Many authors use the term ‘psychologism’ for what they perceive as the mistake of identifying non-psychological with psychological entities. For instance, philosophers who think that logical laws are not psychological laws would view it as psychologism to identify the two. Other authors use the term in a neutral descriptive or even in a positive sense. ‘Psychologism’ then refers (approvingly) to positions that apply psychological techniques to traditional philosophical problems (e.g. Ellis 1979, 1990).
‘Psychologism’ entered the English language as a translation of the German word ‘Psychologismus’, a term coined by the Hegelian Johann Eduard Erdmann in 1870 to critically characterize the philosophical position of Eduard Beneke (Erdmann 1870).
Although the term continues to be used today, criticisms and defenses of psychologism have mostly been absorbed into wider debates over the pros and cons of philosophical naturalism. Therefore this entry focuses on a time when, and a place where, psychologism was still a much-debated distinct issue.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Mill’s Psychologism
- 3. Examples of Psychologistic Reasoning
- 4. Frege’s Antipsychologistic Arguments
- 5. Husserl’s Antipsychologistic Arguments
- 6. Early Criticism of Husserl’s Arguments
- 7. Recent Re-evaluations
- 8. The Continuation of the Story
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The relationship between logic and psychology was fought over most intensely in the German-speaking lands between 1890 and 1914. Indeed, during this period pretty much all of German-speaking philosophy was engulfed in the so-called Psychologismus-Streit (the ‘psychologism dispute’). This dispute centered on the question whether logic (and epistemology) are parts of psychology. Gottlob Frege and Edmund Husserl are the best-known figures of this controversy. The fact that the psychologism dispute has become closely associated with German-speaking philosophy must not, however, blind us to the enormous influence of John Stuart Mill upon both sides of the controversy. Paradoxically, Mill’s Logic of 1843 was not only a key inspiration behind much German-speaking psychologistic philosophy, it also contained some crucially important anti-psychologistic ideas.
In what follows, I shall begin with a short summary of Mill’s contribution. Subsequently, and turning to the German scene, I shall briefly sketch what authors accused of psychologism said on the relationship between logic and psychology, before outlining Frege’s and Husserl’s arguments against them. I shall conclude by presenting a number of objections to Frege’s and Husserl’s anti-psychologism. Some of these objections come from Frege’s and Husserl’s contemporaries, others are of more recent origin.
(Important papers on the emergence of psychologism in nineteenth-century German philosophy are George 1997, Peckhaus 2006 and Stelzner 2005. The most important monograph is Beiser 2014. Gray 2008 contains many important observations on early psychologistic tendencies in mathematics and logic.)
2. Mill’s Psychologism
Critics and interpreters of Mill’s philosophy of logic have been unable to reach a verdict on the question whether Mill was a psychologistic thinker. Recent work by David Godden (2005) provides a detailed explanation for this lack of agreement: Mill’s position on the relationship between (deductive) logic and psychology is “fractured”. Some elements in Mill’s thought push him towards a strongly psychologistic viewpoint, other elements pull him away from it. In other words, sometimes Mill insists that logic depends on psychology, sometimes he denies such dependence. (This section is based on Godden’s important re-assessment.)
As Mill declares as the beginning of his System of Logic, logic has two parts: the ‘science of reasoning, as well as an art, founded on that science’ (1843, 4). The art of reasoning is prescriptive; it provides us with the rules according to which we ought to reason. The science of reasoning is a descriptive-explanatory psychological discipline and analyses mental processes. The overall goal of logic is ‘the guidance of one’s own thoughts’ (1843, 6). The crucial question here is of course how the dependence of the art of reasoning upon the psychological science is to be understood. The mere fact that the art is prescriptive does not yet make it independent of psychology.
At this point it is important to note that Mill’s science of reasoning really is, in both subject matter and methodology, a psychological discipline. Although the subject matter of the science of reasoning is more specific than that of psychology in general — the former investigates ‘the operations of the human understanding in the pursuit of truth’ (1843, 6) — there are, as Mill sees it, no special psychological laws characteristic exclusively of the domain of the science of reasoning. Instead, ‘the general laws of association prevail among these more intricate states of mind’ (1843, 856). Moreover, in both the general and the more specific domain, the discovery of laws is due to ‘the ordinary methods of experimental inquiry’ (1843, 853).
Mill offers at least three different accounts of the contribution which the psychological science of reasoning makes to the art of reasoning. On the first account, the prescriptive art of reasoning seems prima facie independent of psychological science. In this vein Mill writes, for example, that psychology can only offer ‘the analysis of the mental process which takes place whenever we reason’, whereas the art of reasoning must provide ‘the rules … for conducting the [reasoning] process correctly’ (1843, 4). A second account is based on the idea that any successful prescription for a given type of thought process must be based on a proper and detailed psychological understanding of that process: ‘A right understanding of the mental process itself … is the only basis on which a system of rules, fitted for the direction of the process, can possibly be founded’ (ibid.). And Mill’s third account goes further still: ‘Its [the Science of Logic’s] theoretic grounds are wholly borrowed from Psychology, and include as much of that science as is required to justify the rules of the art’ (1865, 359). On the third account, psychology is essential to the justification of the rules of reasoning. Mill provides no clear indications on how these prima facie conflicting statements can be reconciled. Clearly the third statement will qualifies as psychologistic by everybody’s criteria — though doubts have been raised whether, ‘when this passage is read in its full dialectical context’, it amounts to more than the claim that ‘the logician must formulate rules of inquiry in a manner which will be as helpful as possible to inquirers, and must draw on the psychology of thought to do so’ (Skorupski 1989, 166). But even the first two accounts, interpreted against the backdrop of Mill’s other views, make prescriptive logic dependent upon psychology. Logic cannot begin its task until psychology has provided a descriptive analysis of reasoning processes.
We encounter a similar mixture of psychologistic and anti-psychologistic motifs also as we turn to Mill’s views on how the logician ought to justify logical precepts and principles. For Mill, we specify the rules of deductive inference by identifying the valid forms of the syllogism (1843, 168). And validity is explained by the formula ‘if the premises are true, the conclusion must inevitably be so’ (1843, 166). ‘Good inferences’ have an connection to truth: ‘A reasoning, to be rightly framed, must conduct to a true conclusion’ (1865, 365). And hence
… at bottom the only important quality of a thought being its truth, the laws or precepts provided for the guidance of thought must surely have for their principal purpose that the products of thinking shall be true (1865, 365).
A ‘good’ inference is thus a ‘true inference’, an inference ‘grounded in the reality of things’ (1843, 10–11).
In line with this consideration, Mill distinguishes between act, content and object of a judgement. The content of a judgement accounts for its representational connection to the external world. And the truth of a judgement depends on its object, that is, the state of affairs represented by the content. Thus when it comes to identifying valid inferences, logic must focus on objects (1843, 87). Mill’s theory of judgements and their truth involves a rejection of ‘conceptualism’, the view that the objects of judgements are mental, and that ‘a proposition is the expression of a relation between two ideas’ (1843, 109). Against this view Mill insists that ‘propositions … are not assertions respecting our ideas of things, but assertions respecting the things themselves’ (1843, 88).
It is easy to understand why some authors have taken such statements as evidence that Mill was defending an anti-psychologistic position of sorts. And yet, we must remember that these statements directly contradict other of his pronouncements, some of which were quoted earlier. Recall only that Mills defines logic as ‘the science of the operations of the human understanding in the pursuit of truth’ (1843, 6). There is no denying that Mill’s theory of logic contains incompatible views.
Godden (2005) shows convincingly that even Mill’s object-focused project eventually circles back towards psychologism. First of all, Mill offers affirmative and negative formulations of the Principle of the Transitivity of Co-existence as the ultimate foundation of all syllogistic reasoning:
The first, which is the principle of affirmative syllogism, is, that things which co-exist with the same thing, co-exist with one another … The second is the principle of negative syllogisms, and is to this effect: that a thing which co-exists with another thing, with which other a third thing does not co-exist, is not co-existent with that third thing (1843, 178).
Second, although Mill never seeks in turn to provide a justification for the Principle of Transitivity of Co-existence, it is not difficult to work out what for him such justification would have to look like. The parallel case of geometric axioms is clear enough: ‘It remains to inquire, what is the ground for belief in axioms — what is the evidence on which they rest? I answer, they are experimental truths; generalisations from observation’ (1843, 231). For Mill all general propositions must ultimately be justified by experience:
And so, in all cases, the general propositions, whether called definitions, axioms or laws of nature, which we lay down at the beginning of our reasonings, are merely abridged statements, in a kind of shorthand, of the particular facts, which, as occasion arises, we either think we may proceed on as proved, or intend to assume (1843, 192).
Third, Mill reverts to a full-blown form of psychologism when turning to the justification of other logical principles, in particular the Principle of Non-Contradiction. Mill insists that it too is an empirical generalisation over our experience, and especially over our inner experience:
I consider it to be, like other axioms, one of the first and most familiar generalizations from experience. The original foundation of it I take to be, that Belief and Disbelief are two different mental states, excluding one another (1843, 277).
Here again the foundations of logical truths cannot be understood and explained independently of psychology. Mill offers a similar analysis of the Principle of the Excluded Middle (1843, 278–9).
Fourth, what pushes Mill back into a psychologistic position is his phenomenalism. In his argument with Hamilton, Mill maintains that the fundamental logical principles apply not to things in themselves, but only to the objects of our experience. The laws of logic are ‘laws of all Phænomena’ (1865, 381–2). Accordingly, the fundamental principles of logic — the Principles of Non-Contradiction, the Excluded Middle and Identity,
are laws of our thoughts now, and invincibly so. … Any assertion, therefore, which conflicts with one of these laws … is to us unbelievable. The belief in such a proposition is, in the present constitution of nature, impossible as a mental fact. (1865, 380–1).
And with this claim Mill’s position is once more back in the psychologistic camp.
3. Examples of Psychologistic Reasoning
Although the exact definition of ‘psychologism’ was itself part and parcel of the Psychologismus-Streit, most German-speaking philosophers, from the 1880s onwards, agreed that the following arguments deserved the label ‘psychologistic’ (I shall write PA for ‘psychologistic argument’):
- (PA 1)
- 1. Psychology is defined as the science which studies
all (kinds of) laws of thought.
2. Logic is a field of inquiry which studies a subset of all laws of thought.
Ergo, logic is a part of psychology.
- (PA 2)
- 1. Normative-prescriptive disciplines — disciplines that
tell us what we ought to do — must be based upon
2. Logic is a normative-prescriptive discipline concerning human thinking.
3. There is only one science which qualifies as constituting the descriptive-explanatory foundation for logic: empirical psychology.
Ergo, logic must be based upon psychology.
- (PA 3)
- 1. Logic is the theory of judgments, concepts, and inferences.
2. Judgments, concepts, and inferences are human mental entities.
3. All human mental entities fall within the domain of psychology.
Ergo, logic is a part of psychology.
- (PA 4)
- 1. The touchstone of logical truth is the feeling of
2. The feeling of self-evidence is a human mental experience.
Ergo, logic is about a human mental experience — and thus a part of psychology.
- (PA 5)
- 1. We cannot conceive of alternative logics.
2. The limits of conceivability are mental limits.
Ergo, logic is relative to the thinking of the human species; and this thinking is studied by psychology.
Who actually held these views, indeed whether anyone did, was hotly contested at the time, but it seems reasonable to attribute PA 1 to Theodor Lipps (1893) and Gerardus Heymans (1894, 1905), PA 2 to Wilhelm Wundt (1880/83), PA 3 to Wilhelm Jerusalem (1905) and Christoph Sigwart (1921), PA 4 to Theodor Elsenhans (1897), and PA 5 to Benno Erdmann (1892). We might also note a couple of quotations that for many authors at the time were paradigmatic expressions of psychologism. The bulk of the first quotation comes from Mill’s Logic and has already been quoted in the last section:
So far as it is a science at all, [Logic] is a part, or branch, of Psychology; differing from it, on the one hand as the part differs from the whole, and on the other, as an Art differs from a Science. Its theoretical grounds are wholly borrowed from Psychology, and include as much of that science as is required to justify its rules of art (1865, 359).
And Theodor Lipps held that
… logic is a psychological discipline since the process of coming-to-know takes place only in the soul, and since that thinking which completes itself in this coming-to-know is a psychological process. The fact that psychology differs from logic in disregarding the opposition between knowledge and error does not mean that psychology equates these two different psychological conditions. It merely means that psychology has to explain knowledge and error in the same way. Obviously, no-one claims that psychology dissolves into logic. What separates the two sufficiently is that logic is a sub-discipline of psychology (Lipps 1893, 1–2).
4. Frege’s Antipsychologistic Arguments
Consider first Frege’s Grundlagen der Arithmetik (1884). One of Frege’s main thesis is that mathematics and logic are not part of psychology, and that the objects and laws of mathematics and psychology are not defined, illuminated, proven true, or explained by psychological observations and results. One of Frege’s central arguments for this thesis is the consideration that whereas mathematics is the most exact of all sciences, psychology is imprecise and vague (1884, 38). Thus it is implausible to assume that mathematics could possibly be based upon, or be a part of, psychology. A closely related further point is that we need to distinguish between psychological ‘ideas’ (Vorstellungen) and their objects. This distinction is especially important when the latter are objective or ideal. Numbers, for example, are objective and ideal entities, and thus they differ fundamentally from ideas. Ideas are always subjective and idiosyncratic. In this context Frege laments the fact that the term ‘idea’ has also been used for objective, essentially non-sensual, abstract and objective entities (1884, 37). Frege rejects psychological or physiological interpretations of the Kantian distinctions between the a priori and the a posteriori, and the analytic and the synthetic; as Frege has, it these distinctions concern different ways in which judgments are justified or proven true, not different operations of the human mind (1884, 3).
A central theme of the Grundlagen is a detailed criticism of Mill’s philosophy of mathematics. Frege argues that mathematical truths are not empirical truths and that numbers cannot be properties of aggregates of objects. First, Frege denies Mill’s claim that mathematical statements are about matters of fact. Frege’s objection is that there is no physical fact of the matter to which the numbers 0 or 777864 refer. Moreover, someone who learns how to calculate does not thereby gain any new empirical knowledge (1884, 9–11). Second, Frege insists that there is no general inductive law from which all mathematical sentences can be said to follow (1884, 10). Third, while Frege grants Mill that some empirical knowledge may well be necessary for us to learn mathematics, he points out that empirical knowledge cannot justify mathematical truths (1884, 12). Fourth, Frege counters Mill’s claim according to which numbers are properties of aggregates of objects with the observations that aggregates do not have — in and of themselves — characteristic manners in which they can be divided. Frege also points out that the numbers 0 and 1 are not aggregates at all. And finally, Frege accuses Mill of overlooking that numbers can be predicated of both concrete and abstract objects (1884, 31).
Frege continues his criticism of psychological logic in the ‘Foreword’ of his Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (1893). He begins by pointing out that the word ‘law’ is ambiguous: it can refer to descriptive or to prescriptive laws. Examples of the former are the laws of physics, examples of the latter are moral laws (1893, XV). Frege suggests that every descriptive law can be reformulated as a prescription to think in accordance with it. For instance, true descriptive laws ought to be accepted. Hence they can be prefixed by the prescription: ‘accept the truth of …’. In other cases the prescription might be a set of instructions on how to reach the truth stated in a descriptive law. Frege’s main point in all this is that whereas all prescriptive laws can be categorized as ‘laws of thought’ on the basis that they tell what we ought to think, only one kind of descriptive laws deserves to be come under the same heading: the set of psychological descriptive laws (ibid.).
Frege claims that in the realm of logic we find both descriptive and prescriptive laws, with the former being the foundation for the latter. The point merits stressing since it is sometimes suggested that for Frege the opposition between psychological laws and logical laws is the is-ought opposition (e.g. Føllesdal 1958, 49). But note that Frege writes:
…every law that states what is can be apprehended as prescribing that one ought to think in accordance with it … This holds of geometrical and physical laws no less than logical laws (1893, XV).
Thus logical laws are primarily descriptive laws even though, like other descriptive laws, they too can be reformulated or apprehended as prescriptive laws. These distinctions allow Frege to distinguish between two versions of ‘psychological logicians’: one group takes the laws of logic to be descriptive psychological laws, the other group interprets the laws of logic as prescriptive laws based on descriptive psychological laws. It is the ambiguity of the expression ‘law of thought’ that invites these confusions (1893, XV).
Frege’s main criticism of psychological logic is that it conflates ‘true’ and ‘being-taken-to-be-true’. To begin with, Frege denies that prescriptions based on psychological laws can qualify as proper logical laws. Such prescriptions can be no more than demands to conform to current thinking habits. But they cannot be yardsticks by which these thinking habits can be evaluated as to their truth. Moreover, Frege points out that the descriptive psychological laws which for the psychological logician provide the basis for (psycho-)logical prescriptions are laws of ‘taking-to-be-true’: they state the conditions under which humans accept the truth of judgments or the validity of inferences; but they do not determine the conditions under which judgments are true and inferences valid. Here Frege is particularly scathing of the psychological logician Benno Erdmann who identifies truth with general consensus. For Frege this move makes truth dependent upon what-is-taken-to-be-true. And it fails to give proper heed to the insight that truth is independent of people’s agreement. It follows that the laws of logic are not psychological laws: ‘If being true is thus independent of being acknowledged by somebody or other, then the laws of truth are not psychological laws: they are boundary stones set in an eternal foundation, which our thought can overflow but never displace’ (1893, XVI). Frege’s attack on Erdmann does not end here. Erdmann is also taken to task for his suggestion that logical laws might have mere ‘hypothetical necessity’, that is, that they are relative to the human species. Frege maintains that if we were to encounter creatures who deny the laws of logic, we would take them to be insane; and he analyses Erdmann’s proposal as reducing, yet again, truth to what-is-taken-to-be-true (1893, XVI–XVII). At the same time, Frege accepts that the most fundamental logical laws cannot be justified. Logical justification comes to an end when we reach these laws. However, to argue that our nature or constitution forces us to abide by the laws of logic is no longer a logical justification; it is to incorrectly shift from logical to psychological or biological considerations (1893, XVI–XVII).
For Frege the opposition between truth and what-is-taking-to-be-true is closely linked to the distinction between accepting and rejecting the realm of objective and non-real entities. Frege insists that the realm of the non-real is not identical with the realm of the psychological and subjective. His example of objective, non-psychological entities are numbers. Numbers are not ideas since they are the same for all subjects (1893, XVIII). Moreover, Frege tries to convince us that the denial of the objectivity and non-reality of numbers and concepts leads fairly directly into idealism and solipsism. Since psychological logicians try so hard to break down the distinction between the realms of the objective-ideal and the subjective-psychological, they easily are tempted to go further and challenge the borderline between the subjective-psychological and the objective-real. The resulting standpoint is idealism and solipsism: idealism since the only existing entities are ideas; solipsism since all ideas are relative to subjects. And thus the possibility of communication is a further victim of their efforts (1893, XIX). Again Frege is eager to show that Erdmann’s logic is guilty of the charges. He therefore points out that Erdmann calls both hallucinated objects and numbers ‘objects of an ideal nature’; that Erdmann fails to distinguish between acts and contents of judgments; and that Erdmann lacks the conceptual resources to distinguish between ideas and realities (1893, XX–XXIII).
Frege’s alternative is of course to emphasize that coming-to-know is an activity that grasps rather than creates objects. This choice of terminology is meant to bring out that what we come to know is (usually) independent of us. After all, when we grasp a physical object like a pencil, the object is independent both of the act of grasping and of the human actor of the grasping (1893, XXIV).
Frege’s third anti-psychologistic discussion is his 1894-review of Husserl’s Philosophie der Arithmetik (1891). I shall not here enter into the debate over whether it was Frege’s criticism that turned Husserl away from psychologism (cf. Kusch 1995, 12–13). Nor shall I try to adjudicate whether Frege’s critique was justified. Suffice it here to point out that Frege’s review classifies Husserl as a psychological logician on the grounds that Husserl treats the meanings of words, concepts and objects as different kinds of ideas (1894, 316); that Husserl provides psychological-genetic accounts of the origins of abstract concepts (1894, 317); and that Husserl, like Erdmann, equivocates on the notion of idea: in some places in his book, concepts and objects are understood as subjective, in other places they are taken to be objective (1894, 318). In his criticism of Husserl’s psychological explanation of the genesis of the number concept, Frege does not confine himself to contrasting Husserl’s theory with his own account of numbers. He also points out that the various psychological processes which Husserl’s theory assumes are spurious. For instance, Frege denies that we can combine any arbitrary contents into one idea without relating these contents to one another. He also rejects Husserl’s claim that we can abstract from all differences between two contents and still retain their numerical distinctness (1894, 316, 323).
5. Husserl’s Antipsychologistic Arguments
Husserl’s criticism of psychologism in the Prolegomena of the Logische Untersuchungen was the key text in the German-speaking debate over psychologism during the first decade-and-a-half of the twentieth century (Husserl 1900). The Prolegomena fall roughly into three parts. Part One identifies the sense in which logic is a ‘practical-normative discipline’ (Kunstlehre) (Chapters 1 and 2). Part Two argues at great length that the theoretical foundations of the logical practical-normative discipline are not psychological (Chapters 3 to 10). And Part Three provides an overview over the true foundations of logic as a practical-normative discipline (Chapter 11). I have reconstructed all three parts in some detail elsewhere (Kusch 1995, 41–60), here I shall concentrate on Part Two. (Important recent discussions of Husserl’s arguments include Carr 2007, Hanna 2008, Hopkins 2006, Moran 2008, Pelletier et al. 2008.)
From Part One we here need only two ideas. First, logic as a practical-normative discipline vis-à-vis the sciences is a theory of science (Wissenschaftslehre). It evaluates the methods of scientific justification, and in so doing it addresses the questions: Under what (empirical) conditions can valid methods be used successfully? What is the internal conceptual structure of each of the sciences, and how can they be demarcated from one another? And how can scientists avoid making mistakes? (§§5–11) Second, normative disciplines have non-normative theoretical foundations belonging to one or more non-normative theoretical discipline (§§14–16).
Husserl begins his discussion of psychologism in Part Two with a criticism of what one might call ‘normative anti-psychologism’, that is, the view that psychology and logic are divided by the is-ought distinction (§17). He sides with the proponents of psychologism who maintain that thought as it ought to occur is but a special case of thought as it in fact occurs. Nor is it right, Husserl thinks, to accuse psychologism of circularity; some critics of psychologism had argued that one cannot base normative logic on psychology since psychology itself has some of its foundations in logic. But this misses an important distinction. Psychology can either take the laws of logic as premises and axioms of its own theories, or it can rely on the laws of logic merely as rules of method in accordance with which psychology must proceed. If psychology did the former, psychologism would involve a vicious circle. But psychology presupposes laws of logic only in the second, weaker, sense. And hence psychologism is not based upon a fatal circularity (§19).
Having dismissed these two older forms of antipsychologism, Husserl moves on to present his own arguments. One main train of thought centers on the three empiricist consequences of psychologism. They can be reconstructed as follows:
First Consequence: If logical rules were based upon psychological laws, then all logical rules would have to be as vague as the underlying psychological laws.
Refutation: Not all logical rules are vague. And therefore not all logical rules are based upon psychological laws. (§21).
Second Consequence: If laws of logic were psychological laws, then they could not be known a priori. They would be more or less probable rather than Valid, and justified only by reference to experience.
Refutation: Laws of logic are a priori, they are justified by apodictic self-evidence, and valid rather than probable. And therefore laws of logic are not psychological (§21).
Third Consequence: If logical laws were psychological laws, they would refer to psychological entities.
Refutation: Logical laws do not refer to psychological entities. And therefore logical laws are not psychological laws (§23).
Husserl also claims that psychologism fails to do justice to the idea that truths are eternal. It is precisely because truths are eternal that logical laws cannot be laws about states of affairs (be they mental or physical). Husserl attempts to prove this claim by showing that the opposite assumption leads to paradoxes.
Take a logical law like (*).
(*) For every truth t, its contradictory opposite ~t is no truth.
And then assume (a)–(d):
(a) Laws about states of affairs are laws about the coming to be and passing away of states of affairs.
(b) (*) is a truth.
(c) (*) is a law about truths.
(d) Laws about truths are laws about state of affairs.
Then two paradoxical conclusions follow:
(e) Laws about truths are laws about the coming to be and passing away of truths.
(f) Laws about truths are laws about the coming to be and passing away of laws about truths (§24; Kusch 1995, 47).
Husserl also seeks to show that psychological interpretations of the basic logical principles and the laws of syllogistics are unsatisfactory. As far as the basic principles are concerned, Husserl targets for example Spencer’s psychological rendering of the Principle of Non-Contradiction. He quotes Spencer as saying that
…the appearance of any positive mode of consciousness cannot appear without excluding a correlative negative mode; and … the negative mode cannot occur without excluding the correlative positive mode.
In Husserl’s view Spencer’s sentence is a tautology since positive and negative modes already form a pair of contradictory opposites. However, Husserl insists, the Principle of Non-Contradiction is no tautology (§26). Concerning psychologistic views of syllogistics, Husserl’s main target is the Dutch psychologist and philosopher Gerardus Heymans. On the one hand, Husserl points out that if the laws of syllogistics were laws of thought, then we would never commit fallacies. On the other hand, a psychological interpretation of syllogistics cannot explain why some inferences are valid and others invalid (§31).
Like Frege, Husserl ultimately seeks to refute psychologism by linking it closely to broader and (at the time) disreputable philosophical positions. But for Husserl the focus is less on subjective idealism and solipsism and more on skepticism and relativism. Husserl contends that all forms of psychologism are forms of ‘species relativism’, more precisely ‘anthropologism’. And he goes on to argue that such relativism is ‘absurd’. In order to get to this general conclusion, Husserl begins by arguing against Protagorean relativism. While acknowledging that the true Protagorean relativist can never be argued out of his position, Husserl holds that we ‘normally disposed’ people can nevertheless see what is wrong with the Protagorean viewpoint: the same sentence cannot be both true and false, and the Protagorean thesis, ‘truth is relative’, cannot itself be merely relatively true. (§35). Species relativism (and thus anthropologism) is equally absurd, but a little harder to refute. Husserl marshals a number of arguments against species relativism; the most important are (a) that since the Principle of Non-Contradiction is part of the meaning of truth, one and the same thought cannot be true for one species and false for another; (b) that truth are eternal and thus not temporally and spatially determined; and (c) that if truth were relative then so would be the existence of the world. This is because the world is the correlate of the ideal system of all factual truths. If truth were relative then there would be no such ideal system and thus no one unique world (§36).
Having convinced himself that anthropologism is self-refuting, Husserl turns in some detail to showing all forms of psychologism are forms of anthropologism (§38). The views of Erdmann and Sigwart receive most of his attention. In Sigwart’s case, Husserl criticizes, amongst other things, the view according to which it would be wrong to assume that a judgment could be true even if no intellect were ever thinking this judgment. Husserl objects with the thought that it is part of the meaning of the law of gravity that it is true for all times (even prior to its discovery) regardless of whether it happens to be thought by anyone or not (§39) In Erdmann’s case Husserl goes to even greater lengths in order to unearth what he regards as fatal flaws and inconsistencies. The central issue for Husserl is Erdmann’s claim that logical laws are merely hypothetically necessary, that is, that logical laws are necessary only for members of the human species up until the present (§40). Perhaps the most important argument is that Erdmann’s position in inherently unstable: on the one hand, Erdmann argues for the hypothetical necessity, or species-relativity, of logical laws be insisting that we cannot imagine alternatives to logical laws. On the other hand, Erdmann holds that therefore logical laws are psychological laws. Husserl objects that these two theses do not fit together since we can always imagine alternatives to psychological laws (§41).
The last major step in Husserl’s overall argument is to show that psychologism is based upon three — more or less easily refutable — ‘prejudices’:
First Prejudice: Prescriptions meant to regulate psychological events must be psychologically grounded.
This is wrong since logical prescriptions are fully grounded in logic as a theoretical, non-normative discipline (§41).
Second Prejudice: Logic is concerned with ideas, judgments, inferences and proofs, and all these are psychological phenomena. Therefore logic must be based on psychology.
That this is a prejudice, Husserl argues, can be seen from the fact that a similar line of thought would lead one to the claim that mathematics is a branch of psychology. And he goes on to suggest that mathematical psychologism has already been refuted by the likes of Lotze, Riehl, Frege and Natorp (§45).
Third Prejudice: Judgments are recognized as true when one experiences them as self-evident. But self-evidence is a psychological phenomenon, a feeling. Therefore logic must study the psychological conditions for the occurrences of that feeling, that is, it must find the psychological laws that link the occurrence of that feeling to prior or coexisting mental events.
To this Husserl replies that purely logical sentences say nothing about self-evidence and its conditions. Husserl makes three proposals concerning self-evidence. First, self-evidence is the experience, or a criterion, of truth. To experience that an assertion corresponds to an experienced state of affairs is to have self-evidence for that assertion. But self-evidence is no additional ingredient of this experience. Second, truths are ideal species of the ideal genus truth, that is, truths are ideal particulars. These ideal species are independent of whatever humans claim to be self-evident. And third, when one person claims that p is self-evident, whereas another person claims that ~p is self-evident, then one of them is wrong. Put differently, truth is prior to self-evidence (§51).
(For other detailed interpretations of Husserl’s arguments see Tieszen 2008 and Hanna 2008.)
6. Early Criticism of Husserl’s Arguments
While Frege’s antipsychologism received scant attention, Husserl’s Prolegomena were widely discussed in German-speaking philosophy between 1901 and 1920. Here I shall only be able to present a few of the critical replies (cf. Kusch 1995, Chs. 4 and 5). While my selection is itself based upon an evaluation — I have tried to pick arguments with at least some (initial) plausibility — I shall not here try to assess the strengths and weaknesses of the various responses. Nor do I have the space to describe the more general, and sometimes highly contested, philosophical presuppositions upon which the replies are based.
The Southwest-German School of Neokantians was particularly critical of Husserl’s claim that logic qua normative-practical discipline must be based upon logic as a theoretical science. On their behalf, Richard Kroner (1909) defended the view that logical laws are imperatives, and that these imperatives are founded on values (1909, 241). Kroner insists that not all ‘ought-sentences’ are founded on non-normative, theoretical sentences. Only hypothetical imperatives (and their cognate ought-sentences) fit Husserl’s analysis. For instance, the hypothetical ought-sentence (a) …
(a) If you want to ride a horse well, you ought to be able to control it, sit tight, etc.
… indeed presupposes the theoretical, non-normative sentence (b) …
(b) Riding a horse well is possible only if one is able to control the horse, sit tight, etc.
However, categorical ought-sentences demand a different analysis, Kroner maintains. The categorical ought-sentence (a′) …
(a′) A warrior ought to be courageous
… is not based upon the theoretical sentence (b′) …
(b′) It is part of the concept of a good warrior that he is courageous.
In the case of categorical ought-sentences, the order of presupposition is reversed: the non-normative sentence (b′) derives its justification or meaning from the normative one (a′). To model the relation between (a′) and (b′) on the relation between (a) and (b) ‘would be to practice moral philosophy in a Socratic fashion, that is, it would imply a one-sided intellectualistic interpretation of the concept of value’ (1909, 242). Kroner thinks that the case of logic is similar to the case of morals. The highest logical norm is something like (a″) …
(a″) Every reasoner ought to think what is true
… and this norm is primary with respect to (b″) …
(b″) It is part of the concept of the good reasoner that she thinks what is true.
And this analysis of the most basic logical norm also applies to all other logical norms (1909, 242). (For important recent discussion of the relation between Neokantianism and psychologism, see Anderson 2005, Beiser 2009, Edgar 2007.)
Husserl’s (and Frege’s) arguments for a sharp distinction between logical and psychological laws — that that only the latter are vague and based on induction — were targeted often; especially forcefully by Moritz Schlick (1910):
One sees immediately that one might with equal right infer the opposite: since logical structures, inferences, judgments and concepts undoubtedly result from psychological processes, we are entitled to infer from the existence of logical rules that there are perfectly exact psychological laws as well…. The proponent of “absolute” logic cannot defend his position simply by claiming that all psychological laws are vague; for this amounts to a petitio principii (Schlick 1910, 409).
He who regards logical principles as exact laws of thought [and thus as laws of nature] will of course deny that all laws of nature are merely probably valid … (1910, 410)
Husserl’s characterization of logical laws as known a priori also met with opposition. According to Gerardus Heymans, all epistemology can say, for the time being, with respect to a logical law like the Principle of Non-Contradiction is that ‘probably all human beings reject contradiction’ (1905, 66). Our knowledge of logical laws is more probable than our knowledge of other psychological laws only ‘because we experiment, throughout our life, daily and every hour, with these elementary relations between phenomena of consciousness’ (1905, 33).
Schlick (1910) also challenges Husserl’s claim that laws of logic do not imply the existence of matters of fact. Schlick maintains that psychological acts of judgment and logical sentences are intertwined, such that the logical sentence and its truth
…can never be found independently of the act of judgment; the logical sentence is included in the latter and results from it via abstraction…. the logical sentence has its place only in the mental experience and does not exist outside of it in any sense. The two cannot be separated; the judgment as logical structure, as “ideal meaning” … comes to be, once one abstracts, within the real experience of judging, from all individual and temporal elements. And even though one can abstract from all individual-psychological factors, one cannot abstract from the psychological in general. In other words, one cannot understand logical sentences as structures without psychological quality. Pace Husserl, logical sentences imply the existence of experiences of judging. For if we take away, from any chosen judgment, everything which is psychological, we only remain with the matter of fact that the judgment expresses and upon which it is based (1910, 405).
Defenders of psychologistic renderings of logical principles and syllogistic also stood their ground. Recall that Husserl argued against Heymans as follows:
|1. If the laws of syllogistics were (hardwired) psychological laws of thought, then no human reasoner could ever deviate from these laws.|
|2. Human reasoners commit fallacies, i.e. they deviate from the laws of syllogistics.|
|The laws of syllogistics are not (hardwired) psychological laws of thought.|
In his reply, Heymans denies Husserl’s claim according to which fallacies are deviations from the laws of syllogistics. For Heymans, someone who does not derive the right conclusion from given premises is confused about the meaning of the major, middle or minor terms, not lacking knowledge of the inference schemes. In the case of fallacies the causes of the deviation from the laws of syllogistics are
…as it were, prior to the thought processes. The premises are not the right ones, or are not clearly grasped or wrongly understood; but a principal difference in laws of thought [between laws of thought in the cases of correct and incorrect inferring] cannot be claimed to exist…. As concerns the question whether there are cases which can only be explained by assuming such a difference, one might say that the burden of proof is on the side of those who claim that there are such cases. As long as such cases have not been firmly established, the theory of knowledge can rest content with accepting the fact that people think according to logical laws … (1905, 69)
Some of Husserl’s case against psychologism rested on showing that it is a form of skeptical relativism, and that skeptical relativism is self-refuting. The latter claim was first doubted by Paul Natorp (1901). In his review of the Prolegomena Natorp hints at the possibility that Husserl’s arguments against relativism and skepticism are guilty of a petitio:
[For Husserl] skepticism is … absurd. (But perhaps only for those who want strictly valid theories at all costs. The skeptic might say that he too wants such theories, but that he feels that they are an impossible ideal …). Husserl then studies skepticism and skeptical relativism in its individualistic form; he claims that “as soon as this position is formulated, it is already refuted” — at least for those who understand the objectivity of logic. (But this is precisely what the skeptic denies.) (1901, 274)
Recall that Husserl’s case against psychologism centrally relies on the claim that truths exist independently of whether or not they are ever grasped by anyone. Schlick (1910) called this assumption ‘the independence theory of truth’. It was frequently attacked. Since Husserl provided the clearest statement of the independence theory of truth in the context of his criticism of Christoph Sigwart, it seems only fair to start the summary of repudiations with this author. In the Prolegomena Husserl disagrees with Sigwart’s claim that no judgment can be true unless it is actually thought by someone. Husserl regards it as part of the meaning of the law of gravity that the law is true for all times, that is, even prior to its discovery and regardless of whether it is ever formulated by anyone. Sigwart (1921) accuses Husserl of conflating truth with reality:
In the original sense of the terms, only assertions or opinions can be true or false. And assertions or opinions necessarily presuppose thinking subjects who entertain the opinions or utter the assertions. To postulate “sentences” as independent essences is sheer mythology. Insofar as Husserl speaks of “contradictory facts” that cannot both be true, he conflates “true” and “real”. And thus Husserl lapses into the same conceptual confusion that the German Criminal Code is guilty of when it speaks of … “pretence of false facts”…. Only an opinion, a report about a fact, can be false. But a fact is simply there … When no judgments have been made, then there is nothing of which “true” or “false” could be predicated. Of course, the planets did move, already long before Newton, in a way that conforms to the law of gravity. However, before Newton formulated his theory (…) no true sentence about these movements existed within human knowledge. After Newton formulated the law of gravity as a sentence, this sentence became, due to its content, true for the past as well (1921, 23).
Schlick (1910) agrees: ‘There is no truth of judgments such that this truth is independent of the judgments’ existence in mental acts. Only the facts upon which true judgments are based, are independent of us’ (403). However, Schlick goes further than Sigwart by trying to explain Husserl’s alleged conflation:
The mistake of the independence theory is based upon a fallacious distinction between ideas and objects of ideas. In the case of concrete ideas, say ideas of [physical] objects that I can [literally] grasp, this distinction makes sense; after all, I distinguish between the book lying in front of me on the table, and my idea of that book. But, in the case of abstract ideas, object and content coincide, i.e. the object of the idea is nowhere to be found, except within that very idea. And thus logical sentences and acts of judging are absolutely inseparable (1910, 407).
Husserl’s distinction between the act and content of judgments was questioned by other commentators as well. Wilhelm Jerusalem (1905) puts his criticism in the context of a defense of species relativism. He especially disagrees with Husserl’s claim that ‘the same content of a judgment cannot be true for one species and false for another’. Jerusalem replies:
If the two species in question are totally differently organized, or “constituted”, then there are no contents of judgments that are identical for both. For some purposes one can distinguish between the act and content of a judgment, by reflecting on, or attending to, one or another of the two. But the act and the content cannot be separated in such a way that the one could remain constant while the other is changed. The act and the content of a judgment penetrate each other completely and every change in the act leads to a change in the content…. Thus it is not absurd to restrict truth to human knowledge; what is absurd is rather to speak of identical contents of judgments in the case of differently organized species (1905, 104).
Husserl’s equation of psychologism with species relativism was first and foremost targeting Erdmann. In a footnote to the second edition of his Logische Elementarlehre (1907), Erdmann laments that Husserl has misconstrued his views. And in a footnote he gives a new defense of his claim that the laws of logic have only hypothetical necessity:
We are unable to prove that the logical basic laws of our thinking … are the conditions and norms of all possible thinking. Thus we have to allow for the real possibility of a thinking that differs from ours. This concession has to be made, first of all, because science is not meant to exclude the religious convictions of religious consciousness … [i.e. science has no right to infer with the belief that God may have a different logic]. Secondly, this concession also has to be made insofar as … it is no more than an empirical experience that we think and an empirical experience of how we think. This experience is not changed by the fact that we are indeed bound to the conditions of our thinking, and that our valid thinking has to submit to the logical norms that we formulate. We are not even able to claim that our thinking will always be bound to these conditions and norms, for we have no right to assume that our thinking will be eternal. The days of the human species on earth are numbered too … And even if the human species did not just belong to one period of the development of the earth or the solar system, even then we should not dare proclaim our thinking invariable. We could proclaim such invariability only if we were able to directly grasp the essence of our soul as an independent, invariable substance — in the way assumed by a rational psychology — and if we could deduce the invariability of our thinking. But this we are unable to do as long as we hold on to the idea that psychology can determine the stock and connections of psychological life-processes only via observation — like any other science of facts. Finally, our thinking has developed out of less complicated forms of mental representation, and thus we have no right to rule out further development towards higher complexity of thought, a development that calls for different norms. Be it added, however, … that we have no reason to expect such further development … But here we are concerned not with probability but with possibility (1907, 531–32)
In Husserl’s overall argument, self-evidence figures in two distinct ways. On the one hand, Husserl claims self-evidence for the thought that no other species could have a different logic from ours. On the other hand, Husserl denies both that purely logical sentences say anything about self-evidence and that self-evidence is a criterion of truth.
Critics of Husserl’s view on self-evidence attacked one or both of these lines of thought. Wilhelm Wundt (1910) for example complains that Husserl never gives satisfactory definitions of his key terms: in Husserl’s Logische Untersuchungen
… every definition amounts to the explanation that the concept in question is a specific experience which cannot be defined at all. This observation also holds for that concept which plays the most central role in Husserl’s logical investigations: the concept of self-evidence (1910, 611).
Wundt suggests the following explanation for Husserl’s alleged inability to define self-evidence:
Even more strange than the failure of psychologism is the fact that logicism [i.e. Brentano’s and Husserl’s position] fares no better. The latter fares no better despite its emphatic appeal to the self-evidence of logical laws. This is because logicism’s appeal [to the self-evidence of logical laws] moves in a continuing circle: it declares logical laws self-evident, but then again it bases self-evidence upon the validity of logical laws. In order to escape this circle, logicism can do no better than explain that self-evidence is an ultimate fact which cannot be further defined. And since a fact can only be regarded as existing if it is somehow given within a perception (Anschauung, intuition), it is understandable that logicism treats immediate perception and indefinability as equivalent modes of justification…. However, since every immediate perception is a psychological process, the appeal to immediate perception amounts to a relapse into psychologism … (1910, 623–25).
Schlick (1910) is especially concerned to point out that Husserl’s two treatments of self-evidence contradict one another. As Schlick sees it, the second employment contradicts the first. Schlick writes:
[Husserl’s] absolute, independent truth would be unrecognizable in every sense. Even if it could, through a miracle, enter into the human intellect, how in the world could we recognise the truth as the truth? According to Husserl the criterion is self-evidence. At one point he begins a defense of the independence theory with the words: “The following relation is self-evidently given (durch Einsicht gegeben)”; some pages later we read, as if to confirm the earlier claim: “If we were not allowed to trust self-evidence any more, how could we make, and reasonably defend, any assertions at all?” But this obviously amounts to nothing else than a flight into the theory of self-evidence! It is beyond doubt that in these quoted sentences Husserl advocates “the real theory of self-evidence”, a theory that he himself rejects with the following drastic words: “One feels inclined to ask what the authority of that feeling [of self-evidence] is based upon, how that feeling can guarantee the truth of a judgment, how it can ‘mark a statement with the stamp of truth’, ‘announce’ its truth, …” Nothing can hide the fact that our author here contradicts himself, not even the appeal to his distinction between ideal possibility of self-evidence relating to “sentences” and real self-evidence relating to acts of judging. After all, in this context we are dealing with factual, real knowledge of the truth, i.e. with real, psychological self-evidence. In fact it is only this real self-evidence that exists … (1910, 415).
7. Recent Re-evaluations
Given the central position of Frege’s and Husserl’s work in modern analytic and ‘Continental’ philosophy, it is of course not surprising that critical re-appraisals of their anti-psychologism did not stop when the Psychologismus-Streit ended around 1914. Here is a brief glimpse at more recent evaluations. Interestingly enough, many recent re-evaluations of turn-of-the-century antipsychologism conclude that Frege’s and Husserl’s arguments are question-begging. My aim again is to give a brief overview of the range of responses, not to offer assessments. To do so would demand a much more extensive discussion.
J.J. Katz (1981, 175) agrees with Schlick and other early critics that Frege and Husserl are wrong to take psychological laws to be vague and inexact. Katz’s criticism echoes Schlick’s petitio principii charge: One
might well reply that not all psychological laws are vague and inexact; logical and mathematical laws are the psychological laws that are exceptions to what is otherwise the rule in psychology for now but that in the future the rest of psychology will catch up (1981, 175).
Recent critics also disagree with Frege’s and Husserl’s views on the nature of logical laws. In the light of the development of philosophy and logic over the past 70 years, it is no longer evident that the laws of Frege’s and Husserl’s classical logic are necessary and unique. The uniqueness assumption has become more and more questionable as logicians have developed more and more logics (e.g. intuitionist logic, dialethetic paraconsistent and dialectical logic, relevance logic). Not only have Frege and Husserl failed to provide procedures for adjudicating between alternative logics (Baker and Hacker 1989, 88), but it has also turned out that even the Principle of Non-Contradiction which both Frege and Husserl regarded as one of those ‘boundary stones set in an eternal foundation, which our thought can overflow but never displace’, can be violated — without leading to absolute inconsistency. Indeed it is violated in every dialethetic system of logic (Massey 1991, 184).
While some critics of Frege and Husserl are still willing to regard the propositions of logic as ‘paradigms of necessary truth’ (Baker and Hacker 1989, 87), others go further and deny logical laws the status of necessary truths. A weaker form of this denial accepts the notion of necessity as meaningful but holds that logic falls short of necessity. A stronger form rejects the notion of necessity altogether (cf. Pivcevic 1970, 38–41).
The weaker form is sketched in a paper by Gerald Massey (1991). Massey suggests that ‘logic and mathematics … forfeited all claims to the honorific title sciences of necessary truth when they admitted Church’s thesis into their innersanctum’ (1991, 186). According to Church’s thesis , there is no algorithm that is more powerful than a Turing machine. Or, put differently, every function that is computable at all, is computable on a Turing machine. This thesis is presupposed in establishing very fundamental logical results. It is used, for example in order to prove Church’s theorem which says that there is no algorithmic decision procedure for first-order logic. Yet Church’s thesis is a mere hypothesis, and a hypothesis that cannot be proven true. This is because the notion of algorithm is not precisely definable; there is no limit to the variety that an algorithmic routine might assume. Thus Church’s thesis may indeed be false: someone might eventually come up with an algorithm that computes some definite function f that no Turing machine can compute (Jeffrey 1989, 132; Massey 1991, 186).
Massey also invokes the stronger form of the claim that logical truths are not necessary (1991, 188). According to this criticism, the very notion of necessity which is presupposed in calling logical laws ‘necessary truths’, is beset with difficulties. The argument leading to this conclusion was developed in a series of well-known papers by Quine. Quine argued that the notions of analyticity, necessity and aprioricity stand or fall together and that the traditional distinction between analytic and synthetic truths is relative rather than absolute. But once this distinction becomes relative, necessity and aprioricity go by the board (Quine 1951, Engel 1991, 268–70). Massey summarises the implications of Quine’s arguments succinctly:
If we reject the concept of necessity … we also forego the concept of contingency. If it makes no sense to say that the truths of mathematics are necessary, it makes no better sense to say that those of psychology or any other so-called empirical science are contingent. But if we may not employ necessity and contingency to demarcate the deliverances of the empirical sciences from those of the formal sciences, how are we to distinguish them in any philosophically interesting way? (1991, 188).
A different line of attack on Frege’s and Husserl’s antipsychologism focuses on the premises that both authors share with their psychologistic opponents. The most important of such shared premises is the idea that the primary cognitive attitude of logic is descriptive rather than prescriptive, that is, that logic describes objects or objectivities (Sachverhalte). Of course Frege and Husserl, on the one hand, and their psychologistic foes, on the other hand, disagree over the nature of these objects and objectivities — for the psychologicists these are real or psychological, whereas for Frege and Husserl they are ideal. But the fact remains that both sides in the dispute see logic as essentially descriptive (for Husserl, see Gethmann 1989, 197; for Frege, see Baker and Hacker: 1989, 88–90).
Central to Frege’s and Husserl’s criticism of psychologism is the idea that psychologism turns out to be a relativism of sorts. Frege goes no further than to point out this reduction of psychologism to relativism, and, for the reasons given above, he makes no attempt to refute relativism. However, Husserl marshals a number of arguments against both Protagorean relativism and species relativism. If these arguments were successful, then psychologism would be unmasked as a self-refuting doctrine. A number of critics have tried to show that they are not successful.
As concerns Husserl’s case against Protagorean relativism, Husserl himself admits that his arguments will only be convincing for those philosophers who already accept that truth is absolute. Husserl is more ambitious with respect to species relativism. He believes that it can be shown that species relativism is a self-refuting doctrine (cf. Føllesdal 1958, 37–39; Sukale 1977, 47–48).
The argument, according to which the species relativist misconstrues the meaning of truth by allowing the same judgment to be both true and false, is clearly question-begging. Husserl’s argument boils down to this: ‘It is contradictory to claim that truth is not absolute because truth is absolute’ (Føllesdal 1958, 37). Husserl simply takes the absoluteness of truth as self-evident. He also overlooks that, properly construed, the relativistic notion of truth does not violate the Principle of Non-Contradiction. If truth is taken as ‘truth-for-S’ (i.e. truth for a species), such that the hyphenisation is irreducible, then one and the same judgment can be true-for-S1 and false-for-S2 without the Principle of Non-Contradiction being violated (Meiland 1977, 571). The further argument, according to which truth cannot be relative to species because truth is eternal, can obviously be rejected as a petitio principii as well. Finally, Husserl claims that if truth were relative then so would be the existence of the world. Here too Husserl does little more than invoke self-evidence for his position. He takes it as self-evident that the existence of the world cannot be relative and he does not show that the opposite assumption is self-refuting.
Husserl’s frequent reliance upon ‘apodictic self-evidence’ both as a weapon against the species relativist and as the source of insight into logical truths is itself beset with difficulties. Husserl seems to think that apodictic self-evidence takes the philosopher/logician beyond the realm of the factual, and even beyond the realm of psychology. But, as pointed out by Arne Naess, apodictic self-evidence cannot deliver on this promise: “… the assertion that he or any other has this evidence, does not belong to pure logic or any other pure or formal science. It belongs to a factual science concerning the relation of logicians (and others) to pure science. It is not necessary to conceive this to be psychology. It is enough … that it is a science of facts or more generally, a science about the real rather than the ideal” (Naess 1954, 70). And thus, Naess concludes, the program of a pure logic as a system of apodictic knowledge is “to be dismissed … As soon as a science is said to be science of or about something, there is a radical risk of error …” (Naess 1954, 73).
Finally, for both Frege and Husserl, Benno Erdmann is the chief culprit, that is, the main advocate of a form of psychologism that leads to species relativism. Interestingly enough, over the last thirty years, the critical re-evaluation of antipsychologism has even led to a partial rehabilitation of Erdmann’s ‘psychologistic’ view of logic. As Jack Meiland (1976) construes Erdmann’s philosophy of logic, the psychological interpretation of logical principles is meant to explain why we cannot conceive of radically different logical systems. The explanation is that ‘logical laws express the conditions which govern our thinking in the sense of describing the limits of what we can think’ (1976, 329). One of Husserl’s central objections to this view is that logical principles like the Principle of Non-Contradiction can be denied by human individuals, and indeed have been denied, for example by Hegel. And thus Husserl concludes that logical laws do not describe the limits of what is psychologically thinkable. However, Meiland suggests that Erdmann’s position is not refuted by this argument. All Erdmann needs to reply is that while all human beings are able to utter the words ‘The Principle of Non-Contradiction is false’, they do not thereby think contrary to the principle or understand what they are saying (1976, 331).
The other central Husserlian objection to Erdmann’s psychologism is that if logical laws were psychological laws, then they would be about mental acts, judgments, ideas and other psychological entities. In other words, logical laws should have real content. But obviously, logical laws have no such real content, and therefore the psychological approach to logic must be false. Again, Meiland provides a defense for Erdmann. While it is true that laws of logic do not refer to human beings and their psychology, they might still be true-for human beings in virtue of their psychology. Put differently, we
must distinguish between what a statement is explicitly about and what it is true in virtue of. The Principle of Non-Contradiction is normally stated without reference to human beings. But it is true for human beings in virtue of their nature, if the psycho-logistic theory is correct (Meiland 1976, 334–35).
Meiland explains this idea by drawing on the relation between gravity and the laws of planetary motion:
Just as the laws of planetary motion are not about gravity but are true in virtue of gravity, so too Erdmann could claim that the laws of logic are not about the mind or about standard psychological properties or of the nature of the mind (Meiland 1976, 334–35).
Despite his spirited defence of Frege’s and Husserl’s favourite whipping boy, Meiland believes that Erdmann’s psychologism must overcome some further difficulties before it can become fully respectable. The main problem is that Erdmann allows for the possibility that the laws of logic could change, that there could be a different logic, a logic that conflicts with our present one. Yet it is hard to see how Erdmann could be entitled to make such claim. On his own premises, our present logic defines the limits of the thinkable. And this can only mean that a radically different logic must be unthinkable for us. Put differently, Erdmann owes us an explanation of how we could ever come to believe that a different logic is possible (1976, 337).
Interestingly enough, the challenge that Meiland directs at Erdmann can be met. Remmel Nunn has suggested that Jerry Fodor’s functionalism provides us with a method for conceptualizing a situation in which an entity is restricted to using one, and only one, set of formal principles even though a different set may be operative under different conditions. According to functionalism humans can be compared to computers. Humans come equipped with a built-in ‘language of thought’, that is, a language that functions like the machine table of a computer. Now a computer is not able to compute formulae that are not among those in the vocabulary of its machine table. But this does not mean that the machine table of any given computer is without alternatives, that ‘there cannot be systems of logical laws which are inconsistent with those of a given automaton’. Thus we can imagine that a given computer is so designed that it systematically makes (what we regard as) a formal mistake M. In this case, the machine would be unable to detect the mistake M, ‘for M would constitute one of the laws by which the automaton detects errors’ (Nunn 1978, 347).
If we adopt some such analogy between humans and computers, Nunn suggests, then we can make sense of the idea that our logic might not be universal. If we think of our logic as being a central part of our language of thought, and if we thus adopt the view that our logic is part of our machine table, then we must accept that our logic might not be unique. True, we cannot state what a radically different logic would look like. However, in order to vindicate Erdmann it is enough that we can — by analogy — make sense of the possibility of such a logic (Nunn 1978, 347).
8. The Continuation of the Story
The prolonged debate in the German-speaking lands over psychologism was eventually brought to an end by World War One. The war brought with it an intellectual climate in which attacks on one’s colleagues were regarded as utterly inappropriate. Moreover, it also lead to a clear division of labor between psychologists and philosophers: while philosophers concentrated on the ideological task of celebrating the German ‘genius of war’, experimental psychology focused on the training and testing of soldiers. After the war, both academic (anti-naturalistic) philosophy and (experimental) psychology had to cope with, and accommodate to, an intellectual environment that was hostile to science, rationality, and systematic knowledge. The project of a scientifically-minded philosophy with experimental psychology as its central pillar quickly lost support. And hence the charge of psychologism could no longer play a central role.
Early twentieth-century German-speaking philosophy exerted of course a powerful and lasting influence on philosophy in many other countries, notably in the Anglo-American world. For a while Frege’s and Husserl’s arguments against antipsychologism even rose to the status of a paradigmatic achievement in philosophy: ‘There is progress in philosophy after all!’ (Musgrave 1972, 606). As I have indicated in the last section, this assessment of antipsychologism is now widely contested.
Other countries of course had their own debates over the relation between psychology and philosophy. In the UK, for instance, George Frederick Stout and James Ward emphasised the philosophical significance of psychology; British Idealists like Francis Herbert Bradley and Brand Blanshard were sympathetic to psychology even though they denied its philosophical credentials; and realists like John Cook Wilson, Bertrand Russell, Herbert Joseph, and Harold Arthur Prichard insisted on a separation. For Prichard, psychology was not even a ‘proper science’ (Passmore 1994).
Throughout the twentieth century, and at the beginning of the twenty-first century, psychology exerted and exerts a powerful pull on philosophers who wish to put philosophy on the sure path of a science. Quine famously called for a return to psychologism in the 1960s. Such calls have kept the psychologism accusation alive. Amongst the accused one can find the names of Rudolf Carnap, Michael Dummett, Peter Geach, Nelson Goodman, Thomas Kuhn, John McDowell, Karl Popper, Wilfrid Sellars, and Ludwig Wittgenstein (Kusch 1995, 7). (For an extensive discussion of naturalistic and psychologistic positions from the perspective on twenty-first-century philosophy of logic, see Pelletier et al. 2008. See also Lehan-Streisel 2012.)
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In composing this entry, I have drawn extensively on my published writings (especially Kusch 1995). I am grateful to the publisher for permission to use this material. I am also grateful to Francis Jeffry Pelletier for helpful comments and suggestions, to Mario Porta and Sonja Rinofner-Kreidl for useful discussions, and to Katharina Kinzel for literature searches.