Notes to Primary and Secondary Qualities in Early Modern Philosophy

1. Galileo is fascinated by light, but declines to say what he believes it might be; see Crombie 1972: 81–7.

2. This entry follows the standard conventions for citing works of Descartes. “CSM” stands for The Philosophical Writings of Descartes edited by John Cottingham. Robert Stoothoff,and Dugald Murdoch; “AT” stands for Oeuvres de Descartes, edited by John Adam and Paul Tannery.

3. “I have given an account of the various sizes, shapes, and motions which are to be found in bodies, and apart from these the only things which we perceive by our senses as being located outside us are light, colors [etc.]. And I have just demonstrated that there is nothing else in the objects—or at least we cannot apprehend them as being anything else—but certain dispositions depending on size, shape, and motion” (CSM 1.285; AT 8.323).

4. Simmons (2003) argues that in Descartes’ psychology, the basic division is between the intellect and the senses, not between two sorts of objects of sense perception.

5. The exception is original visual perception of two-dimensional non-Euclidean objects. It is triggered by impressions on the retina of which we are unaware (Reid 1764 [1997: 98–101]; Van Cleve 2015: 18–195; on Reid’s geometry of visibles, see Van Cleve 2015: 158–95).

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