Notes to The Uncertainty Principle

1. The translation of anschaulich as “intuitive” is obviously the best candidate, since it has a corresponding etymological root. Unfortunately, this term is often used to refer to a kind of understanding which bypasses reasoning. This is not intended here.

2. Although this claim by Schrödinger seems to have been accepted by his contemporaries, his argument was incomplete. A satisfactory proof of the equivalence of wave mechanics and matrix mechanics was only provided later, when von Neumann (1932) showed that both approaches could be seen as different realisations of an abstract Hilbert space formalism (see Muller 1997, for historical details).

3. However, the first draft of his 1927 paper, which he sent as a letter to Pauli (Pauli 1979: 376–382) shows that Heisenberg did have the outlines of a general, albeit qualitative, mathematical argument.

4. Note that this usage of the term “causal” by Bohr differs from his usage of that term in earlier texts, where it refers only to the applicability of dynamical conservation laws, and not to the union of a space-time description with these conservation laws. Thus, in Bohr 1928, he characterized complementarity as a relation between space-time description and causality.

5. Note, that while Bohr started from the duality between the particle and wave pictures, which are mutually exclusive also in classical physics, he later considered as complementary two descriptions which in the classical theory are united.

6. See note 4 for Bohr’s usage of the term “causality”.

Copyright © 2016 by
Jan Hilgevoord
Jos Uffink <>

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