need to explain the initial phase of each actual entity. In Whitehead’s view, God customizes the general potentiality of the universe for each emergent occasion, providing it with its initial aim. The graded relevance of these potentialities answers to our sense that there are objectively better and worse options. A related problem is how the activities of the many actualities that make up the cosmos happen to obey a common set of natural laws. Order implies an ordering power; however, all localized order presupposes cosmic order; thus, order on a cosmic scale requires a cosmic ordering power. The best candidate for the cosmic ordering power is God, according to Whitehead (Whitehead 1926 [1997, 104])—this is a type of design argument. Another consideration is that the realm of possibility in terms of which cosmic order is conceived is akin to Plato’s Forms. In Whitehead’s system, these “eternal objects” require an ontological ground. The primordial nature of God serves this function (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 46]). Finally, the consequent nature of God is the explanation of the fixity of accomplished fact and achieved value. “The truth itself is nothing else than how the composite natures of the organic actualities of the world obtain adequate representation in the divine nature” (Whitehead 1929 [1978, 12]). This sketch of Whitehead’s reasoning may suggest that his “arguments” lose their force when abstracted from his metaphysics. Bowman L. Clarke, however, produced a formal theistic argument along Whiteheadian lines using the linguistic framework developed by Nelson Goodman (Clarke 1966, 162–164). In a different vein, Franklin Gamwell argues that the moral law must be grounded in the divine good, where the divine good is most parsimoniously conceived in neoclassical terms (Gamwell 1990). Another process thinker, Derek Malone-France, argues that the promise of Kant’s transcendental philosophy is best fulfilled in a Whiteheadian inspired theistic metaphysics (Malone-France 2007). Thus, arguing for the existence of Whitehead’s God, or something like Whitehead’s God, need not be inextricably tied to evaluating Whitehead’s metaphysics.
The debate among Whiteheadians over the existence of God is complicated by the fact that Whitehead’s views rapidly evolved from the time he began teaching at Harvard in 1924. His view of God is less a completed philosophical theism than a work in progress that was left to others to try to complete, and many have tried. It is worthy of note, however, that an influential group of scholars maintain that Whitehead was not true to his finer insights when he included God in his metaphysical system. Donald Sherburne wrote a pivotal article in 1967, revised in 1971, titled “Whitehead without God.” Sherburne holds that God can be “exorcised” from Whitehead’s metaphysics by showing that the existence of God is inconsistent with its categories and by demonstrating that all of the functions ascribed to deity in the system can be met in other ways. Donald Crosby and Frederick Ferré (1933–2013), also within the process fold, hold similar views. Ferré considers theism “optional” in the sense that the premises of theistic arguments are subject to competing and equally rational value commitments (Ferré 2001, 177f). One of the most careful and persistent critics of process theism is Robert Neville (Neville 1980). Neville does not argue for “Whitehead without God” so much as “Whitehead without Whitehead’s God.” He believes that Whitehead’s critique of scientific materialism and his philosophy of organism are basically correct, but that the ultimate explanation of the universe is in a deity that wholly transcends it and creates it ex nihilo (Neville 1968). Griffin forcefully criticized Neville’s views (Griffin 2007, 186–214) and Neville gave a spirited response (Neville 2008).
Hartshorne was more in the mainstream of philosophical discussions about God than was Whitehead. He spoke of proofs for God’s existence and defended them vigorously, although he ceased calling them “proofs” when he realized the differences between his approach and more traditional ones. Hartshorne is best known for his voluminous writings on the ontological argument—he devotes two books and numerous articles to the topic (Hartshorne 1962 & 1965a). Despite his fondness for his revised ontological argument, he never considered it sufficient unto itself to make the case for God’s existence. The ontological argument is one strand of a multiple argument strategy—which Basil Mitchell calls a “cumulative case”—in which the various elements are mutually reinforcing.
All of the arguments are phases of one ‘global’ argument, that the properly formulated theistically religious view of life and reality is the most intelligible, self-consistent, and satisfactory one that can be conceived. (Hartshorne 1970, 276)
Hartshorne’s versions of the cosmological, teleological (or design), moral, epistemic, and aesthetic arguments complete the set that make up the global argument (Viney 1985).
In Hartshorne’s view, the importance of the ontological argument is to establish that God could not exist contingently. He calls this “Anselm’s principle.” If Anselm’s principle is correct then if it is possible for God to exist, then God necessarily exists. In Hartshorne’s view, Anselm failed to make a convincing case for God’s existence because he failed to show that his concept of God is coherently conceivable. Indeed, Hartshorne believes that matters are much worse for Anselm since he considers Anselm’s form of theism to be incoherent, as we have seen. Hartshorne believes that the other arguments in his own global argument make the case for God’s possible existence. Contingent beings require a divine necessary being (cosmological); cosmic order implies a divine cosmic ordering power (design); reality should be construed as the actual content of divine knowledge (epistemic); the supreme aim in life is to contribute to the divine life (moral); and there is a beauty of the world as a whole that only God can enjoy (aesthetic). The structure of Hartshorne’s argument is reminiscent of the elaborate case made by John Duns Scotus in De Primo Principio. Of course, the God whose existence Hartshorne seeks to establish is one that “the subtle doctor” would find unacceptable.
Hartshorne presents each of the sub-arguments within his cumulative case as a list of options from an exhaustive set, with his neoclassical theistic option rounding out the set. The reason for presenting his arguments as lists of options rather than as a series of disjunctive syllogisms is to avoid the pretense of offering strict demonstrations. The conclusion of any valid deductive argument can be rejected provided one is willing to reject one or more of the premises. In this sense, a valid argument provides one with options for belief rather than a proof of its conclusion. Hartshorne denies that one can coerce belief in God with arguments. Moreover, he acknowledges that his own choice for neoclassical theism is not without its difficulties. He maintains, therefore, that one should employ the “principle of least paradox” in assessing the options. Since no metaphysical position is without its problems, it will not do to argue for one’s own view by finding the problems in the views of others. “One must decide which paradoxes are the really fatal ones, in comparison with those of contending positions” (Hartshorne 1970, 88).
Hartshorne presents his theistic arguments as a priori, not in the sense that they are conclusive demonstrations, but in the sense that they aim at a conclusion about what is true in all possible states of affairs. In this he is true to Whitehead’s metaphysical project of finding categories that are universal and necessary. He insists that none of the conclusions of his arguments are empirical. A proposition is empirical, in Popper’s sense, if it is falsifiable by some conceivable experience. If Anselm’s principle is correct then either God exists without the possibility of not existing or God’s existence is impossible. Thus, if God exists, then no conceivable experience could falsify the statement that God exists. For this reason, Hartshorne finds all empirical arguments—and hence, all scientifically based arguments—for God’s existence to be fatally flawed since they must conclude to that which is not God, that is, to that which exists contingently. Hartshorne also points out that none of his arguments tell us anything concrete about God. True to his distinction between existence and actuality, Hartshorne maintains that the arguments concern that which is most abstract about deity, its existence and character. This is why Hartshorne claimed to know so very little about God, even though he wrote so many volumes on the subject (Hartshorne & Viney 2001, 46).
After his ninetieth birthday, Hartshorne emphasized a somewhat different approach in arguing for God’s existence that incorporates his ideas about dual transcendence (Hartshorne 1993; Hartshorne 2011b). He notes that from a purely formal point of view, any pair of metaphysical contraries may apply to God or to the world. For example, either God is in different respects necessary and contingent (NC), wholly necessary (N), wholly contingent (C), or neither necessary nor contingent (O). The same is true of the world: necessary and contingent (nc), wholly necessary (n), wholly contingent (c), or neither necessary nor contingent (o). This yields sixteen formal options which Hartshorne arranges in a four by four matrix. Historically significant forms of theism can be found on the matrix—classical theism, for example, is N.c and free will theism is NC.c. Only one of the sixteen options can be true, so Hartshorne develops criteria for judging the various possibilities. For example, if the contrast itself should be preserved, then options like N.n, C.c, and O.o are unacceptable. Of course, Hartshorne’s conclusion is that NC.nc is the true option. Arguably, the value of these matrices is as much in mapping concepts of God and the world as it is in arguing for a particular option, for they allow a more detailed idea of the views that contradict one’s own. Hartshorne maintains that one reason classical theism remained unchallenged for so long was because philosophers had not considered all of the options (Hartshorne 1997, ch. 5). If any two matrices are combined, the number of formal options jumps to 256. If we generalize for any number of pairs n, then the number of concepts of God and the world is 16n.
We have already mentioned others within the process tradition who have made the case for process theism: Clarke, Gamwell, and Malone-France. Schubert Ogden (1963) and David Ray Griffin (2001a and 2016) should be added to the list. Griffin explicitly employs a cumulative case involving eight strands; his argument is indebted to both Whitehead and Hartshorne but includes his own distinctive contributions. Having found the alternatives to process theism unsatisfactory, Griffin maintains that “process philosophy’s naturalistic theism is overwhelmingly more probable than the truth of atheism” (2001a, 203). Also of note is that Griffin is one of the few process philosophers to have addressed the arguments in the literature of the new atheism (although, see Viney and Shields 2020, chapter 6).
With Hartshorne, as with Whitehead, what is at stake in theistic arguments is less a matter of the soundness of a particular piece of reasoning than the assessment of an entire metaphysical system. Thus, the sketch given here does not begin to do justice to their arguments. Nevertheless, the development and defense of a concept of God that is fully engaged in temporal processes is perhaps the central pillar and the lasting achievement of their reasoning. After all, one of the selling points of process theism over its rivals has been not only its theoretical superiority in dealing with theological puzzles but its adequacy to everyday religious sensibilities. Process theists argue that the deity of traditional theism is at once too active and too static. It is too active in the sense that its control of the universe is absolute, leaving nothing for the creatures to do except to unwittingly speak the lines and play the parts decided for them in eternity. It is too static in the sense that it lacks potentiality to change, to participate in the evolving universe it created, and to be affected by the triumphs and tragedies of its creatures. In short, it is a God who acts but is never acted upon and can therefore never interact. This is summed up in the non-biblical Aristotelian formula of God as the unmoved mover. Fritz Rothschild describes the God of Rabbi Abraham Heschel—a God who feels and is felt by the creatures—as “the Most Moved Mover” (Heschel 1959, 24). Hartshorne, who greatly admired Heschel, amends this formula in an attempt to distill the essence of process theism, “God is the most and best moved mover” (Hartshorne 1997, 6, 39).
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- European Society for Process Thought, Institute of Philosophy at the Katholieke Universiteit, Leuven.
- Society for the Study of Process Philosophies, a satellite organization of the American Philosophical Association.
- A New World View, by Charles Hartshorne, edited by Herbert F. Vetter.