Notes to Properties

1. On viewing Plato’s forms as universals, cf. Harte (2008). As Harte makes it clear, this interpretation is common, but not unanimous. For a recent challenge to it, see Marmodoro (forthcoming), according to whom, it is Aristotle who “‘discovers’ universals”. The universal/particular distinction, which we are taking for granted here, though typical and widespread, is not uncontroversial; MacBride (2018) questions it, on the basis of a reconstruction of its manifestations in early analytic philosophy.

2. As is well-known, Quine (1948) rejects quantification over predicates and this is why he views predicates as devoid of ontological commitment. Castañeda (1976: §3) argues against this.

3. In its more radical versions nominalism involves a sweeping rejection of abstract entities, including predicates understood as types rather than tokens, and sets. Predicate nominalists usually view singular terms for properties with suspicion. For, following Quine, they take singular terms to carry an ontological commitment that predicates lack. Moreover, they must somehow capture the similarity in the classifying jobs made by predicates of different languages such as the English “red” and the French “rouge”. Finally, if they take predicates to be types, then the predicates are abstract and can even be conceived of as properties (see §4.2). To confront such issues, nominalists typically appeal to quotation devices and paraphrases. A locus classicus of this strategy is Sellars 1963, which many nominalists still find compelling. Many problems for approaches of this sort have been pointed out (Castañeda 1976; Armstrong 1978a: ch. 2; Bealer & Mönnich 1989: §7; Loux 1998: ch. 2; Szabó 2003). Alternatively, in so-called Class nominalism, properties are proxied by predicate extensions. There are severe problems here as well (Armstrong 1978a: ch. 4): most notoriously the fact that co-extensive predicates cannot be appropriately discriminated (see §3.1; Lewis’ conception of properties as sets of possibilia discussed therein may be viewed as a sort of class nominalism). Perhaps, the most radical version is Ostrich nominalism (Armstrong 1978a: 16; Devitt 1980; Armstrong 1980). This sees a brute fact where the realist finds an explanandum requiring mind-independent universals. For a detailed taxonomy of nominalist positions, see Allen 2016: ch. 4, and Koons & Pickavance 2017: ch. 8. Recently, Schulte (2019) has proposed “grounding nominalism”, which takes properties, possibly understood as universals, to be non-fundamental. Still, their existence is granted, and this concession makes it dubious that this is really nominalism. For sustained criticisms of conceptualism, see Armstrong 1978a: ch.3, and Bealer & Mönnich 1989: §8.

4. Leibniz is usually viewed as a philosopher who stands out for his attempts to effectively show how relations can be reduced to monadic properties (Mugnai 1992; in contrast, Orilia 2000a defends the claim that Leibniz acknowledged the existence of irreducibly relational facts). Some have remained attached to the old idea that there are no external relations (e.g., Fisk 1972), but this position remains largely minoritarian nowadays. The view that there are relations but no monadic properties, or at least that the former have ontological priority over the latter, has also been considered. It is defended in different forms by Dipert (1997) and by various authors in the context of ontic structural realism (see, e.g., French & Ladyman 2003; Esfeld 2003; entry on structural realism, §4). This view is also far from having gained some consensus (Ainsworth 2010; Sider 2020: §3.4). In sum, most philosophers would agree that there are both genuine monadic properties and genuine relations (for recent dissenting voices see, however, Marmodoro & Yates 2016).

5. Benovsky (2014) argues that choosing between universalism and tropism may be an insurmountable problem.

6. The disagreement between the universalist and the tropist is operative at a very basic ontological level. One may wonder however whether divergences at this foundational layer have some impact on more specific philosophical issues and indeed it has been claimed that this is the case in philosophy of mind, in particular as regards mental causation and the tenability of reductive physicalism (Robb 1997; entry on mental causation, §6.5; Gozzano & Orilia 2008).

7. “Property” is being used here as elsewhere in this entry in a most generic sense, possibly not in line with Lowe’s more restricted usage of it. In general, in Lowe’s account, kinds and attributes are instantiated by objects and modes, respectively; kinds and objects are characterized by attributes and modes, respectively; attributes are exemplified by objects, whether dispositionally or occurrently. Exemplification is dispositional to the extent that the exemplifying objects instantiate kinds characterized by the attributes in question, while it is occurrent when the exemplifying objects are characterized by modes that instantiate the attributes in question.

8. There is an analogous tropist bundle theory in which the elements of the bundles are tropes rather than universals (see entry on tropes, §3.2).

9. Going very much beyond what Armstrong explicitly say, we can perhaps take the elements of these collections to be tropes, so that the first collection is a class of perfectly resembling tropes (playing the role of a universal); and the second collection is a class of compresent tropes as in the tropist bundle theory of objects.

10. Contrary to what Allen (2016: §2.4.1) emphasizes, the main problem here is not so much that the state of affairs in question would have an infinite complexity, as it would have an infinite number of exemplification relations as constituents. As Allen notes, this could be swallowed, after granting Cantorian actual infinity. The problem is rather that no relation ends up occurring as attributed in this state of affairs (recall the distinction of §1.3 and §1.4 between occurring as argument and occurring as attributed).

11. Lowe vacillates between taking these formal relations to be internal and declaring them non-existent (Lowe 2006: 111, 167). Perhaps, they are considered non-existent precisely because internal, but separating internality from non-existence may be a better choice, since after all formal relations are in Lowe’s ontological inventory. Moreover, it is really their internality, rather than lack of existence, that is appealed to in his attempt to avoid Bradley’s regress, as we shall now see.

12. See, e.g., Peacock 2012 for an approach resorting to Russell’s notion of a relating relation, as opposed to a relation that is not doing its relating work; Tegtmeier 2013, for a view according to which a fact itself grounds its unity; Schneider 2013 for an appeal to “unrepeatable nexuses” in the context of an Aristotelian framework in the spirit of the one defended in Lowe 2006; Meinertsen 2018 for a view of exemplification as relating itself to its relata.

13. Quine (1957 [1969: 21]) contrasts the “murky intensionality of attributes” to the “limpid extensionality of classes” and speaks of all intensional entities as “creatures of darkness” (1956 [1976: 186]).

14. Here, however, one could more generally invoke causal roles rather than causative ones and claim that epiphenomenal properties are at least caused by certain other properties.

15. Formal systems of property theory are often provided with an algebraic semantics that associates primitive predicative terms of the language with “basic” properties and the lambda abstracts with complex properties obtained from the basic ones by means of operations that generate new properties from given ones (Bealer 1973; 1982; McMichael and Zalta 1981; Leeds 1978; Menzel 1986; Swoyer 1998; Zalta 1983). Thus, for example, one assumes that there is an operation, \(\amp\), that maps each pair of properties, \(\bP\) and \(\bQ\), to the conjunctive property \(\bP \amp \bQ\). If “\(P\)” and “\(Q\)” stand for \(\bP\) and \(\bQ\), respectively, then “[\(\lambda x(P(x) \amp Q(x))\)]” will stand for \(\bP \amp \bQ\). For another example, it is typically assumed that there is an operation, \(\PLUG_1\), that, given a two-place relation \(\bR\) and an object \(\bd\), generates the monadic property \(\PLUG_1(\bR, \bd)\). If “\(R\)” and “\(d\)” denote \(\bR\) and \(\bd\), respectively, then the property \(\PLUG_1(\bR, \bd)\) will be denoted by the lambda term “[\(\lambda x R(d, x)\)]”. The property in question is the one that something has when \(d\) bears the relation \(R\) to it.

Copyright © 2020 by
Francesco Orilia <>
Michele Paolini Paoletti <>

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