# Everettian Quantum Mechanics

*First published Wed Jun 3, 1998; substantive revision Tue Jun 20, 2023*

Hugh Everett III proposed solving the quantum measurement problem by adopting pure wave mechanics, the theory one gets by dropping the collapse dynamics from the standard von Neumann formulation of quantum mechanics. Everett’s relative state formulation consists in pure wave mechanics supplemented with a distinction between absolute and relative states, a model of situated observation, and a standard of typicality. His aim was to recapture the predictions of the standard collapse theory by showing that the relative records of a typical situated observer will satisfy the standard quantum statistics. We will consider his theory and several quite different ways of understanding it.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. The Measurement Problem
- 3. Everett’s Deduction
- 4. Empirical Faithfulness
- 5. Four Arguments for the Faithfulness of Pure Wave Mechanics
- 5.1 Experience is found in the relative memory records of observers
- 5.2 Pure wave mechanics predicts that one would not ordinarily notice that there are alternative relative records
- 5.3 The surplus structure of pure wave mechanics is in principle detectable and hence isn’t surplus structure at all
- 5.4 A typical relative sequence of measurement records exhibits the standard quantum statistics

- 6. Empirical Faithfulness and Empirical Adequacy
- 7. Many Worlds
- 8. The Bare Theory and Extensions
- 9. Summary
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

Everett developed his relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics while a graduate student in physics at Princeton University. The short version of his doctoral thesis (1957a) was accepted in March 1957 and a paper (1957b) covering essentially the same material was published in July of the same year. The short version of his thesis was revised from a longer draft thesis that Everett had given John Wheeler, his Ph.D. adviser, in January 1956 under the title “Wave Mechanics Without Probability”. DeWitt and Graham (1973) later published a version of the long thesis in an anthology of papers on Everett’s theory. While Everett always favored the description of the theory as presented in the long thesis, in part because of Bohr’s disapproval of Everett’s critical approach, Wheeler insisted on the revisions that led to the much shorter version that Everett ultimately defended.

Everett took a job outside academics as a defense analyst in the spring of 1956. Subsequent notes and letters indicate that he continued to be interested in the conceptual problems of quantum mechanics and in the reception of his theory, but he did not take an active role in the debates surrounding either. Everett died in 1982. See Byrne (2007) and (2010) for further biographical details and Barrett and Byrne (2012) for an annotated collection of Everett’s papers, notes, and letters regarding quantum mechanics. See also Osnaghi, Freitas, Freire (2009) for an excellent introduction to the history of Everett’s formulation of quantum mechanics.

Everett’s relative state formulation was a direct reaction to the measurement problem faced by the standard von Neumann collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. Everett understood the measurement problem in the context of his own version of the Wigner’s Friend story, a version published four years before Wigner’s (1961). In brief, Everett’s solution to the problem was to drop the collapse postulate from the standard formulation of quantum mechanics then deduce the empirical predictions of the standard collapse theory as the subjective experiences of observers who were themselves modeled as physical systems in the theory. The result was his relative-state interpretation of pure wave mechanics.

In order to understand Everett’s solution to the quantum measurement problem, it is helpful first to understand just what he took the problem to be. We will start with this, then consider his presentation of the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics and the sense in which he took it to solve the quantum measurement problem. We will then consider how one might get a theory that provides a richer account of determinate quantum records and probabilities.

## 2. The Measurement Problem

Everett presented the relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics as a way of avoiding the conceptual problems encountered by the standard von Neumann collapse formulation of quantum mechanics. Everett took the chief problem to be that the standard theory required observers to be treated as external to the system described by the theory. One consequence of this, he thought, was that the theory consequently fails to provide a consistent description the physical universe. Everett distinguished between the standard von Neumann formulation of quantum mechanics and Bohr’s Copenhagen interpretation. He believed that the latter was in an important sense yet less satisfactory as it did not even aim to provide a consistent description of the process of observation (1956, 152–3). We will follow the main argument of Everett’s long thesis starting with the measurement problem as encountered by the standard collapse theory.

The standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics, as Everett understood it, is based on the following principles (von Neumann, 1955):

**Representation of States**: The state of a physical system \(S\) is represented by an element of unit length in a Hilbert space, a complex-valued vector space with an inner product.**Representation of Observables**: Every physical observable \(O\) is represented by a Hermitian operator \(\boldsymbol{O}\) on the Hilbert space representing states, and every Hermitian operator corresponds to some physical observable. Equivalently, the observable \(O\) can be thought of as being represented by the orthonormal basis consisting of the eigenvectors of \(\boldsymbol{O}\).**Standard Interpretation of States**: A system \(S\) has a determinate value for an observable \(O\), and hence determinately has the corresponding physical property, if and only if the state of \(S\) is represented by an eigenvector of \(\boldsymbol{O}\). If so, then one would with certainty get the corresponding eigenvalue as the result of measuring \(O\) of \(S\).**Two Dynamical Laws**:**(a)**Ifis made, then a system \(S\) evolves in a continuous deterministic way according to the linear dynamics, which depends only on the energy properties of the system.**no measurement****(b)**If ais made of \(S\), then the system instantaneously and randomly jumps to an eigenstate of the observable being measured. The probability of each possible post-measurement state is equal to the norm squared of the projection of the initial state onto the final state.**measurement**

Everett referred to the standard von Neumann theory as the “external observation formulation of quantum mechanics” and discussed it in both the long (1956) and short (1957) versions of his thesis (beginning on pages 73 and 175 respectively). While he believed that the standard collapse theory was ultimately unacceptable, he used it as the starting point for his presentation of pure wave mechanics. The latter theory he characterized as the standard collapse theory but without the collapse dynamics (rule 4b). We will briefly consider the roles played by rule (4a) and (4b) and the measurement problem then consider Everett’s discussion of the Wigner’s Friend story and his proposal for replacing the standard theory with pure wave mechanics.

The linear dynamics (rule 4a) plays an essential role in the standard collapse theory. It explains how a system might come to be in a superpositions of different classical states and how two systems may come to be quantum-mechanically entangled, which in turn explains quantum inference effects and quantum nonlocality. But given the standard interpretation of states (rule 3), the linear dynamics cannot on its own explain how measurements yield determinate measurement records that exhibit the standard quantum probabilities. For most initial states, the linear dynamics predicts that a measurement interaction would produce a physical record in an entangled superposition of recording mutually incompatible measurement results, something like state \(\boldsymbol{E}\) below). On the standard interpretation of states, this is not a state where there is any determinate physical record at all. Hence, the collapse dynamics (rule 4b) is apparently essential to how the standard theory explains determinate physical records, and in doing so it also explains why one should expect each physically possible record with the usual quantum probabilities.

The deterministic linear dynamics (rule 4a), then, describes how a
system evolves when there is *no measurement*, and the
stochastic nonlinear dynamics (rule 4b) describes how a system evolves
when there is a *measurement*. Note that the term
*measurement* occurs in the theory as an undefined primitive
term. Without saying what it takes for an interaction to count as a
measurement, the theory is at best incomplete since it does not
indicate when each dynamical law obtains. Further, if one supposes
that observers and their measuring devices are physical systems like
any other (and why wouldn’t they be?), they must also evolve in
a continuous deterministic way, and nothing like the random,
discontinuous evolution described by rule 4b can ever occur. In this
case, stipulating a collapse on measurement yields an immediate
contradiction. This is the quantum measurement problem. See Barrett
(2020) and the section on the measurement problem in the entry on
philosophical issues in quantum theory
for further discussions.

Everett took the standard formulation of quantum mechanics to be
logically inconsistent, and hence untenable, because it did not allow
one to provide a consistent account of nested measurement. He
illustrated the problem in the context of an “amusing, but
*extremely hypothetical* drama” (1956, 74–8), a
story that was famously retold by Eugene Wigner (1961) a few years
later.

Everett’s version of the Wigner’s Friend story involved an observer \(A\) who knows the state function of some system \(S\), and knows that it is not an eigenstate of the observable he is about to measure of it, and an observer \(B\) who is in possession of the state function of the composite system \(A{+}S\). Observer \(A\) believes that the outcome of her measurement on \(S\) will be randomly determined by rule 4b, hence \(A\) attributes to \(A{+}S\) a post-measurement state describing \(A\) as having a determinate measurement record and \(S\) as having collapsed to the corresponding state. Observer \(B\), however, attributes the state function of the room after \(A\)’s measurement according to the rule 4a, hence \(B\) attributes to \(A{+}S\) an entangled state where, according to rule 3, neither \(A\) nor \(S\) even has a determinate quantum-mechanical state of its own. Everett held that since \(A\) and \(B\) make incompatible state attributions to \(A{+}S\), the standard collapse theory commits one to a straightforward contradiction.

It would be extraordinarily difficult in practice to isolate and
control a composite system like \(A{+}S\) in such a way that \(B\)
would be able even to calculate how its state evolves. This is one of
the reasons Everett referred to the drama as “extremely
hypothetical”. But he was also careful to explain why this
practical difficulty was irrelevant to the conceptual problem faced by
the standard theory. Indeed, he explicitly rejected that one might
simply “deny the possibility that \(B\) could ever be in
possession of the state function of \(A{+}S\).” Rather, he
argued, that “no matter what the state of \(A{+}S\) is, there is
in principle a complete set of commuting operators for which it is an
eigenstate, so that, at least, the determination of *these*
quantities will not affect the state nor in any way disrupt the
operation of \(A\),” nor, he added, are there “fundamental
restrictions in the usual theory about the knowability of *any*
state functions.” And he concluded that “it is not
particularly relevant whether or not \(B\) actually *knows* the
precise state function of \(A{+}S\). If he merely *believes*
that the system is described by a state function, which he does not
presume to know, then the difficulty still exists. He must then
believe that this state function changed deterministically, and hence
that there was nothing probabilistic in \(A\)’s
determination” (1956, 76). And, Everett argued, \(B\) is right
in so believing.

It is a key feature of both Everett’s understanding of the
measurement problem and how his own formulation of quantum mechanics
worked that \(B\) might in principle show by means of an interference
measurement that the state resulting from \(A\)’s interaction
with \(S\) was in fact the entangled superposition of incompatible
records predicted by the linear dynamics (a state like
\(\boldsymbol{E}\) below). Indeed, that it is *always* in
principle possible to make such a measurement is why Everett held
every element of the superposition to be real: “It is …
improper to attribute any less validity or ‘reality’ to
any element of a superposition than any other element, due to this
ever present possibility of obtaining interference effects between the
elements. All elements of a superposition must be regarded as
simultaneously existing” (1956, 150).

That Everett took the Wigner’s Friend story, which involves an experiment that would be virtually impossible to perform because of environmental decoherence effects, to pose the central conceptual problem for quantum mechanics is essential to understanding how he thought of the measurement problem and what it would take to solve it. In particular, he held that one only has a satisfactory solution to the quantum measurement problem if one can account for nested measurement in a consistent way. Being able to tell the Wigner’s Friend story in one’s theory is a necessary condition for a satisfactory resolution of the quantum measurement problem.

## 3. Everett’s Deduction

In order to solve the measurement problem, Everett proposed dropping
the collapse dynamics (rule 4b) from the standard collapse theory and
taking the resulting theory to provide a complete and accurate
description of all physical systems at all times. He called the
resultant theory *pure wave mechanics*. Everett believed that
he could deduce the standard statistical predictions of quantum
mechanics, the predictions that depend on rule 4b in the standard
collapse formulation, in terms of the subjective experiences of
observers who are themselves treated as ordinary physical systems
within pure wave mechanics. We will discuss how this deduction was
supposed to work in some detail.

Everett sketched the outline of his deduction in the long thesis:

We shall be able to introduce into [pure wave mechanics] systems which represent observers. Such systems can be conceived as automatically functioning machines (servomechanisms) possessing recording devices (memory) and which are capable of responding to their environment. The behavior of these observers shall always be treated within the framework of wave mechanics. Furthermore, we shall deduce the probabilistic assertions of Process 1 [rule 4b] assubjectiveappearances to such observers, thus placing the theory in correspondence with experience. We are then led to the novel situation in which the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic. While this point of view thus shall ultimately justify our use of the statistical assertions of the orthodox view, it enables us to do so in a logically consistent manner, allowing for the existence of other observers (1956, 77–8).

More specifically, Everett’s goal was to show that the relative records of a typical observer in pure wave mechanics would exhibit the statistical properties predicted by the collapse dynamics. In order to so, he needed to supplement pure wave mechanics with a small handful of background assumptions.

Expressed in the language of his Wigner’s Friend story, Everett insisted on three things: (1) there are no collapses of the quantum-mechanical state, hence observer \(B\) is correct in attributing to \(A{+}S\) a state where observer \(A\) is in an entangled superposition of having recorded mutually incompatible results, (2) there is a sense in which \(A\) nevertheless gets a perfectly determinate measurement record, and (3) typical sequences of such records will satisfy the standard quantum statistics.

The main task in understanding what Everett had in mind is in figuring out precisely how the correspondence between the predictions of the standard collapse theory and those of pure wave mechanics was supposed to work. One problem is that the former theory is stochastic with fundamentally chance events while the latter is deterministic with no mention of probabilities whatsoever. Another is that since an observer like \(A\) will typically fail to have any determinate record on the standard interpretation of states, one needs a new way of understanding the post-measurement state of the composite system \(A{+}S\), a way that provides a sense in which \(A\) might be said to have a determinate measurement record.

Consider measuring the \(x\)-spin of a spin-½ system. Such a system will be found to be either “\(x\)-spin up” or “\(x\)-spin down”. Suppose that \(J\) is a good observer. For Everett, being a good \(x\)-spin observer meant that \(J\) has the following two dispositions, where the arrows below represent the time-evolution of the composite system as described by rule 4a:

\[\begin{align} \tag{1} &|\ldquo\mbox{ready}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S \rightarrow |\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S \\ \tag{2} &|\ldquo\mbox{ready}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S \rightarrow |\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S \end{align}\]So if \(J\) measures a system that is determinately \(x\)-spin up, then \(J\) will determinately record “\(x\)-spin up”; and if \(J\) measures a system that is determinately \(x\)-spin down, then \(J\) will determinately record “\(x\)-spin down”. And in each case we will suppose that the spin of the object system \(S\) is undisturbed by the interaction.

Now consider what happens when \(J\) observes the \(x\)-spin of a system that begins in a superposition of \(x\)-spin eigenstates:

\[\frac{1}{\sqrt{2}}(|\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S + |\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S).\]The initial state of the composite system is:

\[|\ldquo\mbox{ready}\rdquo\rangle_J \frac{1}{\sqrt{2}}(|\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S + |\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S).\]Here \(J\) is determinately ready to make an \(x\)-spin measurement, but the object system \( S\), according to rule 3, has no determinate \(x\)-spin. Given \(J\)’s two dispositions and the fact that the deterministic dynamics (rule 4a) is linear, the state of the composite system after her \(x\)-spin measurement will be:

\[\frac{1}{\sqrt{2}}(|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S + |\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J|\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S).\]Call this state \(\boldsymbol{E}\) . On the standard formulation of quantum mechanics, at some point during the measurement interaction the state collapses resulting in either

\[|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S\]or

\[|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J|\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S,\]each with probability 1/2. In the former case, \(J\) ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin up”, and in the later she ends up with the determinate measurement record “spin down”.

In contrast, no such collapse occurs on Everett’s proposal.
Rather, the post-measurement state of the composite system is
\(\boldsymbol{E}\), the state resulting from the linear dynamics
alone, an entangled superposition of \(J\) recording the result
“spin up” and \(S\) being \(x\)-spin up *and* \(J\)
recording “spin down” and \(S\) being \(x\)-spin down. On
the standard interpretation of states (rule 3), \(\boldsymbol{E}\) is
not a state where \(J\) determinately records “spin up”
nor is it a state where \(J\) determinately records “spin
down”. Indeed, it is not even a state where \(J\) has a
determinate *state* to call her own as the state of the
composite system does not factor.

Further, Everett held that one might, at least in principle, show by means of a Wigner’s Friend interference experiment that the post-measurement state is in fact \(\boldsymbol{E}\). Consider an observable \(\boldsymbol{A}\) of the composite system \(J{+}S\) that has state \(\boldsymbol{E}\) as an eigenstate corresponding to eigenvalue +1 and the orthogonal state

\[\frac{1}{\sqrt{2}}(|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S - |\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J|\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S).\]as an eigenstate corresponding to eigenvalue \(-1.\) If Everett is right and \(\boldsymbol{E}\) is in fact the post-measurement state, then an observation of \(\boldsymbol{A}\) would always yield \(+1.\) But if a collapse occurs in the interaction between \(J\) and \(S,\) then an \(\boldsymbol{A}\)-measurement might yield \(+1\) or \(-1,\) each with probability 1/2 since the post-measurement collapsed states are at 45 degree angles to the rays containing the eigenstates of \(\boldsymbol{A}\).

By insisting that \(\boldsymbol{E}\) was in fact the post-measurement
state of the composite system, Everett faced two problems. The
*determinate-record problem* required him to explain how this
state is compatible with observer \(J\) having a determinate
measurement record. And the *probability problem* required him
to recover, in some sense, the standard quantum probabilities for such
determinate records.

### 3.1 Determinate Records

Everett appealed to a principle he called the *fundamental
relativity of states* to distinguish between absolute and relative
states:

There does not, in general, exist anything like a single state for one subsystem of a composite system. Subsystems do not possess states that are independent of the states of the remainder of the system, so that the subsystem states are generallycorrelatedwith one another. One can arbitrarily choose a state for one subsystem, and be led to the relative state for the remainder. Thus we are faced with a fundamentalrelativity of states, which is implied by the formalism of composite systems. It is meaningless to ask the absolute state of a subsystem—one can only ask the state relative to a given state of the remainder of the subsystem. (1956, 103; 1957, 180)

The distinction between absolute and relative states allows for a richer interpretation of states than that provided by rule 3 alone. Namely, it provides a relative state in the post-measurement absolute state on which a relative observer’s determinate measurement record might supervene.

While the absolute state \(\boldsymbol{E}\) is one where \(J\) has no
determinate absolute record and \(S\) has no determinate absolute
\(x\)-spin, \(J\) records “\(x\)-spin up” *relative
to* \(S\) being \(x\)-spin up and \(J\) records “\(x\)-spin
down” *relative to* \(S\) being \(x\)-spin down. Everett
associates an observer’s experience with her relative
records:

Let one regard an observer as a subsystem of the composite system: observer + object-system. It is then an inescapable consequence that after the interaction has taken place there will not, generally, exist a single observer state. There will, however, be a superposition of the composite system states, each element of which contains a definite observer state and a definite relative object-system state. Furthermore, as we shall see,eachof these relative object system states will be, approximately, the eigenstates of the observation corresponding to the value obtained by the observer which is described by the same element of the superposition. Thus, each element of the resulting superposition describes an observer who perceived a definite and generally different result, and to whom it appears that the object-system state has been transformed into the corresponding eigenstate. (1956, 78).

Each relative observer then has a determinate relative record. That is, each element or branch of \(\boldsymbol{E}\) describes a relative observer with a corresponding determinate relative measurement record. The sense in which this accounts for our experience is given by Everett’s notion of empirical faithfulness, something we will discuss after laying the groundwork for his account for quantum probabilities.

### 3.2 Probabilities

Everett sought to address the probability problem by showing that a
typical sequence of relative records will exhibit the standard quantum
statistics. To show that records in typical branches exhibit the
standard quantum statistics he needed a typicality measure over
branches, something that is not given by pure wave mechanics itself.
As he put the point, “In order to make quantitative statements
about the relative frequencies of the different possible results of
observation which are recorded in the memory of a typical observer we
must have a method of selecting a *typical* observer”
(1956, 124).

Everett introduced his typicality measure by imposing a sequence of formal constraints until a measure was uniquely determined. In particular, he required that the typicality measure \(m\) (1) satisfy the standard axioms for being a probability measure, (2) be a positive function of the complex-valued coefficients associated with the branches of the superposition, and (3) satisfy a sub-branch additivity condition to ensure that the sum of the measures on branches are equal to the measure on the initial ancestor branch before branching. Together, he took these constraints to determine \(m\) to be the norm-squared-amplitude measure over branches. See Everett (1956, 123–8) and (1957, 188–93) and Barrett and Byrne (2012, 274–5) for his description of his typicality measure, how he justified it, and how he intended for it to work in his account of quantum statistics.

Consider state \(\boldsymbol{E}\) above. Here \(m\) assigns measure
1/2 to the first branch and measure 1/2 to the second branch. While
\(m\) assigns a measure to each branch equal to the probability that
would be assigned to the corresponding outcome on the standard
collapse theory, \(m\) is a *typically measure* and hence says
nothing whatsoever regarding the *probability* of the
alternative measurement outcomes. Indeed, inasmuch as he took all
branches to be equally actual, Everett took the probability associated
with each branch to be one. While the typicality measure is *across
branches*, the subjective appearance of quantum probabilities was
to be explained by the sequence of records *within a typical
branch*.

The setup for Everett’s argument went as follows. Consider a measuring device M that is ready to make and record an infinite series of measurements on each of an infinite series of systems \(S_k\) each in state:

\[\alpha |\!\uparrow_x\rangle_{S_k} + \beta |\!\downarrow_x\rangle_{S_k}.\]Suppose that M interacts with each system in turn and perfectly correlates its \(k\)th memory register with the \(x\)-spin of system \(S_k\) by the linear dynamics. This will produce an increasingly complicated entangled superposition of different sequences of measurement outcomes. After one measurement, the state of M and \(S_1\) will be:

\[\alpha |\ldquo{\uparrow}\rdquo\rangle_M |\!\uparrow\rangle_{S_1} + \beta |\ldquo{\downarrow}\rdquo\rangle_M |\!\downarrow\rangle_{S_1}.\]After two measurements, the state of M, \(S_1\), and \(S_2\) will be

\[\begin{aligned} \alpha^2 |\ldquo{\uparrow\uparrow}\rdquo\rangle_M |\!\uparrow\rangle_{S_1} |\!\uparrow\rangle_{S_2} &+ \alpha\beta |\ldquo{\uparrow\downarrow}\rdquo\rangle_M |\!\uparrow\rangle_{S_1} |\!\downarrow\rangle_{S_2} \\ &+ \beta\alpha |\ldquo{\downarrow\uparrow}\rdquo\rangle_M |\!\downarrow\rangle_{S_1} |\!\uparrow\rangle_{S_2} + \beta^2 |\ldquo{\downarrow\downarrow}\rdquo\rangle_M |\!\downarrow\rangle_{S_1} |\!\downarrow_x\rangle_{S_2}. \end{aligned}\]Here there are four branches, and again the typically measure for each branch is the norm-squared of the associated amplitude. After \(k\) measurements in the present case there will be \(2^k\) terms representing all possible sequences of records.

Within this framework, Everett argued that in the limit as the number of measurements gets large, almost all branches in measure \(m\) will describe sequences of measurement records that are randomly distributed with the standard quantum statistics. While he just sketched the corresponding results, one can show that:

**Relative Frequency**: For any \(\delta>0\) and \(\epsilon>0\), there exists a \(k\) such that after \(k\) measurements the sum of the norm-squared of the amplitude associated with each branch where the distribution of spin-up results is within \(\epsilon\) of \(|\alpha|^2\) and the distribution of spin-down results is within \(\epsilon\) of \(|\beta|^2\) is within \(\delta\) of one.

and

**Randomness**: The sum of the norm-squared of the
amplitude associated with each branch where the sequence of relative
records satisfies any standard criterion for being random goes to one
as the number of measurements gets large. This result holds for any
criterion of randomness that classifies at most a countable number of
\(\omega\)-length binary sequences as nonrandom.

See Hartle (1968), Farhi, Goldstone, and Gutmann (1989), Barrett (1999), and Barrett and Goldbring (2022) for proofs of the first limiting result and the last two references for proofs of the second.

It is an immediate consequence that the records of a typical relative observer, in the special measure \(m\) sense of typical, will exhibit the standard quantum statistics as the number of measurements gets large. As Everett put it:

In the language of subjective experience, the observer which is described by a typical element … of the superposition has perceived an apparently random sequence of definite results for the observations.… It will thus appear to the observer which is described by a typical element of the superposition that each initial observation on a system caused the system to “jump“ into an eigenstate in a random fashion and thereafter remain there for subsequent measurements on the same system. Therefore, qualitatively, at least, the probabilistic assertions of Process 1 [the collapse of the state under rule 4b]appearto be valid to the observer described by a typical element of the final superposition. (1956, 123)

More generally, he concluded that “the memory sequence of a typical element of [the superposition] has all the characteristics of a random sequence, with individual, independent … probabilities“ (1956, 127). Hence, a typical sequence of relative measurement records will exhibit the standard quantum statistics and thus appear to have been produced by Process 1 (rule 4b). And that is Everett’s full deduction of quantum probabilities as subjective appearances to a typical relative observer.

Everett was careful to explain that the typicality measure over branches involved no reference to probability (1956, 79). While he sometimes used the language of probability theory, he explained that this was only for ease of exposition, and he repeatedly instructed the reader that all talk of probabilities should be translated back to talk of typicalities (1956, 127 and 1957, 193). That he did not aim to deduce probabilities over branches corresponding to alternative measurement outcomes is something that distinguishes Everett’s approach from most other formulations of quantum mechanics, including those of many Everettians.

Why showing that a typical sequence of relative measurement records will exhibit the standard quantum statistics is supposed to be enough to explain our experience turns on Everett’s understanding of empirical faithfulness.

## 4. Empirical Faithfulness

When the physicist Bryce DeWitt read Everett’s description of pure wave mechanics in the long version of his PhD thesis, DeWitt objected on the grounds that the surplus structure of the theory made it too rich to represent the world we experience. In his 7 May 1957 letter to Everett’s advisor John Wheeler, DeWitt wrote

I do agree that the scheme which Everett sets up is beautifully consistent; that any single one of the [relative memory states of an observer] … gives an excellent representation of a typical memory configuration, with no causal or logical contradictions, and with “built-in” statistical features. The whole state vector …, however, is simply too rich in content, by vast orders of magnitude, to serve as a representation of the physical world. It contains all possible branches in it at the same time. In the real physical world we must be content with just one branch. Everett’s world and the real physical world are therefore not isomorphic. (Barrett and Byrne 2012, 246–7)

The worry was that the richness of pure wave mechanics indicated an empirical flaw in the theory because we do not notice other branches. As DeWitt put it:

The trajectory of the memory configuration of a real observer … doesnotbranch. I can testify to this from personal introspection, as can you. I simply donotbranch. (Barrett and Byrne 2012, 246)

Wheeler showed Everett the letter and told him to reply. In his 31 May 1957 letter to DeWitt, Everett began by summarizing his understanding of the proper cognitive status of physical theories:

First, I must say a few words to clarify my conception of the nature and purpose of physical theories in general. To me, any physical theory is a logical construct (model), consisting of symbols and rules fortheirmanipulation,someof whose elements are associated with elements of the perceived world. If this association is an isomorphism (or at least a homomorphism) we can speak of the theory as correct, or asfaithful. The fundamental requirements of any theory are logical consistency and correctness in this sense. Barrett and Byrne (2012, 253)

In a subsequent version of the long thesis, Everett further explained
that “[t]he word *homomorphism* would be technically more
correct, since there may not be a one-one correspondence between the
model and the external world” (1956, 169). The map is a
homomorphism because (1) there may be elements of the theory that do
not directly correspond to experience and because (2) a particular
theory may not seek to explain all of experience. As indicated by the
italicized *some* in the quotation above, the first point is
particularly important in the case of pure wave mechanics.
Specifically, that the relative records on the vast majority of
branches of the absolute state *do not* correspond with our
experience did not worry Everett at all, even when these records
represent empirical structure.

Everett further described how he understood the aim of physical
inquiry in his letter to DeWitt, “There can be no question of
which theory is ‘true’ or ‘real’ — the
best that one can do is reject those theories which are *not*
isomorphic to sense experience” Barrett and Byrne (2012, 253).
In all, Everett’s position was in some ways strikingly similar
to Bas van Fraassen’s (1980) later constructive empiricism
except that most of the empirical structure of pure wave mechanics is
irrelevant to one’s actual experience. See Barrett (2011a) for
an extended discussion of Everett’s notion of faithfulness.

For Everett, then, the relative-state formulation of pure wave
mechanics is *empirically faithful* because there is a
particular sort of homomorphism between its model and the world as
experienced. Namely, it is because one can find a modeled
observer’s experience in a *typical relative sequence* of
her physical records. But the sense in which he finds finds an
observer’s experience in his model of pure wave mechanics is
such that it makes it difficult to judge the theory as empirically
adequate over quantum probabilities. We will review four distinct
features of empirical faithfulness which Everett argued for then
return to the question of empirical adequacy.

## 5. Four Arguments for the Faithfulness of Pure Wave Mechanics

The relative state formulation of pure wave mechanics clearly satisfies Everett’s condition of logical consistency. There are four lines of argument that explain why he also took it to be empirically faithful and hence empirically acceptable.

### 5.1 Experience is found in the relative memory records of observers

Everett held that one can find our actual experience in the model of
pure wave mechanics as relative measurement records associated with
observers modeled as ordinary physical systems. In the state
\(\boldsymbol{E}\) above, since \(J\) has a different relative
measurement record in each branch and since these relative records
span the space of possible outcomes, regardless of what result is in
fact experienced, one will be able to find that experience *as a
relative record* of the modeled observer in the post-measurement
state.

Further, if one performs a sequence of measurements, it follows from
the linearity of the dynamics and Everett’s physical model of an
observer that every physically possible sequence of determinate
measurement results will be represented in the entangled
post-measurement state as a relative sequence of determinate
measurement records. This is also true if one only relatively, rather
than absolutely, makes a sequence of observations. In this precise
sense, then, it is possible to find our experience as *sequences of
relative records* in the model of pure wave mechanics.

Everett took such relative records to be sufficient to explain the subjective appearances of observers because, at least for an ideal measurement, every post-measurement relative state will be one where the observer in fact has, and, as we will see in the next section, would report that she has, a fully determinate, repeatable measurement record that agrees with the records of other ideal observers. As he explained the point, the system states observed by a relative observer are typically eigenstates of the observable being measured (1957, 188). For further discussion of this point see Everett (1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956 121–3 and 130–3), and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5).

Note that he did not require a physically preferred basis to show that
pure wave mechanics was empirically faithful. The principle of the
fundamental relatively of states explicitly allows for arbitrarily
specified decompositions of the absolute universal state into relative
states. Given his understanding of empirical faithfulness, all he
needed to explain a particular actual record was to show that is that
there is *some* decomposition of the state that represents the
modeled observer with the corresponding relative record. It is there
that he finds the records corresponding to an observer’s
experience in his model.

### 5.2 Pure wave mechanics predicts that one would not ordinarily notice that there are alternative relative records

Everett believed that he could also explain why the surplus empirical
structure of pure wave mechanics would go unnoticed. In his reply to
DeWitt, he claimed that pure wave mechanics “is in full accord
with our experience (at least insofar as ordinary quantum mechanics
is) … just because it *is* possible to show that no
observer would ever be aware of any ‘branching,’ which is
alien to our experience as you point out” Barrett and Byrne
(2012, 254).

There are two arguments that Everett may have had in mind.

The first is not one that Everett highlighted, but he clearly recognized the point. One would only notice macroscopic splitting if one had access to records of macroscopic splitting events. Specifically, one would need to show that there are branches where one’s macroscopic measurement devices have different macroscopic measurement records for the same measurement. This would require one to perform something akin to a Wigner’s Friend interference measurement on a macroscopic system in an entangled superposition of record states that shows that it is. But as Everett indicated in his characterization of his Wigner Friend drama as “extremely hypothetical,” such an experiment would be extraordinarily difficult. The upshot is that, while not impossible, one should not expect to find reliable interference records indicating that there are branches corresponding to alternative macroscopic measurement records.

The second is a point to which Everett repeatedly returned in his
deductions of the subjective experience of modeled observers in both
the long and short thesis. Namely, it follows directly from the linear
dynamics that it would *appear* to an ideal agent that she had
fully determinate measurement results. Albert and Loewer (1988)
presented a dispositional version of this line of argument in their
presentation of the bare theory, a version of pure wave mechanics, as
a way of understanding Everett’s formulation of quantum
mechanics.

The idea is that if there is no collapse of the quantum-mechanical
state, an ideal modeled observer like \(J\) would have the sure-fire
disposition *falsely* to report and hence to believe that she
had a perfectly ordinary, fully sharp and determinate measurement
record. The trick is to consider not what result the observer got, but
rather whether she believes that she got *some* specific
determinate result. If the post-measurement state was:

then \(J\) would report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down” and presumably so believe. And she would make precisely the same report and believe that she got a determinate result if she ended up in the post-measurement state:

\[|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S\]
So, by the linearity of the dynamics, \(J\) would *falsely*
report “I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin
down” and believe that she got a determinate result when in
post-measurement state \(\boldsymbol{E}\):

Thus, insofar as her beliefs agree with her sure-fire dispositions to
report that she got a fully determinate result, it would seem to \(J\)
that she got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even
when she did not. That is, she does not determinately believe that she
got “spin up”, and she does not determinately believe that
she got “spin down”, but she does determinately believe
that she got “*either* spin up or spin down.”

So, while *which result* \(J\) got in state \(\boldsymbol{e}\)
is a relative fact, that it would appear to \(J\) that she got
*some determinate result* is an absolute fact. See Everett
(1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956, 121–3 and 130–3),
and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5), Albert and Loewer (1988),
Albert (1992), and Barrett (1999) and (2020) for further details. We
will return to a discussion of the bare theory later in this article
and consider that theory on its own terms. For present purposes, the
determinate result property illustrates why an observer would not
report or notice that she had branched.

### 5.3 The surplus structure of pure wave mechanics is in principle detectable and hence isn’t surplus structure at all

Everett insisted that alternative relative states, even relative states of macroscopically distinct records, were always at least in principle detectable by means of something like the Wigner’s Friend \(A\)-measurement discussed above. This was Everett’s point in insisting that “due to the ever present possibility of obtaining interference effects between the elements, all elements of a superposition must be regarded as simultaneously existing” (1956, 150). So while extremely difficult to detect, alternative relative records are all equally real since the linear dynamics requires that it be always in principle possible to measure an observable that would detect other branches. And since they are in principle detectable, they do not represent surplus structure.

Note that this does not mean that only the branches in a single physically preferred basis are real. It means that every branch in every decomposition of a the state of a system is real in precisely the same sense as its presence entails in principle observational consequences. That Everett considered alternative branches of the universal wave function to be always in principle detectable represents a significant difference between his formulation of quantum mechanics and a many-worlds theory where worlds are supposed to be causally isolated.

### 5.4 A typical relative sequence of measurement records exhibits the standard quantum statistics

Everett did not solve the probability problem by finding probabilities
in pure wave mechanics. Rather, he repeatedly insisted that there were
no probabilities and took this to be an essential feature of the
theory. What he did, rather, was to show that a *typical relative
sequence* of a modeled observer’s measurement records will
exhibit the standard quantum statistics.

As we saw above, Everett got this result in two steps. First, he found
a suitable measure of typicality over relative states \(m\) whose
value is fully determined by the model of pure wave mechanics. Then he
showed that, in the limit as the number of measurement interactions
gets large, almost all relative sequences of measurement records, in
the sense of *almost all* given by \(m\), will exhibit the
standard quantum statistics. While the typicality measure \(m\) is
*across branches*, he explained the subjective appearance of
quantum probabilities by the sequence of records *within a typical
branch*.

Everett summarized his strategy and main result to a group a physicists at a conference on the foundations of quantum mechanics at Xavier University in October of 1962:

Now, I would like to assert that, for a “typical” branch, the frequency of results will be precisely what is predicted by ordinary quantum mechanics. Even more strongly, I would like to assert that, as the number of observations goes to infinity, almost all branches will contain frequencies of results in accord with ordinary quantum theory predictions. To be able to make a statement like this requires that there be some sort of a measure on the superposition of states. What I need, therefore, is a measure that I can put on a sum of orthogonal states. There is one consistency [criterion] which would be required for such a thing. Since my states are constantly branching, I must insist that the measure on a state originally is equal to the sum of the measures on the separate branches after a branching process. Now this consistency criterion can be shown to lead directly to the squared amplitude of the coefficient, as the unique measure which satisfies this. With this unique measure, deduced only from a consistency condition, I can then assert: indeed, for almost all (in the measure theoretical sense) elements of a very large superposition, the predictions of ordinary quantum mechanics hold. (Barrett and Byrne 2012, 274–75)

Importantly, it is usually not the case that most relative sequences
*by count* will exhibit the standard quantum statistics. This
is why the norm squared coefficient measure \(m\) is essential to
Everett’s account.

Regarding Everett’s summary of his project, there are two closely related points worth noting. First, his sub-branch additivity condition is not required for simple consistency. This can be seen by the fact that a proportional counting measure over descendent branches would have been perfectly consistent. It just wouldn’t have entailed that a typical branch will exhibit the standard quantum statistics. Second, as he acknowledged in this thesis, he needed more than just sub-branch additivity to get the squared amplitude measure \(m\). He also needed \(m\) to be a positive linear function of the complex-valued coefficients associated with each branch, and he needed to suppose that \(m\) satisfied the standard axioms for being a probability measure. See Everett (1956, 120–30) and (1957, 186–94) and Barrett (2017) and (2020) for discussions of typicality and quantum statistics in pure wave mechanics.

It is an immediate consequence of Everett’s deduction that that
if one were to further assume that one should expect one’s
records to be typical in the sense provided by measure \(m\), then one
should expect one’s records to exhibit the standard quantum
statistics. Were such an assumption added to his formulation of pure
wave mechanics, something that Everett himself never proposed, then
one would be able to explain why one should *expect* to find
oneself at each time with records that appear to have been generated
by a random process like rule 4b. But one cannot get even this, let
alone standard forward-looking quantum probabilities, without
supplementing pure wave mechanics with auxiliary assumptions that tie
the measure \(m\) to one’s probabilistic expectations. Such
auxiliary assumptions would clearly represent significant additions to
pure wave mechanics.

For his part, Everett just argued that the sequence of records in a typical branch, in his specified sense of typical, would satisfy the standard quantum statistics. And it was this that he took to establish that his relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics was empirically faithful and hence empirically acceptable.

## 6. Empirical Faithfulness and Empirical Adequacy

Everett took pure wave mechanics to empirically faithful because (1) one can find an observer’s experience in the relative records of the observer as modeled in the theory and (2) pure wave mechanics provides something that one can take as a typicality measure over relative states such that a typical relative sequence of measurement records in that measure will exhibit the standard quantum statistics. The first is Everett’s resolution of the determinate record problem, and the second is his resolution of the probability problem. That said, one might want more than empirical faithfulness from a satisfactory formulation of quantum mechanics.

That empirical faithfulness is a weak standard of empirical adequacy
is illustrated in what Everett’s formulation of pure wave
mechanics does not explain about our experience. It does not explain
what it is about the physical world that makes it appropriate to
*expect* one’s relative sequence of records to be typical
in the norm-squared-coefficient sense, or in any other sense, at a
time. Nor does it explain why one should expect alternative
*future* measurement results with the standard quantum
probabilities. The lack of both synchronic and forward-looking
probabilities means that Everett did not deduce the probabilistic
predictions of rule 4b as subjective appearances to his modeled
observers. It also illustrates the need for relatively strong
auxiliary assumptions in order to derive anything like the standard
quantum predictions from pure wave mechanics.

The upshot is that while the relative state formulation of pure wave mechanics is logically consistent and empirically faithful in a sense that Everett thought sufficient, it does not make the standard probabilistic predictions of quantum mechanics for even simple experiments and, hence, fails to be empirically adequate in any standard sense. There is a long tradition of supplementing pure wave mechanics with yet stronger auxiliary assumptions in order to get a theory that one might take to be straightforwardly empirically adequate. This is the aim of the various many-worlds reconstructions of Everett’s relative state formulation.

## 7. Many Worlds

While he was initially skeptical of Everett’s project, DeWitt became an ardent proponent of the many-worlds interpretation, a theory that DeWitt presented as the EWG interpretation of quantum mechanics (named after Everett, Wheeler, and DeWitt’s graduate student R. Neill Graham). In his description of the many-worlds interpretation, DeWitt (1970) emphasized that its central feature was the metaphysical commitment to physically splitting worlds. DeWitt’s description subsequently became the most popular understanding of Everett’s theory. See Barrett (2011b) for a discussion of Everett’s historical attitude toward DeWitt and the many-worlds interpretation. See Lewis (2016), Saunders, Barrett, Kent, and Wallace (eds) (2010), Vaidman (2012), Wallace (2010a) (2010b) (2012), Sebens (2015), Sebens and Carroll (2018), and the entry many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics for discussions of a number of quite different many-worlds interpretations.

DeWitt described his theory in the context of the Schrödinger’s cat thought experiment.

The animal [is] trapped in a room together with a Geiger counter and a hammer, which, upon discharge of the counter, smashes a flask of prussic acid. The counter contains a trace of radioactive material—just enough that in one hour there is a 50% chance one of the nuclei will decay and therefore an equal chance the cat will be poisoned. At the end of the hour the total wave function for the system will have a form in which the living cat and the dead cat are mixed in equal portions. Schrödinger felt that the wave mechanics that led to this paradox presented an unacceptable description of reality. However, Everett, Wheeler and Graham’s interpretation of quantum mechanics pictures the cats as inhabiting two simultaneous, noninteracting, but equally real worlds. (1970, 31)

DeWitt took this view to follow from “the mathematical formalism of quantum mechanics as it stands without adding anything to it.” More specifically, he claimed that EWG had proven a metatheorem that the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics interprets itself:

Without drawing on any external metaphysics or mathematics other than the standard rules of logic, EWG are able, from these postulates, to prove the following metatheorem: The mathematical formalism of the quantum theory is capable of yielding its own interpretation. (1970, 33)

He gave Everett credit for the metatheorem, Wheeler credit for encouraging Everett, and Graham credit for clarifying the metatheorem. DeWitt and Graham later described Everett’s formulation of quantum mechanics as follows:

[It] denies the existence of a separate classical realm and asserts that it makes sense to talk about a state vector for the whole universe. This state vector never collapses and hence reality as a whole is rigorously deterministic. This reality, which is describedjointlyby the dynamical variables and the state vector, is not the reality we customarily think of, but is a reality composed of many worlds. By virtue of the temporal development of the dynamical variables the state vector decomposes naturally into orthogonal vectors, reflecting a continual splitting of the universe into a multitude of mutually unobservable but equally real worlds, in each of which every good measurement has yielded a definite result and in most of which the familiar statistical quantum laws hold (1973, v).

The metaphysics of splitting worlds immediately addresses the determinate result problem. As DeWitt notes, after an observer makes a measurement, each resultant copy of the observer will inhabit a physical world described by a branch of the global state and endowed with with a fully determinate physical record. But inasmuch as the pre-measurement observer can expect to find herself in each post-measurement world, there remains a problem accounting for the standard quantum probabilities. It appears that the forward-looking probability of each possible measurement result is precisely one. We will return to this issue in a moment.

There is a conceptual cost in getting determinate measurement records by stipulating splitting worlds. DeWitt conceded that he had found the constant splitting of worlds whenever the states of systems become correlated to be strongly counterintuitive:

I still recall vividly the shock I experienced on first encountering this multiworld concept. The idea of \(10^{100}\) slightly imperfect copies of oneself all constantly splitting into further copies, which ultimately become unrecognizable, is not easy to reconcile with common sense. Here is schizophrenia with a vengeance (1973, 161).

That said, DeWitt promoted the theory at every turn, and Everett’s views quickly came to be identified with DeWitt and Graham’s many-worlds interpretation. It is instructive to consider how DeWitt’s views differ from Everett’s.

To begin, since purely mathematical postulates entail only purely mathematical theorems, one cannot deduce any metaphysical commitments whatsoever regarding the physical world from the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics alone. The formalism of pure wave mechanics might entail the sort of commitments that DeWitt envisioned but only if supplemented with sufficiently strong auxiliary assumptions. For his part, Everett seems to have clearly understood this this point. Concerning DeWitt’s claim that pure wave mechanics somehow interprets itself by way of a metatheorem that Everett proved, there is nothing answering to DeWitt’s description of this metatheorem in either Everett’s long or short thesis.

Further, contrary to what DeWitt, Graham, and others have supposed,
Everett was never committed to “mutually unobservable
worlds.” In contrast, as we have seen, Everett held that it is
always in principle possible for branches to interact. In this regard,
he argued that “no matter what the state of [the observer in
Everett’s version of the Wigner’s Friend story] is, there
is in principle a complete set of commuting operators for which it is
an eigenstate, so that, at least, the determination of *these*
quantities will not affect the state nor in any way.” He also
denied that there are fundamental restrictions about the
“knowability of *any* state functions.” And he
believed that the sense in which all branches of the global state are
equally actual is given by the ever present possibility of interaction
between branches.

In identifying Everett’s theory with Graham’s many-world reconstruction there is good reason to believe that DeWitt simply failed to understand Everett. We know what Everett thought of DeWitt and Graham’s formulation of the theory. In his personal copy of DeWitt’s description of the many-worlds interpretation, Everett wrote the word “bullshit” next to the passage where DeWitt presented Graham’s discussion of the branching process and Everett’s typicality measure. See Barrett and Byrne 2012, 364–6 for scans of Everett’s handwritten marginal notes.

Finally, Everett carefully avoided the metaphysical talk of worlds. Rather, his understanding of the reality of branches was operational. For Everett there was no canonical basis. Given how he understood branches and their role in determining the empirical faithfulness of the theory, he had no need of a physically preferred basis. He believed that it was sufficient if one could find our experience in a modeled observer’s typical relative records. In contrast, DeWitt seems to have had in mind a canonically preferred basis that would determine what worlds there are and their state.

While Everett himself did not do so, one might designate a special set of branches of the global absolute state to represent worlds, or emergent worlds, or approximate emergent worlds. But there are many ways one might do this, and how one understands such worlds cannot be determined solely by the mathematical formalism of pure wave mechanics alone. Easily the most popular sort of many-worlds theory at present characterizes approximate emergent worlds in terms of decoherence conditions.

In contrast with DeWitt, who appears to have taken worlds to be basic entities described by the global absolute state, David Wallace (2002, 2010a, 2010b, and 2012) takes the global quantum state as basic, then seeks to characterize worlds as emergent entities represented in its structure. The analogy he gives is that pure wave mechanics describes the quantum state just as classical field theory describes physical fields (2010a, 69). Worlds are understood as physically real but contingently emergent entities that are identified with approximate substructures of the quantum state, or as Wallace puts it, “mutually dynamically isolated structures instantiated within the quantum state, which are structurally and dynamically ‘quasiclassical’” (2010a, 70). Since the fundamental theory is supposed to be pure wave mechanics, such emergent worlds will be more or less well-defined and more and less well-isolated on the linear dynamics depending on details of the physical situation and the level of description one considers.

On Wallace’s account, there is no simple matter of fact
concerning what, or even how many, emergent worlds there are. Such
questions depend on one’s level of description and on how
well-isolated one requires worlds to be for the explanatory
considerations at hand. That said, the decohering worlds approach
provides *something* that is characterized by the evolution of
the global state on which alternative measurement records might
supervene. In this case, one need not stipulate a physically preferred
basis as it is decoherence conditions that individuate alternative
quasi-determinate worlds at a given level of description. One gets a
determinate measurement result because, at a level of description
appropriate for characterizing the properties of macroscopic systems,
one in fact inhabits an emergent world containing a determinate
record.

There remains, however, the problem of accounting for standard quantum probabilities. Taking the decision-theoretic approach of David Deutsch (1997, 1999) as a starting point, Wallace (2010b) proves a representation theorem from ten constraints on the preferences of a rational agent in the context of a world described by pure wave mechanics. If an agent acts as required by these constraints, she will act as if she expects future events with the standard quantum probabilities. Wallace understands these constraints as basic principles of reason, but inasmuch as they only make sense in the context of pure wave mechanics, they are perhaps best understood as auxiliary assumptions that, in conjunction with pure wave mechanics, explain why an agent might act as if the standard quantum probabilities held when in fact every physically possible outcome of her actions is fully realized. There is, of course, nothing wrong with supplementing pure wave mechanics with whatever auxiliary assumptions one needs to derive a suitable version of the standard quantum probabilities. See Wallace (2003, 2006, 2007, 2010b, and 2012) and Greaves (2006) for further discussions of quantum probabilities and epistemology on a decision-theoretic approach to pure wave mechanics.

Granting such auxiliary assumptions, making sense of standard forward
looking quantum probabilities requires further care. Before making an
observation, an observer knows that every physically possible
measurement result will certainly occur. One wants to say that she
will expect to find herself in each resulting world with the standard
quantum probabilities after the measurement interaction, but if there
is just one pre-measurement observer, then inasmuch as she gets any
result at all, she will get every possible result. One way around this
is to suppose that for every post-measurement observer there is
already a corresponding pre-measurement observer. Each of these
pre-measurement observers is unsure which post-measurement observer is
her future self. Forward looking quantum probabilities represent this
epistemic uncertainty. On this strategy, then, one seeks to add
auxiliary assumptions to pure wave mechanics sufficient to provide
standard forward-looking quantum probabilities as epistemic
self-location probabilities concerning which *full history*
characterizes one’s experience. If one is successful, the
resultant theory might be taken to be empirically adequate in a
perfectly ordinary sense. Saunders and Wallace’s (2008a, 2008b)
divergent worlds account and Barrett’s (1999) many-threads
theory seek to exploit this strategy. See Lewis (2016) for a critical
examination of the divergent worlds approach to forward looking
probabilities. See Saunders, Barrett, Kent, and Wallace (2010) and the
entry on the
many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics
for other approaches to getting synchronic and, in some cases,
forward-looking self-location probabilities.

## 8. The Bare Theory and Extensions

### 8.1 The Bare Theory

The *bare theory* is pure wave mechanics with the standard
interpretation of states (rule 3). This approach takes seriously
Everett’s proposal of simply dropping the collapse dynamics
(rule 4b) from the standard theory then try to derive the standard
theory’s predictions as subjective experiences from the
resulting theory. Inasmuch as the bare theory is arguably identical to
pure wave mechanics, studying it is a good way to assess the virtues
and vices of Everett’s proposal. It is also a good first step in
figuring out what auxiliary assumptions are needed in order to get a
straightforward account of determinate records and forward-looking
quantum probabilities starting from pure wave mechanics. See Albert
and Loewer (1988), Albert (1992), and Barrett (1994) for a description
of the bare theory and Geroch (1984) for a similar reading of
Everett.

On the bare theory there is no distinction between absolute and
relative states nor is there any special notion of typicality. Rather,
one uses Everett’s model of an idealized observer to argue that
it would *appear* to such observers that they had the perfectly
determinate measurement outcomes predicted by the collapse dynamics
when they in fact did not. The thought is that this is one way of
capturing Everett’s goal of deducing the standard predictions of
quantum mechanics as the subjective appearances of observers who are
themselves treated within the theory. We have already seen the basic
argument in section 5.2. We will start by briefly reviewing how it
goes in a slightly more general setup.

Since \(J\) would report that she had a determinate result in post-measurement state:

\[|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S\]and would report that she had a determinate result in post-measurement state:

\[|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S\]\(J\) would, by the linearity of the dynamics, also report that she got a perfectly determinate result, either spin up or spin down, in the post-measurement state \(J\) gets when observing \(S\) in state

\[ \alpha|\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S + \beta|\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S.\]Assuming that she perfectly correlates her record with the \(x\)-spin of \(S\) in a way that does not disturb its spin, then on the linear dynamics (rule 4a), the resultant post-measurement state in this case is

\[\alpha|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S + \beta|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J|\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S.\]
If asked in this state \(J\) would be in a superposition of reporting
“I got a determinate result, either spin up or spin down”
in the first branch and reporting “I got a determinate result,
either spin up or spin down” in the second branch, which is an
eigenstate of reporting “I got a determinate result, either spin
up or spin down.” Hence, if we assume that her reports are in
fact true of her experience, it would *appear* to \(J\) that
she got a perfectly determinate ordinary measurement result even when
she did not determinately get “spin up” and she did not
determinately get “spin down”. One might think of this as
a *disjunctive experience*. The disjunctive experience is not
an experience of either ordinary determinate result, but it is one
where the observer is convinced that her result is
“determinately spin up *or* determinately spin
down”.

One can similarly argue from the linear dynamics and the properties of an ideal observer that if \(J\) repeats her spin measurement, then she will end up with the sure-fire disposition to report that she got the same result for the second measurement as for the first, even when she did not in fact get an ordinary determinate result for either. As a result, it will appear to her that there has been a collapse of the quantum-mechanical state when in fact there has been no collapse, splitting of worlds, or anything else that would produce an ordinary determinate measurement record. The subjective appearance of a collapse here is an illusion produced by the linear dynamics. It represents her inability to distinguish between ordinary and disjunctive experience.

The linear dynamics also entails intersubjective agreement between different observers. If a second observer were to check \(J\)’s measurement result, the second observer would end up believing that his result agreed with her result, even when neither observer in fact has an ordinary determinate measurement record. In this sense, there is subjective agreement on the apparent result of the apparent collapse.

Finally, one can show that an observer who repeats a measurement on an infinite sequence of systems in the same initial state will approach a state where she has the sure-fire dispositions to report that her measurement results were randomly distributed with the standard quantum statistics, even when she in fact got no ordinary results for any of her measurements. This follows from the relative frequency and randomness results in section 3.2. Hence she will end up believing that she got a determinate measurement result to each measurement and that these results were distributed precisely as one would expect on the standard collapse dynamics. See Everett (1956, 129–30), (1955, 67), (1956, 121–3 and 130–3), and (1957, 186–8 and 194–5) for his discussions of these formal properties of pure wave mechanics.

While the bare theory has a number of suggestive properties, there are at least two serious problems. To begin, it is not empirically coherent. If the bare theory were true, it would be impossible to have empirical evidence for accepting it as true given the radical sort of illusions it predicts. See Barrett (1996) for a discussion of empirical coherence in the context of the bare theory and John Bell’s (1981, 133–7) Everett (?) theory. Another is that if the bare theory were true, one would most likely fail to have any determinate beliefs at all since, on the linear dynamics, one would expect the global state to almost never be an eigenstate of any particular observer being sentient or even existing. For a further discussion of how experience is supposed to work in the bare theory and some the problems it encounters see Albert (1992), Bub, Clifton, and Monton, (1998), and Barrett (1999 and 2020).

### 8.2 Many Minds and Hidden Variables

Everett held that on his formulation of quantum mechanics “the formal theory is objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous and probabilistic” (1956, 77). Albert and Loewer (1988) aimed to capture this feature in their many-minds theory. In doing so, they show one way that one might add auxiliary assumptions to pure wave mechanics that yield both determinate records and standard forward-looking quantum probabilities.

The many-minds theory distinguishes between an observer’s
*physical state* and her *mental state*. Her physical
state is given by pure wave mechanics, and associated with her
physical state is a continuously infinite set of minds. The
observer’s physical state, like all other physical systems,
always evolves in the usual deterministic way according to rule 4a,
but each mind associated with the observer jumps randomly to a mental
state corresponding to one of the Everett branches that is produced in
each measurement-like interaction. The probability that a particular
mind will experience a given Everett branch is equal to the norm
squared of the amplitude associated with that branch.

On this dynamics, then, if a measurement interaction between \(J\) and \(S\) produces post-measurement state

\[\alpha|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rdquo\rangle_J |\mbox{$x$-spin up}\rangle_S + \beta|\ldquo\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rdquo\rangle_J|\mbox{$x$-spin down}\rangle_S,\]then one should expect \(|\alpha|^2\)proportion of \(J\)’s minds to end up associated with the result “spin up” (the first term of the expression) and \(|\beta|^2\)proportion of \(J\)’s minds to end up associated with the result “spin down” (the second term of the expression). We will also suppose that the mental dynamics is memory-preserving so that once a mind is associated with a particular branch it remains associated with the descendants of that branch. See Barrett 1995 for a discussion of the dynamics.

While the many-minds theory involves a strong mind-body dualism, it has several salient virtues. First, there is no need for a physically preferred basis. One must choose a preferred basis in order to specify the mental dynamics completely but this choice has nothing to do with physical facts. Rather, it is just characterizes how mental states supervene on physical states. Second, the determinate result problem is immediately solved since each mind always has a fully determinate set of measurement records. Third, the probability problem is addressed by how mental states evolve. Unlike many-worlds theories where an observer is copied into each post-measurement world, one gets the standard forward-looking quantum probabilities here as predictions for the future experiences of a particular mind. Finally, the many-minds theory is one of the few formulations of quantum mechanics that is (with decohering worlds and GRWf) arguably compatible with the constraints of special relativity. See Hemmo and Pitowsky (2003) and Barrett (2020) for discussions.

The many-minds formulation of quantum mechanics can be thought of as a hidden-variable theory much like Bohmian mechanics. See below and the entry on Bohmian mechanics. But here, instead of making particle positions determinate and then assuming that determinate particle will provide observers with determinate measurement records, one simply stipulates that the mental states of the observers are always determinate. While this strategy is clearly ad hoc, it is also effective. It immediately provides observers with fully determinate measurement records, and with a suitable stochastic dynamics, it yields the standard forward-looking quantum probabilities.

The many-minds formulation also illustrates the close relationship between pure wave mechanics and no-collapse hidden-variable theories. One way to get ordinary determinate measurement outcomes and forward looking probabilities is to add a parameter to pure wave mechanics that represents the observer’s records then to give a suitable dynamics for that parameter. We will consider another way this might work in the next section.

### 8.3 Many Histories and Bohmian Mechanics

On the standard sort of many-worlds theory, worlds are taken to split
over time as new branches are produced in measurement-like
interactions. As we have seen, inasmuch as each possible measurement
outcome is in fact recorded by *some* future copy of the
observer one of the post-measurement branches, one problem with this
is that the forward-looking probability of an observer getting each
quantum-mechanically possible outcome for a measurement is simply one.
One way to get the right forward-looking probabilities, the standard
probabilistic predictions of quantum mechanics, is to postulate worlds
are characterized by complete histories and never branch. If one
inhabits such a world, then one simply experiences its history.

The idea is closely related to many-history tradition. Gell-Mann and Hartle (1990) characterized Everett’s theory as one that describes many, mutually decohering, histories. On this sort of theory, one might think of each physically possible trajectory through the Everett branches as a thread that defines a world. See Dowker and Kent (1996) for critical examination of the consistent histories approach and Barrett (1999) for a characterization of such “many-threads” theories as a type of hidden-variable theory.

One can see how a many-threads theory might provide ordinary forward-looking probabilities by considering how one might construct such a theory from the many-minds theory. For each full trajectory that a particular mind might take through the Everett branches, associate a single, non-splitting world that implements the events experienced along that trajectory. What the mind would see, then, is what in fact happens in the corresponding world. In this way each mind determines the history of a non-branching world.

Now consider the probability measure over the set of all such worlds determined by the many-minds probability associated with each full history. A many-threads theory would stipulate this measure as the prior epistemic probability of each possible non-branching world in fact being ours. These prior probabilities are then updated as we learn more about the actual history of the world we inhabit. Since such worlds and everything in them have perfectly ordinary trans-temporal identities, there is no problem accounting for forward-looking probabilities. The forward-looking probability for a future event is just the epistemic probability that the event in fact occurs in the world we inhabit.

A no-collapse hidden-variable theory like Bohmian mechanics can also be thought of as a many-threads theory. The close relationship between such hidden variable theories and this sort of many-world theory is instructive.

On Bohmian mechanics the wave function always evolves in the usual deterministic way, but particles are taken to always have fully determinate positions. For an \(N\)-particle system, the particle configuration can be thought of as being pushed around in \(3N\)-dimensional configuration space by the flow by the probability associated with the wave function just as a massless particle would be pushed around by a compressible fluid. Here both the evolution of the wave function and the evolution of the particle configuration are fully deterministic. Quantum probabilities are the result of the distribution postulate. The distribution postulate sets the initial prior probability distribution equal to the norm squared of the wave function for an initial time. One learns what the new effective wave function is from one’s measurement results, but one never knows more than what is allowed by the standard quantum statistics. Indeed, Bohm’s theory always predicts the standard quantum probabilities for particle configurations, but it predicts these as epistemic probabilities. Bohm’s theory is supposed to give determinate measurement results in terms of determinate particle configurations (say the position of the pointer on a measuring device). See the entry on Bohmian mechanics and Barrett (2020) for further details.

If one chooses configuration as the preferred physical observable and adopts the particle dynamics of Bohm’s theory, then one can construct a many-threads theory by fixing the initial wave function and the Hamiltonian and then considering every possible initial configuration of particles to correspond to a different full history for a possible world. Here the prior probabilities are given by the distribution postulate in Bohm’s theory, and the updated epistemic probabilities yield the effective Bohmian wave function. On this view, the only difference between Bohm’s theory and the associated many-threads theory is that the many-threads theory treats all possible Bohmian worlds as actual and quantum probabilities as epistemic self-location probabilities over these worlds. A many-threads theory might be constructed for virtually any determinate physical quantity just as one would construct a hidden-variable or a modal theory. See the entry on entries on Bohmian mechanics and modal interpretations of quantum mechanics and Vink (1993).

The upshot is that if one takes the account of determinate records and quantum probabilities in pure wave mechanics alone to be inadequate, adding hidden variables provides a sure-fire way to get ordinary records and forward-looking probabilities. That said, there is good historical reason to suppose that Everett did not have a hidden-variable theory in mind.

Everett explicitly discussed Bohmian mechanics in two places in his long thesis (1956, 75, 153–5). His complaint was that Bohm’s theory was “more cumbersome than the conceptually simpler theory based on pure wave mechanics.” Even so, he took Bohmian mechanics to be of “great theoretical importance” because it “showed that ‘hidden variable’ theories are indeed possible” contrary to received wisdom. Concerning hidden-variable theories like Bohm’s, Everett further acknowledged that “[i]t cannot be disputed that these theories are often appealing and might conceivably become important should future discoveries indicate serious inadequacies in the present scheme [pure wave mechanics] (i.e. they might be more easily modified to encompass new experience)” (1956, 155). While Everett thought that he could adequately explain (or better, explain away) quantum probabilities, given the subsequent difficulty in understanding forward-looking quantum probabilities in pure wave mechanics, that Bohmian mechanics and other many-threads theories treat quantum probability in an entirely straightforward way is a manifest virtue, one that may ultimately be useful in finding a satisfactory extension of pure wave mechanics.

## 9. Summary

Everett took his version of the Wigner’s Friend story to reveal an inconsistency in the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics and the incompleteness of the Copenhagen interpretation. On his understanding, the quantum measurement problem was that neither theory could account for the sort of nested measurement that occurs in the Wigner’s Friend story. Pure wave mechanics clearly provides a consistent dynamical account of how the state of the composite system evolves in the context of nested measurement. Everett’s task then was to explain a sense in which pure wave mechanics might be taken to be empirically faithful over determinate measurement records that exhibit the standard quantum-mechanical statistics.

Everett’s relative-state formulation of pure wave mechanics has a number of salient virtues. It eliminates the collapse dynamics and hence immediately resolves the potential conflict between the standard theory’s two dynamical laws. It is logically consistent, applicable to all physical systems, and arguably as simple as a formulation of quantum mechanics can be. And it is empirically faithful in the sense that relative sequences of records exhibiting the standard quantum statistics are typical.

The empirical problems with the relative state formulation of pure wave mechanics are illustrated by the fact that it provides neither probabilistic predictions nor expectations for one’s records at a time or in the future. There are now a number reconstructions of pure wave mechanics that add auxiliary assumptions in order to provide a richer account of both determinate records and quantum probability. The methodological goal is to add as little as possible to get a satisfactory empirical theory given one’s explanatory demands.

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### Acknowledgments

I would like to thank Peter Byrne and the editors for helpful suggestions on this article.