Someone displays instrumental rationality insofar as she adopts suitable means to her ends. Instrumental rationality, by virtually any reckoning, is an important, and presumably indispensable, part of practical rationality. However, philosophers have been interested in it for further reasons. To take one example, it has been suggested that instrumental rationality, or some tendency toward it, is partly constitutive of intention, desire, or action. To take another, more important, example, it has been argued that instrumental rationality is not only a part, but a special part, or even the whole, of practical rationality. This thesis appears to threaten the “rational authority” of morality. It seems possible that acting morally on some occasion might not be a suitable means to an agent’s ends. If so, then according to this thesis, it would not be irrational for her to refuse to act morally on such an occasion.
We should note two restrictions on the scope of this article. First, this article focuses on contemporary discussions of the subject, apart from some brief discussions of Hume and Kant. Notable omissions, for example, are Aristotle’s discussion of the practical syllogism and his claim that deliberation is of means (Nicomachean Ethics, Book III, Chapter 3).
Second, this article doesn’t focus on decision theory, which some may view as containing, or just being, a theory of instrumental rationality: what means to take to achieve certain ends (the satisfaction of preferences, or the realization of valuable states of affairs) given credences, or beliefs, or information, about the probabilities that various means will achieve those ends.In this article, we begin (§1) by noting a distinction that frames the discussion that follows: very roughly, a distinction between the question of whether some attitude is such that an agent ought, or (more weakly) has reason, to have it, and the question of whether that attitude rationally coheres with her other attitudes. We first (§2) discuss the importance of means-end relations for what one ought, or has reason, to intend: specifically, for how reasons for ends “transmit” to reasons for means. We then (§3) discuss instrumental rationality understood as a norm of rational coherence. Lastly, we consider (§4) the “Humean” thesis that instrumental rationality is the only kind of practical rationality.
- 1. Rational Coherence and Reason
- 2. Instrumental Transmission
- 3. Instrumental Coherence
- 4. The Status of Instrumental Rationality
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1. Rational Coherence and Reason
Someone displays instrumentally rationality insofar as she adopts suitable means to her ends. But how should “rationality” be understood? Here it is important to distinguish between two things that the casually phrased question, “What would it be rational for an agent to do or intend?” could mean:
- By doing or intending what would the agent make her responses (i.e., her attitudes and actions) cohere with one another? Call the answer, stipulatively, what it would be rationally coherent for the agent to do or intend.
- What does the agent have reason, or ought she, to do or intend? This is the question that an agent characteristically asks when she is deliberating about what to do or intend, or when someone else is advising her what to do or intend. (Note that claims about reasons are weaker than claims about “oughts”. One could have a reason to do something without it being the case that one ought to do it, as when the reason is outweighed by competing reasons. However, it is generally thought that if one ought to do something, then one has a reason to do it.)
As with any philosophical distinction, this contrast between “rational coherence” and “reason” might be questioned. But it is accepted by many of the authors who have written on the subject, and it will help to organize the discussion of the subject matter.
In principle, the answers to these questions might perfectly coincide: that what agents have reason, or ought, to do just is what it would be rationally coherent for them to do, and vice versa. In several ways, however, the answers might be expected to diverge.
First, even if what one ought to do is just to make one’s responses globally coherent, what it takes to make one’s responses locally coherent might differ from what it takes to make them globally coherent. According to the Subjective Desire-Based Theory, for example, what agents have reason, or ought, to do or intend is just what, given what they believe their circumstances to be, would best satisfy their strongest, present intrinsic desires taken as a whole. Suppose that the agent’s strongest, present intrinsic desire is for health. Nevertheless, out of habit, he intends to have a smoke, believing that lighting up is a necessary means. According to the Subjective Desire-Based Theory, it is not the case that he ought to intend to light up. And it might be said that if he were globally coherent, the agent would not intend to light up. But if he does form an intention to light up, he at least achieves a kind of local coherence.
Second, what the agent has reason, or ought, to do or intend may depend not on what she believes her circumstances to be, but on something more “objective.” There are several possibilities. What an agent has reason, or ought, to do, might be what the evidence (where this depends on something other than her attitudes) available to the agent suggests about her circumstances, what the evidence of the person making the reason- or ought-claim suggests about the agent’s circumstances, what the evidence of the person assessing the claim suggests about the agent’s circumstances, or all of the relevant facts about the agent’s circumstances. Consider the Objective Desire-Based Theory, which says that agents have reason, or ought, to do or intend just what, given what their circumstances actually are, would best satisfy their strongest, present intrinsic desires taken as a whole. Suppose the agent’s strongest, present intrinsic desire is to drink a gin and tonic, and she so intends. However, she mistakenly believes that the stuff in this bottle is gin, when it is in fact petrol. So she believes that mixing the stuff with tonic is a means to drinking a gin and tonic. According to the Objective Desire-Based Theory, she does not have reason to intend to mix the stuff with tonic and drink it. But if she does so intend, she might be said to have achieved a kind of rational coherence, both local and global.
Third, one might hold not a Desire-Based Theory, but a Value-Based Theory, according to which whatever ultimate ends an agent has reason, or ought, to achieve depend not on what she desires or wills, but instead on what is of independent value. Suppose the madman’s strongest, present intrinsic desire is to set off a nuclear war, and he so intends. Moreover, the madman knows that intending to press this button is a necessary and sufficient means to setting off a nuclear war. It might be said that, in intending to press this button, the madman would achieve a kind of coherence, both local and global. And according to the Desire-Based Theories, the madman ought so to intend. According to a Value-Based Theory, however, it presumably is not the case that he ought so to intend.
There are several reasons, therefore, to expect at least some divergence between what one has reason, or ought, to do or intend, and what it would be rationally coherent for one to do or intend. But that is perfectly compatible with partial convergence, even of a non-accidental character. As we will discuss below, some suggest that among the things that agents have reason, or ought, to do or intend is precisely to make their responses rationally coherent. Just as we ought not to torture, or ought to care for our children, we ought to be rationally coherent.
2. Instrumental Transmission
We’ll begin by discussing how means-end relations matter for what one ought, or has reason, to do or intend. (For an opinionated survey, see Kolodny 2018.) But we should first consider how “means” is understood. While “means” are often taken to be tools or resources, for our purposes, we will view means as actions, intentions, choices, decisions, etc. that might make use of such tools or resources. It is natural to think of means to an end, so understood, as actions that help to cause the end to occur. But often philosophers count as means to an end whatever may help to bring it about. M may bring about E by causing it, as flicking this switch causes the illumination of this room, but M may also bring about E by helping to constitute it, as playing this measure partially constitutes the playing of this sonata, or fulfilling preconditions for it, as registering for this conference fulfills preconditions for attending it, or preventing things that might prevent it, as vaccination prevents disease that might prevent successful completion of the school year. Means are also often probabilistic. Something may also count as a means to an end even if it is not guaranteed to help to bring about the end, but only has some chance of doing so. Usage of “end” is also often ambiguous. Sometimes “end” is used to refer to an action, such as the action of illuminating this room. But sometimes “end” is used to refer to a state of affairs that is either desired or valuable, such as the state of affairs of this room’s being illuminated. We’ll here use “end” to refer to an action.
Reasons for action are often said to “transmit” from ends to means, in the sense that if there is reason for an end, then, because of this, there is reason for the means. This idea is captured in Joseph Raz’s Facilitative Principle:
[w]hen we have an undefeated reason to take an action, we have reason to perform any one (but only one) of the possible (for us) alternative plans that facilitate its performance. (Raz 2005b)
Insofar as what one ought to do depends on what one has reason to do, one might expect a similar transmission of “ought” from end to means. If one ought to achieve an end, then one ought to take the means, or at least means of certain kinds.
Principles of instrumental transmission of this kind are compatible with different views about what ends we have reason to achieve. For example, it may be accepted by either a Desire-Based, or a Value-Based, Theory.
What the correct principle, or principles, of instrumental transmission are is controversial. Most commonly, principles describe transmission to necessary means. However, some speak of sufficient means, and others speak of neither. For example, Raz’s Facilitative Principle speaks of “facilitating plans.” Some transmission principles say that “oughts” transmit from end to means, others say that the full force of the reason for the end transmits to the means, others say that the strength of the reason for the end that transmits to the means is proportional to other factors, and others, like Raz’s Facilitative Principle, say only that some reason for the end transmits to the means.
To illustrate the problems facing an account of instrumental transmission, it may be useful to work with some very simple principles, which lack many of the qualifications and nuances of Raz’s Facilitative Principle and other principles discussed in the literature:
- Ought Necessity:
- If one ought to E, and M is a necessary means to E-ing, then one ought to M.
- Strong Reasons Necessity:
- If one has reason to E, and M is a necessary means to E-ing, then that is as strong a reason to M.
- Weak Reasons Necessity:
- If one has reason to E, and M is a necessary means to E-ing, then that is some reason to M.
- Ought Sufficiency:
- If one ought to E, and M is a sufficient means to E-ing, then one ought to M.
- Strong Reasons Sufficiency:
- If one has reason to E, and M is a sufficient means to E-ing, then that is as strong a reason to M.
- Weak Reasons Sufficiency:
- If one has reason to E, and M is a sufficient means to E-ing, then that is some reason to M.
There are several problems that principles of instrumental transmission need to avoid. First, means to an end can be costly, or otherwise objectionable. Suppose that I ought to take a job in Alaska. One (sufficient) means is to fly there; another (sufficient) means is to take free passage on a merchant ship. But flying costs more than I would earn there. Presumably, I ought not fly. It may be said that I have some reason to fly, but that it is outweighed. This is an argument against Ought Sufficiency.
However, with other kinds of costs, or objectionable features, it may sound wrong to say even that one has reason for the means. Suppose I have reason to alleviate pangs of hunger. One sufficient means to this is eating a sandwich; another sufficient means is killing myself (Broome 2005b). Some will resist the conclusion that I have any reason at all to kill myself. This is an argument against Strong Reasons Sufficiency and Weak Reasons Sufficiency. Or suppose I have reason to improve college policy. But a necessary means to this is to kill the old don who resists any change (because unanimous approval is required). Some will resist the conclusion that I have any reason at all to kill the don. This is an argument against Strong Reasons Necessity and Weak Reasons Necessity. However, it may not be an argument against Ought Necessity. It may be said that the fact that improving policy requires killing the don is itself a strong reason against improving policy, in light of which it is not true that one ought to improve it. In that case, Ought Necessity does not imply that one ought to kill the don, which seems intuitive. In any event, the force of the intuition on which the argument rests may be resisted. Granted, it sounds odd to say that one has reason to kill oneself. But this may have a pragmatic explanation. Why bother to identify any reason to kill oneself when it is vastly outweighed by the reasons against doing so? (Raz 2005a; Schroeder 2005a, 2007; for objection to the pragmatic explanation, see Gertken and Kiesewetter 2021.)
Second, problems arise from repeated applications of transmission principles. For one thing, means to means to an end may actually undermine the end. Suppose, to take an example of Ryan Millsap’s, Kenny has reason to bake both a loaf of bread and a cake for a display on Marie Antoinette. A (necessary) means to that end is baking a loaf of bread. Plausibly, he has reason to bake a loaf of bread. A (sufficient) means to that means is baking a giant loaf, which uses all of the flour. But that would prevent him from baking a cake, and so prevent him from achieving the end. So, presumably, he does not have reason to bake a giant loaf, even though it is a means to something that he has reason to do. For another thing, if we accept both Weak Reasons Necessity and Weak Reasons Sufficiency, then repeated applications of these principles may imply that if there is reason for something, then there is reason for everything. To take another example from Ryan Millsap, suppose there is reason to E, and let F be anything. If E-ing or F-ing is a necessary means to E-ing, and if F-ing is a sufficient means to E-ing or F-ing, then, repeated application of those principles implies that there is reason to F. Note that similar problems arise if we accept both Ought Necessity and Ought Sufficiency.
Third, a means to an end might have a very low probability of helping to bring that end about. Suppose, to take an example from Jackson and Pargetter 1986, Professor Procrastinate has been asked to review a book, which he both ought, and has reason, to do. A (necessary) means to reviewing it is accepting the commission to review it. However, even if he accepts the commission, he is very unlikely to review it. Professor Dispatch, in a parallel universe, is in the same situation, except that he is very likely to review it if he accepts. Perhaps Procrastinate, like Dispatch, has some reason to review it. But Procrastinate may not have as much reason as Dispatch to accept; not all of the reason for the end may be transmitted to this (necessary) means. And it may not be the case that Procrastinate ought to accept. This is an argument against Strong Reasons Necessity and Ought Necessity, since even if one takes a necessary means, there may still be a low probability of helping to bring that end about. However, it is not an argument against the Sufficiency principles, assuming that sufficient means, if taken, are sure to help to bring the end about.
In response to this problem, one might argue that Procrastinate both ought to write the review and ought to accept the invitation. After all, if we follow Jackson and Pargetter in thinking that Procrastinate both ought to [write the review and accept the invitation] and ought to decline the invitiation, then it would no longer be possible for Procrastinate to do everything that he ought to do. As Benjamin Kiesewetter (2015) argues, we would then have to reject
- Joint Satisfiability:
- If A ought to x and A ought to y, then it is possible for A to [x and y].
which might prove costly. It may be that such counterexamples to Ought Necessity (and Strong Reasons Necessity) rely on such costly views. (For further discussion, see Kiesewetter 2015, White 2017, and Kiesewetter 2018.)
The fourth and final problem is that a sufficient means may be superfluous to an end, where this means that the end would still be achieved, even if those means were omitted. Suppose that Drug 1 is a sufficient means to relieving the patient’s pain. A doctor is sure to give Drug 1. Giving Drug 2, in addition, would at first neutralize the effect of Drug 1, but then recombine with it to produce a third drug, which will relieve the patient’s pain. Giving Drug 2 would be superfluous to relieving the patient’s pain, although it would help to bring it about, by being part of the cause of the relief of the patient’s pain. Does the doctor then also have any reason to give Drug 2? At first, one might be tempted to say that the doctor does indeed have reason to give Drug 2, but that this reason is outweighed by the cost of giving Drug 2. But observe that no matter how low we make that cost, it still outweighs any reason to give it. This suggests that there is no reason at all to give it. Note that necessary means cannot be superfluous, since if necessary means were left out, the end would not be achieved.
3. Instrumental Coherence
Now we consider instrumental rationality understood as a matter of rational coherence. It is often said that someone is being locally instrumentally incoherent insofar as he intends an end, believes, roughly, that something is a means to it, but refuses to intend that means. More precisely, it seems that this is so only when the relevant belief is about necessary means. Suppose that I intend to go to Alaska, but believe that flying there is a sufficient, but not necessary, means to going to Alaska. Am I being instrumentally incoherent in refusing to intend to fly there? Not obviously: perhaps I believe that going by sea is cheaper, and I intend that.
Some suggest that this focus, on intentions and beliefs about necessary means, inspired by Kant’s initial discussion of hypothetical imperatives (see §4.4 below), is overly narrow (see Smith 2004 and Wedgwood 2011). Not simply intentions, but also desires, should be considered, and not simply beliefs about necessary means, but also beliefs about non-necessary means should be considered. And others have developed theories of instrumental rationality focused on (intentional) actions, as opposed to intentions (see Tenenbaum 2021).
More precisely still, the relevant belief must be that intending the means is itself necessary. Suppose your dentist intends to remove your tooth, and believes that a necessary means to removing your tooth is causing you pain. Is she being instrumentally incoherent in refusing to intend to cause you pain? Not necessarily: she might believe that she will remove your tooth even if she does not intend to cause you pain. But she will, presumably, believe that she will remove your tooth only if she intends to use her instruments. So, though she wouldn’t be irrational in not intending to cause you pain, she would be irrational in not intending to use her instruments (Kamm 2000, 2007; Searle, 2001; Broome 2003).
Moreover, the relevant belief must be that intending the means now is necessary. Suppose a beginning student intends to earn a doctoral degree and believes that, when the dissertation is completed, intending to submit the final paperwork is necessary for earning the degree. It is not clear that she is being instrumentally incoherent in refusing to intend, now, to submit that paperwork. She may trust that, when the time comes, she will intend it (Setiya 2007). This suggests, as Raz notes, that opportunities for instrumental incoherence may actually be very rare.
Even with the content of the relevant belief being restricted in these ways, worries might still arise given that (all-out) belief falls short of certainty. Suppose I believe the only way to arrive on time is to steal my neighbor’s car, which I’m unwilling to. But I also think there’s a very small chance I could bike in and arrive on time. (This is compatible with my all-out believing I’ll arrive on time only if I steal my neighbor’s car.) One might argue that it’s rationally permissible to intend to arrive on time in such a case (Nuñez 2020). However, perhaps we should instead say here that it’s rationally permissible to have the goal, or aim, of arriving on time, not the intention to arrive on time.
There seems to be considerable agreement, then, on what we might call the:
- Violation Claim:
- If one is instrumentally incoherent—i.e., one intends at t to E, believes at t that one will E only if one intends at t to M, but does not (or, more restrictively, refuses to) intend at t to M—then one violates some requirement.
But it is unclear exactly what requirement one violates. Additionally, it is unclear whether the requirement violated would be “normative” in the sense that one ought not to violate it. In other words, it is unclear whether, in being instrumentally incoherent, one violates a requirement of reason, in the sense of “reason” identified earlier. In the remainder of this section, we’ll consider some possible answers to these questions.
First, (§3.1) we might say that there isn’t any requirement of reason to be instrumentally coherent as such, but whenever one is instrumentally incoherent, one violates some independent requirement of reason. Second, (§3.2) we might say that there is a requirement of reason to be instrumentally coherent as such. Third, (§3.3) we might deny that one necessarily violates a requirement of reason in being instrumentally incoherent; perhaps the normativity of instrumental coherence is merely apparent, or the requirement merely evaluative (it may be a standard of proper functioning without giving anyone reason to comply with it). Fourth, (§3.4) one might think, given the ways in which intention is thought to involve belief, that in being instrumentally incoherent, one violates a requirement of theoretical rationality.
There are, of course, other answers that could be given. (For instance, we briefly discuss a constitutivist approach to instrumental incoherence, attributed to Kant, in §4.4) But consideration of these approaches will give a reasonably comprehensive picture of the recent attempts to explain the Violation Claim.
3.1 Independent Requirements of Reason
One answer is that when one is instrumentally incoherent one violates some independent requirement of reason. That is, either one has some specific attitude (or pattern of attitudes) that one ought not to have or one lacks some specific attitude (or pattern of attitudes) that one ought to have. The source of the problem, according to this answer, is not that when one is instrumentally incoherent, one violates some requirement of reason to be instrumentally coherent as such. The source of the problem is instead that when one is instrumentally incoherent, then it is guaranteed that one’s having (or lacking) one attitude (or pattern of attitudes) violates some independent requirement of reason. (See Kolodny 2007b, 2008a; Kiesewetter 2017, esp. Ch. 10; Lord 2018, esp. Ch. 2. For criticism, see Brunero 2020, Ch. 4; Fogal and Worsnip 2021; Worsnip 2021, Ch. 3, Lee 2021.)
Certainly, this can happen in some cases, at least accidentally. Suppose our madman intends to start World War III, believes that he will start World War III only if he intends to launch a nuclear missile, but refuses to intend to launch a nuclear missile. The Violation Claim might be explained in this case by pointing out that, whatever his other attitudes may be, he ought not to have the intention to start World War III, but does have that intention. But why should we suppose that, in general, whenever one has an instrumentally incoherent set, one either has an attitude (or pattern) that one ought not to have, or lacks an attitude (or pattern) that one ought to have?
This would be so, in general, if the following were the case:
- Ought Pattern 1:
- In any situation, either
- one ought not to believe that one will E only if one intends to M, or
- one ought not to intend to E, or
- one ought to intend to M.
It would also be so, in general, if the following were the case:
- Ought Pattern 2:
- In any situation, either
- one ought not to believe that one will E only if one intends to M, or
- whatever pattern of intention one ought to have, it is not one
intends to E and does not intend to M; i.e.,
- one ought not to intend to E and not to intend to M, or
- one ought not to intend to E and to intend to M, or
- one ought to intend to E and to intend to M, or
- one ought either not to intend to E and not to intend to M or not to intend to E and to intend to M, or
- one ought either not to intend to E and not to intend to M or to intend to E and to intend to M, or
- one ought either not to intend to E and to intend to M or to intend to E and to intend to M, or
- one ought either not to intend to E and to not to intend to M or not to intend to E and to intend to M or to intend to E and to intend to M.
Ought Pattern 2 speaks of “oughts” for patterns of intention, rather than for single intentions. The reason for this is that one’s having an intention to X can affect one’s reason for having an intention to Y. This can happen in the following way. First, one’s reason to intend to Y plausibly depends, among other things, on how likely one is to succeed in it. Second, how likely one is to succeed in it in turn depends on how the future is likely to be. I am more likely to succeed in drying the laundry if there is no rain. Third, how the future is likely to be can depend on how some person is likely to act. I am more likely to succeed in drying the laundry if the children are unlikely to be playing with the hose at the same time. Fourth, the relevant person may be the agent himself. I am more likely to succeed in drying the laundry if I am unlikely to be at the same time watering the garden. Finally, the fact that an agent intends to X can make it more likely that the agent will X in the future. The fact that I intend to water the garden can make it more likely that I will be watering the garden. Thus, the fact that an agent intends to X can make it more likely that the agent will not succeed in an intention to Y, and so that the agent has less reason to intend to Y. Given that one’s intending to X can affect one’s reason to Y and vice versa, the questions, “What reason do I have to intend to Y? What reason do I have to intend to X?” may be insufficiently determinate. Better questions may instead be “What reason do I have (to intend to X and to intend to Y)? What reason do I have (to intend to X and not to intend to Y)? What reason do I have (not to intend to X and to intend to Y)? What reason do I have (not to intend to X and not to intend to Y)?”
This phenomenon, or apparent phenomenon, that the presence of one intention can affect one’s reason to have another intention, should be distinguished from the phenomenon, or apparent phenomenon, that the presence of one intention and the presence or absence of another can make it the case that one violates or satisfies a rational requirement of instrumental coherence as such. First, what matters for rational requirements is what we believe about the relations between the intentions, whereas what matters for reason would seem to be how they are likely to affect one another, which may be independent of what we believe. Second, what matters for rational requirements is intending to X as such, whereas what matters for reason is what intending to X means for the future. In some cases, intending to X (e.g., intending to become King of France in 2023), may not affect the likely future. In other cases, conditions other than intending to X (e.g., my self-trust that I will X even if I don’t intend it now, or my knowledge that I will be tortured or coerced into X-ing) may affect the likely future in the same way. Finally, rational requirements are usually taken to be wide-scope, as we will see below. That is, one never needs to have or lack any particular attitude in order to satisfy them. By contrast, one usually needs to have or lack a particular attitude in order to conform to one’s reason to have a certain pattern of intentions. If one ought, for example, (to intend to X and not to intend to Y), then one can comply with this requirement of reason only by intending to X and not intending to Y.
One might argue for Ought Pattern 1 in the following way. Suppose that it is not the case that one ought not to believe that one will E only if one intends to M. Then by:
- Epistemic Strictness:
- If one believes P or is considering whether P, and it is not the case that one ought not to believe P, then it is the case that one ought to believe P.
one ought to believe it. Suppose further that it is not the case that one ought not to intend to E. Then by:
- Practical Strictness:
- If it is not the case that one ought not to intend to E, then one ought to intend to E.
one ought to intend to E. Suppose further that:
- Ought Intention:
- One ought to intend to E only if one ought to E.
Then one ought to E. Then by:
- Variant of Ought Necessity:
- If one ought to E, and one ought to believe that one will E only if one intends to M, then one ought to intend to M.
one ought to intend to M. In other words, either one ought not to believe that one will E only if one intends to M, or one ought not to intend to E, or one ought to intend to M.
One problem is that the objections to Ought Necessity that we saw in §2 seem to apply to Variant as well. Another is that Practical Strictness seems untenable (Way 2012a; Cheng-Guajardo 2014). It might be the case neither that one ought not to intend to E, nor that one ought to intend to E; intending to E might be merely permitted. Suppose I ought to take a can of beans. I can take the can of beans on the left, or I can take the equally good can on the right. It is neither the case that I ought not to intend to take the can on the left, nor that I ought to intend to take the can on the left.
But perhaps in such cases one’s intending to take the can on the left provides a reason that tips the scales, thereby making it the case that one ought to intend the means to that end. (See Schroeder 2009, §4.1; For criticism of the view that intentions provide reasons in this way, see Broome 2001 and Brunero 2007.) If that’s true, then these cases of “picking” wouldn’t pose a special problem for Ought Pattern 1; in all such cases, one ought to intend to M.
One might argue for Ought Pattern 2 in the following way. Again, suppose that it is not the case that one ought not to have the belief. Then, by Epistemic Strictness, one ought to have the belief. For the time being, suppose that one does not intend to M. Then by:
- Required Self-Knowledge:
- If one does not intend to M, then one ought to believe that one does not intend to M,
one ought to believe that one does not intend to M. Then by:
- Reverse Closure:
- If one ought to believe not Q and one ought to believe P only if Q, then one ought to believe not P,
one ought to believe that one will not E. Then by:
- So long as one ought to believe that one will not E, one has no reason to intend to E, since the evidence suggests that doing so is pointless.
one has no reason to intend to E. In other words, so long as one does not intend to M, one has no reason to intend to E. If we also accept:
- There is reason not to intend to E,
then, so long as one does not intend to M, one has no reason to intend to E and reason not to intend to E. This makes it plausible that there is more reason (not to intend to M and not to intend to E) than (not to intend to M and to intend to E). This does not mean that one ought (not to intend to M and not to intend to E) all things considered. For example, it might be the case that one ought (to intend to M and to intend to E). But it does mean that whatever pattern of intention one ought to have, it is not to (not to intend to M and to intend to E). There is a superior alternative.
One question, of course, is whether we should accept these assumptions, in particular Required Self-Knowledge.
Another problem is that even if this explains Ought Pattern 2, and so the Violation Claim, it does not explain the:
- Satisfaction Claim:
- One satisfies a requirement by avoiding or escaping instrumental incoherence (of a kind which one would not satisfy by entering or remaining in instrumental incoherence) no matter how one does it.
Suppose that one ought to have the means-end belief and one ought (to intend to E and to intend to M). However, one avoids incoherence by dropping the means-end belief, not intending to E, and not intending to M. Intuitively, one has satisfied some requirement. This is what the Satisfaction Claim reflects. But one hasn’t adopted the particular attitudes (or patterns) that one ought to adopt. How, then, are we to explain the Satisfaction Claim?
A quick answer might be this. One might suggest, first, that one ought to be instrumentally coherent, because it is a necessary means to, or at least a necessary condition of, having the particular attitudes (or pattern) that one independently ought to have, or not having the particular attitudes (or pattern) that one independently ought not to have. Suppose that one ought to intend to M, but does not. Just as (P or Q) is a necessary condition of P, so too a necessary condition of intending to M is (either not to intend to E, or not to believe that one will E only if one intends now to M, or to intend to M). Now suppose that instead of intending to M, one drops one’s intention to E. While one hasn’t intended to M, which one ought to do, one has fulfilled a necessary means, or at least a necessary condition, of that. Assume Ought Necessity of §2, perhaps slightly strengthened: that one ought to take any necessary means to, or at least fulfill any necessary condition of, what one ought. In that sense, by dropping one’s intention to E, one has done something that one ought, and so satisfied a requirement. Analogously, if one ought to post the letter, then, by similar reasoning, one ought (either to post the letter or to burn it). So, if one burns the letter, one has done something that one ought, and so satisfied a requirement.
Note that this response assumes that either Ought Pattern 1 or Ought Pattern 2 is correct. Otherwise, we have no guarantee that, in any given case, a necessary condition of having the particular attitudes that one ought to have, or not having the particular attitudes that one ought not to have, is (either not to intend to E, or not to believe that one will E only if one intends now to M, or to intend to M). So it inherits all of the challenges in defending Ought Pattern 1 or Ought Pattern 2.
Another problem with this response is that it is not obvious that Ought Necessity is true, as the Professor Procrastinate example of §2 suggested.
A third problem is that necessary conditions of intending to M are easy to come by. Another necessary condition is (either intending to M or being instrumentally incoherent)! Therefore, in exactly the same way, one satisfies a requirement by remaining incoherent. But the intuitive Satisfaction Claim is precisely that in escaping incoherence one satisfies a requirement of a kind which one would not satisfy by remaining instrumentally incoherent.
3.2 Requirements of Reason to be Instrumentally Coherent As Such
The Violation and Satisfaction Claims would be explained by a requirement of reason to avoid or escape instrumental incoherence as such. Just as we ought not to torture, or ought to care for our children, we ought to be instrumentally coherent as such.
One might instead suggest a weaker view: we have a reason to be instrumentally coherent as such. But this weaker version faces a difficulty in explaining the “strictness” of the Violation Claim. One could have a reason to X without being under any requirement to X, as when that reason to X is outweighed. But, according to the Violation Claim, whenever one is instrumentally incoherent, one violates some requirement. This “strictness” would thus remain unexplained by the weaker view (Broome 1999). Of course, the weaker view—that we have a reason to be instrumentally coherent as such—could be true even though it fails to explain the Violation and Satisfaction Claims. (However, some philosophers have raised important challenges to the “strictness” of rational requirements. Most notably, Fogal 2020 suggests replacing a “requirements-based” account of structural rationality with a “pressure-based” account.)
So, let’s work with the stronger view, according to which we ought to be instrumentally coherent as such. One worry about this answer is “bootstrapping.” Suppose that this requirement to be instrumentally coherent as such is stated in “narrow-scope” form: if one intends to E and believes that one will E only if one intends to M, then one is required to intend to M. Now suppose that one intends to stay in power and believes that one will do so only if one intends to kill one’s rival. If one ought to be instrumentally coherent as such, it would follow that one ought to intend to kill one’s rival. But that seems implausible. So, one may conclude, we cannot understand “one is rationally required” as implying “one ought.”
3.2.1 Wide-Scoping and its Problems
A natural reply, however, is that there is another way to be instrumentally coherent: namely, to abandon the intention to stay in power. Thus, a requirement of instrumental coherence as such should take “wide-scope.” It should say: one is required to either revise one’s intention to E, or revise one’s belief that one will E only if one intends to M, or intend to M. (See especially Broome 1999 and Wallace 2006. For earlier defenses of the wide-scope view, see Hill 1973 and Darwall 1983.) So even if “one is rationally required” is taken to imply “one ought,” all that follows is that one ought to either revise the intention to stay in power, or revise the belief that one will do so only if one intends to kill one’s rival, or intend to kill one’s rival. It does not follow that one ought to intend to kill one’s rival.
However, there are some problems facing this approach, which we outline in the supplemental document Problems for Wide-Scoping. Some of those problems concern the allegedly implausible consequences that emerge when we apply some of the transmission principles we discuss in §2 above—specifically, Ought Necessity, Weak Reasons Necessity, and Weak Reasons Sufficiency—to the relevant wide-scope ought in certain cases. Other problems concern whether the wide-scope formulation is adequate as a formulation of the rational requirement.
3.2.2 What is the Reason?
There are other challenges facing the view that the Violation and Satisfaction Claims are explained by a requirement of reason to be instrumentally coherent as such. The proponent of this view, presumably, should be able to say what the reason is to be instrumentally coherent as such (see Kolodny 2005, §2).
Keep in mind that it won’t be enough to state a reason to be disposed to be instrumentally coherent. It doesn’t follow from one’s having a reason to have a disposition that one has a reason to manifest that disposition on every particular occasion. And so pointing to a reason to be disposed to be coherent wouldn’t yield a reason to be instrumentally coherent as such. (As we’ll see in §4.4, a similar problem confronts the Kantian constitutivist view that continued instrumental incoherence threatens our status as agents. Since our agency isn’t at risk with every instance of instrumental incoherence, this account won’t yield a reason to be instrumentally coherent on every particular occasion; it would only provide a reason to do so when one’s incoherence is extreme enough to threaten one’s status as an agent.) Furthermore, it is not clear what reasons there are to be disposed to be instrumentally coherent. It might be thought that being disposed to be instrumentally coherent will make one more likely to conform to reason over the long run. But given that instrumental coherence may just as soon be gained by revising one’s attitudes against reason as in conformity to reason, one might doubt that this is so (Kolodny 2008b).
There’s a reason to be skeptical that such a reason could be provided. A reason to be instrumentally coherent as such would have to apply at once to beliefs and intentions. But one might think that this cannot be the case: that reasons for belief and reasons for intention are fundamentally different in kind. Reasons for belief are considerations that show that the belief is likely to be true, whereas reasons for action are considerations that show that the action would realize one’s desires, or promote or respect something of value.
Some philosophers have attempted to meet this challenge. Jonathan Way (2012a) has developed an account which points to the costs necessarily involved in intending to E without also intending to M, specifically the psychological resources that would be wasted (one’s monitoring one’s progress towards E-ing, being disposed to take means towards E-ing, etc.). And Michael Bratman (2009c) has suggested that we have a reason to be instrumentally coherent as such because doing so is a necessary, constitutive component of self-governance, and we have an intrinsic reason to govern ourselves. In his view, just as we have a reason not to torture, and a reason to care for our children, we have a reason to govern ourselves. And one’s being instrumentally incoherent on any particular occasion would be a way of failing to govern oneself. Also, Alex Worsnip (2021, Ch.8) has argued that consideration about coherence constitute (non-derivative) reasons to structure deliberation in certain ways — in particular, they constitute reasons to treat certain options as “off-limits” in one’s deliberations. On this view, we would have reason to treat the instrumentally incoherent combination [intending to X, not intending to Y, believing intending to Y is necessary for X-ing] as off-limits. Why is there such a reason? For Worsnip, it’s simply fitting to stucture deliberation in a way that respects coherence constraints.
3.3 Instrumental Incoherence without Violating Requirements of Reason
A third approach to instrumental incoherence holds that one need not violate any requirement of reason in being instrumentally incoherent. One version of this view (§3.3.1) holds that instrumental coherence is to be explained in terms of appropriate responses to one’s beliefs about independent requirements of reason, where these beliefs could be false. Another version of this view (§3.3.2) holds that instrumental incoherence is nothing more than an indicator that one is not functioning well as an agent, where this evaluation doesn’t entail any particular conclusions about what one ought, or has reason, to do.
3.3.1 Responsiveness to Beliefs about Independent Requirements of Reason
On this first approach to explaining the Violation and Satisfaction Claims, what one does “wrong” in being instrumentally coherent is violate one’s own judgments about one’s reasons (or fail to be attentive enough to form such judgments in the first place), and what one does “right” in becoming instrumentally coherent is respond appropriately to one’s judgments about one’s reasons.
Suppose one is instrumentally incoherent. Plausibly, one is in a position to know this, that one is instrumentally incoherent. Plausibly, one is also in a position to know Ought Pattern 2: the general fact that, when one is instrumentally incoherent, there is some specific change that one ought to make. So, one is in a position to know that there is some specific change that one ought to make. So, plausibly, one ought to give some thought to what this specific change is. In other words,
- If one is instrumentally incoherent, then one ought to arrive at some belief about which attitude (or pattern of attitudes) one ought to have.
Suppose one arrives at some such belief. And suppose one revises one’s attitudes in accordance with that belief. If one becomes instrumentally coherent in this way, then, even if one revises one’s attitudes in the wrong way (i.e., against reason), one still satisfies:
- Self-Monitoring, and
- Krasia: If one believes that reason requires one to X (or not to X), then one is rationally required to X (or not to X).
This would explain the Satisfaction Claim.
It might be thought that it’s not much of an improvement to explain the requirement to be instrumentally coherent in terms of Self-Monitoring and Krasia, since we are still appealing to a requirement of coherence: namely, Krasia. The only difference is that it requires us not to be instrumentally coherent, but instead to be kratically coherent: i.e., to follow one’s judgment about one’s reasons. Indeed, if we thought that it were a requirement of reason to comply with Krasia, then similar challenges to those we discussed in §3.2. would reappear, and so it would not be much of an improvement.
But, the view considered here naturally suggests a new strategy: presenting a Transparency Account according to which the normativity of instrumental coherence is merely apparent (Kolodny 2005, §5). According to the Transparency Account of rational requirements in general, when we point out to people that rationality requires something of them, we aren’t presenting them with some requirement of reason; rather, we’re pointing out to them what they already think reason requires of them. And, so, when we point out to someone that rationality requires they be instrumentally coherent with respect to some end, we’re pointing out to them that (on the assumption that Self-Monitoring is satisfied) they already think that reason requires some specific change in their attitudes. Of course, the instrumentally incoherent agent could be mistaken in these thoughts; perhaps he thinks reason requires him to intend the means when reason actually requires that he abandon the end instead. It is this possibility for false belief that restricts us to saying that the normativity of rational requirements is merely apparent.
However, one might challenge whether the Satisfaction Claim is adequately explained by an appeal to Self-Monitoring and Krasia. Suppose an instrumentally incoherent agent knows that she ought to give up her intention to kill her boss, but instead she comes to intend to poison the office coffee, which she believes to be a necessary means to killing her boss. She clearly violates a requirement of reason and she clearly violates Krasia, but it still seems that she satisfies some requirement in coming to intend the means to her immoral end. The appeal to Self-Monitoring and Krasia can’t explain our thinking that she satisfies some requirement in proceeding this way.
3.3.2 Proper Functioning
Perhaps a violation of a requirement of instrumental coherence is merely an indicator that an agent is not functioning well in the exercise of her rational capacities, where this evaluation doesn’t entail that she ought, or has reason, to be instrumentally coherent on any particular occasion (see Raz 2005a,b). In holding this view, one could also say that there is value in being a properly functioning agent, and that this value is explained by the ways in which functioning properly as a agent tends to bring one into conformity with what reason requires. But, it doesn’t follow from this that there is value in functioning properly, or that one has any reason to function properly, in every particular occasion. (Similar things could be said about the value of having well-functioning perceptual capacities.) For instance, when one has the unalterable intention to kill one’s boss (for more on unalterable ends, see Section 1 of the supplementary document Problems for Wide Scoping), there is nothing valuable in one’s functioning properly, so far as instrumental rationality goes, on that particular occasion, and one would have no reason to do so (see Raz 2005a, especially pp. 10–13, and Bratman 1987).
But one might worry about how well this account explains the Violation and Satisfaction Claims. On this view, the requirements violated, or satisfied, are simply standards of proper rational functioning. These standards can be used to evaluate how well particular agents are functioning, in the same way that standards of what makes for a well-functioning perceptual apparatus can be used to evaluate how well particular perceivers are functioning. But, rational requirements also seem to call for some response. For instance, when we advise others who are in violation of rational requirements, such as those who are instrumentally incoherent, we say that some change in attitude is called for. And, when we ourselves are instrumentally incoherent, we feel some “normative pressure” to change our attitudes in some way (see Kolodny 2005, §4). It’s unclear how these features of rational requirements could be explained by a view that takes them to be merely evaluative.
Another related view attempts to explain instrumental incoherence in terms of the success conditions of the relevant individual attitudes. If your belief that intending to Y is necessary for X-ing is successful (true), then your failure to intend to Y ensures that your intending to X will not be successful (in that it won’t result in your X-ing). In other words, your being instrumentally incoherent ensures that either your instrumental belief is false, or that your intention will not be successfully executed (Brunero 2020, Ch.7). Some philosophers have recently argued that the impossibility of joint attitudinal success can explain coherence requirements in general, not just instrumental rationality (Fullhart and Martinez, forthcoming; Fink, forthcoming).
3.4 “Cognitivist” Requirements on Belief
A fourth approach to explaining the Violation and Satisfaction Claims argues that the requirement violated, or satisfied, is, or is explained by, requirements on belief exclusively. There are two components to this “cognitivist” approach: first, there is some thesis about how intention involves belief, and, second, there is some account of how the requirements governing those involved beliefs constitute, or explain, the requirement to be instrumentally coherent.
Here are some candidates for the first component:
- Strong: If one intends to E, then one believes that one will E.
- Medium: If one intends to E, then one believes that it is possible that one will E.
- Weak: If one intends to E, then one does not believe that one will not E.
(Cognitivist accounts developed with Strong, or a variant of it, are found in Harman 1976, 1986; Velleman 1989, 2007; Setiya 2007; Broome 2009; and Archer 2018. Earlier defenses of Strong can be found in Hampshire and Hart 1958 and Grice 1971. Wallace 2006 develops a cognitivist account with Medium, and Binkley 1965 does so with Weak.)
Let’s begin with Strong. Suppose I am instrumentally incoherent—that is, I intend to E, believe I will E only if I intend to M, but don’t intend to M. According to Strong, I believe
- I will E.
When we pair this with my instrumental belief
- If I will E, then I intend to M,
and apply the theoretical rational requirement
- Rationality requires that [if one believes P, and one believes P → Q, then one believes Q].
we get the result that I am required to believe
- I intend to M,
or drop either (1) or (2). If I drop (1), I would cease to intend to E (according to Strong) and thereby cease to be instrumentally incoherent, and if I drop my instrumental belief (2), I would also cease to be instrumentally incoherent.
But is coming to believe (3) enough to cease to be instrumentally incoherent? What if my belief is false? There are two options for the cognitivist at this point. The first would be to defend
- If one believes that one intends to M, then one intends to M.
But we might doubt that we are infallible in our beliefs about our own intentions (Bratman 2009b, §4,5). After all, it seems that we can be mistaken in our beliefs about other attitudes we have (see Schwitzgebel 2010, §4).
A second option for the cognitivist would be to say that having false beliefs about one’s own intentions is possible, but theoretically irrational. (On this option, the cognitivist approach to instrumental coherence appeals to two theoretical requirements: Closure plus some other requirement not to have false beliefs about one’s own intentions.) However, there is usually nothing necessarily incoherent about one’s having a false belief. So, the challenge for cognitivists is to explain why, in this particular case, there is. (This strategy is pursued by Setiya 2007, 670–671. For criticism, see Bratman 2009a, §4 and Brunero 2009, §2.)
Additionally, one might worry that Strong is too strong. Suppose you intend to go shopping on Thursday but don’t believe you intend this and instead believe that you intend to go shopping on Friday. Maybe you’ve temporarily forgotten that you’ve recently changed your mind, deciding to go on Thursday instead of Friday (Bratman 2009a, §5). In this case, you might not believe you will go shopping on Thursday. In light of this example, John Broome (2009, §7) suggests the following
- Variant of Strong:
- If one believes one intends to E, then one believes one will E.
But this wouldn’t help the cognitivist if she aims to account for the application of instrumental coherence to all intentions, including those we don’t believe we have (Bratman 2009b, §2). Additionally, both Strong and Variant of Strong seem vulnerable to counterexamples. Suppose I intend, and believe I intend, to carry out a difficult task. Knowing the difficulty involved, I could intend to carry out the task but remain agnostic about whether I will do so. Here’s another counterexample: suppose I intend to stop by a bookstore on the way home, but know that once I’m riding on my bicycle, I tend to go on “autopilot.” Aware of my absentminded tendencies, I might intend to stop by the bookstore without believing I will (Bratman 1987, 38–39; also discussed in Holton 2008, §2). Since such intentions make applicable a requirement of instrumental coherence, but don’t involve a belief in success, the cognitivist cannot explain why requirements of instrumental coherence apply to these intentions.
Next, let us consider Medium. Suppose again that I am instrumentally incoherent—that is, I intend to E, believe I will E only if I intend to M, but don’t intend to M. By
- If one does not intend to M, then one believes that one does not intend to M.
- I do not intend to M.
Let us now suppose that the instrumental belief takes this form:
- If I do not intend to M, then it is not possible for me to E.
If I satisfy Closure, then I believe:
- It is not possible for me to E.
However, since I intend to E, then, by Medium, I believe:
- It is possible for me to E.
Thus, in believing (3) and (4), I violate:
- Belief Consistency:
- Rationality requires that [if one believes not P, then one does not believe P]
Thus, if one satisfies Closure, then one violates Belief Consistency (Wallace 2006).
One might object to Self-Knowledge, arguing that we aren’t always aware of what we fail to intend. One might falsely believe one intends the means (Bratman 2009a) or one might simply fail to notice that one hasn’t intended the means (Brunero 2005a). One response available to the cognitivist would be to say that such lapses in self-awareness are possible, but are theoretically irrational. And so instrumental coherence would be explained by Closure, Belief Consistency, and the requirement to be aware of one’s absent intention in this context. While it wouldn’t be plausible to claim that rationality requires, in general, awareness of what one does not intend, it might be plausible to say that awareness of what one does not intend is rationally required in this specific context (Wallace 2006, 118).
One might also object that if one is going to be a cognitivist about practical requirements in general, one must account for both instrumental coherence and
- Intention Consistency:
- One is required [if one intends not to E, then one does not intend to E].
But Medium, on its own, does not seem sufficient to account for Intention Consistency. Such a conflict of intentions would involve the following beliefs:
- It is possible for me not to E,
- It is possible for me to E,
But unlike those beliefs involved according to Strong, namely,
- I will not E,
- I will E,
(5) and (6) are perfectly consistent with one another. I could consistently believe it’s possible that I not go to the game tonight, and possible that I go to the game tonight. So, we are still in need of an explanation of why I’m rationally required to not both intend not to go and intend to go (Bratman 2009b, §3).
One might also raise doubts about Medium. Suppose I know I haven’t yet investigated whether the stores are closed for the holiday on Thursday, and so I haven’t yet formed any beliefs about whether I can go shopping then. Couldn’t I still intend to go shopping on Thursday? That might be irrational or careless planning on my part, but it seems possible. (The example might prove even more convincing if we add the feature of Bratman’s example above: suppose, forgetting about my change of mind, I believe I intend to go shopping on Friday, not on Thursday.) Perhaps doubts could even be raised, not just about whether intending to E involves believing E is possible, but also about whether intending to E involves not believing E is impossible. Richard Holton (2008), drawing on Anscombe’s example from Intention (§52) of a man who is certain he’ll break down under torture but is determined not to break down, has argued that one could intend some end while believing that end isn’t a “live possibility.” Such combinations, Holton argues, may be irrational, but aren’t impossible.
Next, let us consider Weak. Suppose again that I am instrumentally incoherent—that is, I intend to E, believe I will E only if I intend to M, but don’t intend to M. By Self-Knowledge, I believe:
- I do not intend to M.
When this belief is paired with the contrapositive of my instrumental belief
- If I do not intend to M, I will not E,
Closure requires that I believe
- I will not E,
or cease to believe (1) or (2). But since I intend to E, it follows, by Weak, that I do not believe (3). Were I to comply with Closure by forming the belief (3), I would, according to Weak, thereby cease to intend to E. In ceasing to believe (2), I would cease to be instrumentally incoherent. And in ceasing to believe (1) (which, if Self-Knowledge is true, would mean that it is no longer the case that I do not intend to M) I would also cease to be instrumentally incoherent.
Some of the objections mentioned above would also apply to this account. There is the objection to Self-Knowledge. And Anscombe’s example, exploited by Holton, also presents a challenge to Weak, since the torture victim intends not to break down but believes that he will.
Additionally, one might raise questions concerning the rationality of responding to the violation of Closure in this context. Usually, if one discovers that one believes P, P → Q, but does not believe Q, the rational way to proceed depends upon one’s assessment of the relevant reasons for belief (where these are evidential, not pragmatic, reasons). Let us assume, for simplicity, that P → Q is a fixed background belief. If one thinks there are really strong reasons for believing P and not strong reasons for not believing Q, then it would be irrational for one to refuse to believe Q and instead to drop one’s belief that P. Now, according to this cognitivist account, when I’m instrumentally incoherent, I believe (1) and (2) but not (3). How should I proceed? If I currently do not intend to M, and if, as Self-Knowledge holds, I’m infallibly aware of what I do not intend, then it seems that the evidence I have for my belief that I do not intend to M is really quite strong. Let’s assume (2) is a fixed background belief. In revising in light of my assessment of the evidence, it seems that the revision could only proceed in one direction: by modus ponens, coming to believe I will not E. It would be irrational for me instead to proceed by modus tollens, ceasing to believe that I do not intend to M. So, if we respond to violations of Closure in the usual way, we are left with the counterintuitive result that there is only one way to escape a state of instrumental incoherence: by abandoning the end.
Finally, one might also cast doubt on the general cognitivist strategy being employed here, whether it appeals to Weak, Medium, or Strong. Many of the same questions that we’ve raised about instrumental incoherence could be raised about rational requirements on belief, including Belief Consistency and Closure. There are analogues of the Violation and Satisfaction Claims for these rational requirements that would need to be defended and explained. For example, Joseph Raz questions whether the analogue of the Violation Claim for Belief Consistency is even true (see Raz 2005b, §3; Raz 2005a, §5). If one has a set of beliefs that is inconsistent, then at least one of the beliefs in that set is false. But, Raz argues, it does not follow that there is any revision in one’s beliefs that one ought to make. (Reflection on logical paradoxes, like the sorities paradox, shows that having an inconsistent set of beliefs doesn’t imply that there is any belief in the set that one ought to give up.) Although Raz objects to the cognitivist’s appeal to Belief Consistency in particular, similar questions might be raised about the cognitivist’s appeal to Closure.
4. The Status of Instrumental Rationality
Much discussion of instrumental rationality has taken place in the context of a debate about whether instrumental rationality is the only kind of practical rationality or, alternatively, there are other requirements of practical rationality as well, such as requirements of prudence and morality. Typically, the former view is called a “Humean” one and the latter a “Kantian” one. In this section, we’ll consider some possible understandings of the thesis that instrumental rationality is the only kind of practical rationality (§4.1), and whether some version of this thesis is given any support by an instrumental analogue of Lewis Carroll’s famous paradox concerning modus ponens (§4.2). We’ll also consider the views of Hume (§4.3) and Kant (§4.4) on instrumental rationality.
4.1 The Only Kind of Practical Rationality?
It is sometimes claimed that instrumental rationality is the only kind of practical rationality. But what exactly is being claimed?
Is the claim about rational incoherence? Then it would seem to be the claim that the only kind of practical, rational incoherence is instrumental incoherence. But this claim would have to contend with the idea that there are other kinds of practical, rational incoherence. For example, it seems incoherent to refuse to intend what one believes one ought to intend. It also seems incoherent to intend to X and to intend to Y when one believes that if one Xs, one will not Y.
Alternatively, the claim might be about reason: that all (practical) reason is, in some sense, instrumental. On one interpretation, the claim would say that the only true claim about reason is some principle of instrumental transmission. But this would seem to imply that there are no practical reasons at all. Unless there is some other true claim about reasons for “ends” understood as actions, there is nothing to be transmitted. (For arguments that there would need to be another kind of rationality, see Nozick 1993; Korsgaard 1997; Hampton 1998; Hubin 1999; Lavin 2004.)
A different interpretation is that all reasons are instrumental. In other words, the reason for any action (or intention) can be expressed as: the action will help to bring about some “end,” where “end” is understood not as an action, but instead as some valuable or desired state of affairs. The Desire-Based Theory is committed to this claim. But not all Value-Based Theories are. The reason for an action, for example, might be that it honors or respects something of value, even though it does not help to bring it about.
A final interpretation is that all deliberation is of means. In other words, there is no place for significant evaluative or normative reflection on the ultimate ends that one has reason to bring about. The Desire-Based Theory seems committed to this claim, at least to some extent. According to the Desire-Based Theory, reflection on the ultimate ends that one has reason to bring about is just reflection on the non-normative matter of what one in fact desires, plus grasp of the Desire-Based Theory itself. On the other hand, Value-Based theories seem committed to rejecting this claim, even those Value-Based Theories that accept that all reasons are instrumental in the sense discussed in the previous paragraph. For whether a certain state of affairs is valuable, and so an end that one has reason to bring about, is itself the object of significant evaluative thought. (Note that it is a mistake to express the present idea, that all deliberation is of means, as the idea that one cannot be criticized for ends. According to the Desire-Based Theory, one can be criticized for what one intends or acts to bring about, insofar as it is not the realization of one’s strongest, present intrinsic desires. And even according to Value-Based theories, one cannot be criticized for what one has reason to bring about.)
Notice that the Desire-Based Theory is committed to the claim that practical reason is exclusively instrumental, on these two last interpretations. This may explain why the Desire-Based Theory is often simply identified with “instrumental rationality,” and why the claim that “the only kind of practical rationality is instrumental rationality” is sometimes just meant as an assertion of the Desire-Based Theory.
4.2 The Relevance of Carroll’s Paradox
Lewis Carroll (1895) introduced a famous paradox concerning modus ponens. Some philosophers have argued that an instrumental analogue of this paradox shows there to be something special about instrumental rationality, and perhaps even provides support for some version of the thesis that instrumental rationality is the only kind of practical rationality.
Carroll imagined a conversation between Achilles and a Tortoise regarding the following valid argument:
- Things that are equal to the same are equal to each other.
- The two sides of the Triangle are equal to the same.
- The two sides are equal to each other.
The Tortoise adopts a skeptical position, asking how he can be logically forced into accepting (Z) when he accepts (A) and (B). Achilles attempts to supply him with the missing premise:
- If (A) & (B) are true, (Z) must be true.
But the Tortoise grants (C), and resumes his skepticism, asking how he can be logically forced to accept (Z) when he accepts (A), (B), and (C). It soon dawns on Achilles that the mere addition of further premises (like “If (A), (B), and (C) are true, (Z) must be true”, and so on) won’t help resolve the Tortoise’s skepticism. One could keep on adding such premises ad infinitum and yet not get the Tortoise to accept (Z).
Much has been written about what lessons to draw from Carroll’s paradox, but this much seems clear: the Tortoise refuses to accept (Z) because he refuses to apply modus ponens to the premises he accepts. So, if modus ponens itself is merely accepted by him as yet another premise, that won’t suffice to get him to accept (Z).
Now, imagine we confront someone who holds some end E, believes some means M is necessary for E-ing, yet doesn’t intend to M, and, like the Tortoise, doesn’t intend to M because he refuses to apply instrumental rationality to the ends he has, including E. If we suggest that he remedy this defect by adopting yet another end (namely, the end of doing what instrumental rationality requires), this wouldn’t help matters. Since his problem is that he doesn’t apply instrumental rationality to the ends he has, he wouldn’t apply instrumental rationality to this new end as well, and so still wouldn’t intend to M (or drop the intention to E). So, the mere addition of instrumental rationality as another end would be futile.
What should we conclude from this instrumental analogue of Carroll’s paradox? Railton (1997) argues that it shows that a certain form of skepticism about rationality—specifically, one’s asking “Why should I comply with the norms of practical rationality?”—can be answered. First, the asking of this skeptical question reveals a commitment to at least instrumental rationality, since one is here questioning whether being practically rational would advance one’s ends. And, second, the instrumental analogue of Carroll’s paradox shows that we can’t think of this commitment to instrumental rationality as merely another end the agent accepts and could dismiss at will. If the skeptic thinks it is, Railton suggests that “we can answer ‘No, on pain of regress, it cannot be just another end of yours’” (p. 317).
However, it’s not clear why the skeptic would have to think of instrumental rationality as just another end she has. Couldn’t she think of it instead as (or also as) a disposition that she manifests, or a capacity that she exercises, with respect to the ends that she accepts? (If so, she would avoid the particular problem that confronts the character in the instrumental analogue of Carroll’s paradox, who merely accepts instrumental rationality as another end without applying it to her ends.) And then couldn’t she request some philosophical explanation of why she should exercise that capacity? That she already has the capacity is of course no barrier to posing such a question (Wedgwood 2005). Indeed, as we’ve seen in §3.3, some philosophers have denied that we always ought, or have reason, to be instrumentally coherent; they’ve argued that rational requirements are only apparently normative, or are merely evaluative.
Dreier (2001) concludes that the instrumental analogue of Carroll’s paradox shows that instrumental rationality has a special status. In Carroll’s original paradox, the Tortoise would be such that we couldn’t give him reasons to believe in some proposition. In the normal case, I can provide you with a reason to believe Q by getting you to believe P and to believe P → Q. But this simply won’t work for the Tortoise, who refuses to apply modus ponens. Likewise, Dreier observes, we would be incapable of giving reasons to someone who refused to draw “practical inferences” between ends and means. The acceptance of instrumental rationality is thus, he argues, a necessary condition for being receptive to reasons at all. And this supports his conclusion that “the only ultimate sort of reasons are instrumental reasons” (p. 43). This seems to be an endorsement of the Desire-Based Theory.
Does the conclusion follow? Even if a disposition to be instrumentally rational is indispensable in the way Dreier suggests to having a practical reason, nothing follows about what one has practical reason to do. Additionally, it’s worth noting that it’s doubtful that Carroll’s original paradox would license a restriction on the scope of theoretical reasons analogous to the Humean restriction on the scope of practical reasons that Dreier thinks the instrumental analogue of Carroll’s paradox supports. That is, it is not obvious that I have reason to believe Q only if I am disposed to come to believe it by applying modus ponens. Perhaps my merely believing, with reason, both P and P → Q provides me with a reason for believing Q. Or perhaps the mere fact the available evidence supports Q is enough (Jollimore 2005).
Korsgaard (2009) argues that we can draw a conclusion about the metaethical status of instrumental rationality by considering an instrumental analogue of Carroll’s paradox. Specifically, she appeals to it to argue against metaethical realism about instrumental rationality (and about other normative principles as well). Let’s suppose that there is a requirement of reason to be instrumentally coherent. A realist would claim that there is some normative fact, according to which we ought to be instrumentally coherent. But a skeptic might ask, “Why ought I apply that fact—that I ought to be instrumentally coherent—to my actions?” The realist might answer, “Because—and here’s another normative fact—it just is the case that you ought to apply the fact that you ought to be instrumentally coherent to your actions.” But one might resume one’s skepticism and ask why one must apply that normative fact to one’s actions. One could keep adding normative facts ad infinitum without providing an answer to the question, in the same way that Achilles could keep adding premises without meeting the Tortoise’s challenge.
A full discussion of the metaethical issues raised by this argument would take us too far afield (see Parfit 2006). But one strategy of reply is to argue that the realist has already answered the question. What it is for such normative facts to be normative just is that they require that you act in some way. If you’re asking of normative facts in general why you should act in accordance with them, then you don’t fully understand what normative facts are.
4.3 Hume on Instrumental Rationality
The thesis that instrumental rationality is the only kind of practical rationality is often taken to be a “Humean” thesis, though, as we’ve seen (§4.1), there are several ways in which this thesis could be understood. One could take the thesis just to be an assertion of the Desire-Based Theory. One could also take the thesis to specify that instrumental coherence is the only requirement of practical rationality. However, it is doubtful that Hume held either of these views.
There are some passages which might seem to suggest these views. In Book II of the Treatise (1739–40), Hume denies that a person’s ends, however immoral or imprudent, can be unreasonable (“contrary to reason,” to use his exact phrase) if they’re not based on a false belief:
Where a passion is neither founded on false suppositions, nor chuses means insufficient for the end, the understanding can neither justify nor condemn it. ’Tis not contrary to reason to prefer the destruction of the world to the scratching of my finger. ’Tis not contrary to reason for me to chuse my total ruin, to prevent the least uneasiness of an Indian or person wholly unknown to me. ’Tis as little contrary to reason to prefer even my own acknowledg’d lesser good to my greater, and have a more ardent affection for the former than the latter. (p. 416)
Here he seems to claim that one’s choosing means insufficient for one’s end can be deemed unreasonable, even though the end itself is not subject to such rational assessment.
However, this wouldn’t support the Desire-Based Theory, since the Desire-Based Theory allows that ends can be unreasonable when they don’t promote the satisfaction of one’s strongest, present intrinsic desires. For instance, choosing one’s total ruin, when doing so runs counter to one’s strongest, present intrinsic desires, even when doing so isn’t based on a false belief, can be criticized as unreasonable on the Desire-Based Theory.
Soon after this passage, Hume is careful to note that it wouldn’t be one’s intending of means insufficient for one’s ends that’s unreasonable, but the false belief on which this intention is based. For example, when I falsely believe that staying on 95N will get me to Memphis, which is where I intend to go, and so I intend to stay on 95N, it’s my belief that 95N will get me to Memphis that’s unreasonable, not the intention, based on this belief, to stay on 95N.
Why did Hume think this? Hume holds that “reason is the discovery of truth and falsehood” (p. 458). Since beliefs aim to correctly represent the world—and the beliefs that succeed in representing the world are true, while the beliefs that fail to do so are false—they can be assessed as reasonable or unreasonable. But passions, as well as intentions and actions, are “original existences.” They don’t purport to represent or “copy” some other “existence” (p. 415). Specifically, they don’t aim to correctly represent the world, and so they can’t be true or false. Hence, they can’t be assessed as reasonable or unreasonable.
In light of such considerations, many philosophers have argued that Hume doesn’t endorse an instrumentalist conception of practical reason, but instead, more radically, is a skeptic about all of practical reason. (See, for instance, Hampton 1995; Millgram 1995; Korsgaard 1997. For objections to this skeptical interpretation of Hume, see Setiya 2004.) On this interpretation, Hume acknowledges the existence of requirements of theoretical reason, since beliefs can be assessed as reasonable or unreasonable, but is skeptical about the existence of requirements of practical reason, including instrumental reason, since desires, intentions, and actions can’t be assessed as reasonable or unreasonable. (Even a preference for “one’s own acknowledg’d lesser good” wouldn’t be unreasonable, on his view.) Since, on this interpretation, Hume was skeptical about practical reason in general, we can’t appeal to his view to establish a special place for instrumental rationality among the requirements of practical rationality.
Various challenges could be raised against Hume’s rather narrow conception of reason. But our primary interest here is in whether Hume can provide us with a plausible account of instrumental rationality. On Hume’s view, our intentions are subject to rational criticism when, and only when, they are based on false beliefs (and, again, it’s the belief that’s to blame, strictly speaking). As an account of instrumental rationality, Hume’s view would face two serious objections.
First, it seems that one can be instrumentally irrational without having any intentions based on false beliefs (or lacking any intentions because of false beliefs). John Broome provides an example: suppose I know the hotel is on fire and that the only escape involves my intending to go through the open window, and, though I intend to live, I sit on the windowsill singing happily until the flames consume me. This is a clear case of instrumental irrationality, despite my not having any false beliefs (Broome 1997). Indeed, one could fail to intend the means believed necessary for one’s ends because of rage, depression, distraction, grief, or other causes which don’t necessarily involve any false beliefs (Korsgaard 1986). Hume would have to conclude either that such cases are impossible, or that they involve no instrumental irrationality.
Second, it seems that one can have intentions based on false beliefs without being instrumentally irrational, or irrational in any other way. Instrumental rationality, as it’s usually understood, is a requirement of coherence governing one’s intentions and beliefs—a requirement that is in place regardless of the truth of those beliefs. The person who intends to get to Memphis, believes that he must intend to stay on 95N to get there, and does intend to stay on 95N, displays coherence in his attitudes, despite having a false belief. So, an accusation of instrumental irrationality here would be misplaced. (Additionally, it would also be inappropriate to accuse him of any theoretical irrationality, if we suppose that this belief isn’t inconsistent with any other beliefs he holds, and he also believes there’s conclusive evidence for it, and so forth.) Hume would have to conclude either that such cases are impossible, or that they involve instrumental irrationality.
4.4 Kant on Hypothetical Imperatives
An alternative to the narrow instrumentalism associated with Hume is found in the work of Immanuel Kant, who thought that rationality required us not only to be instrumentally rational, but also to obey the moral law. In his Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Kant distinguishes two kinds of imperatives:
Now all imperatives command either hypothetically or categorically. The former represent the practical necessity of a possible action as a means for attaining something else one wants (or may possibly want). The categorical imperative would be one which represented an action as objectively necessary in itself, without reference to another end. (4:414—citations use volume and pages from the Akademie Edition)
For example, “If you intend to go to law school, take the LSAT” would be a hypothetical imperative since it commands an action (taking the LSAT) as a means to some end (going to law school). If you didn’t have any ends that would be served by taking the LSAT, the command for you to do so would be withdrawn. Categorical imperatives, such as “If someone is drowning nearby, offer assistance,” differ in two ways. First, the command to offer assistance applies to you regardless of whether offering assistance serves any of your (desired or intended) ends. Second, you have a reason to offer assistance regardless of whether doing so serves any of your (desired or intended) ends. (Philippa Foot has argued that this second feature doesn’t follow from the first: a rule of etiquette, or a club rule, may apply to you regardless of whether compliance with it serves any of your ends, but you may nonetheless have no reason to comply with it. See Foot 1972.)
By “one wants” in the passage above, Kant means “one wills”: something closer to “one intends” than “one desires.” (After all, it wouldn’t be plausible to suggest that one is instrumentally irrational in not intending the necessary means to what one merely wants. I want to own a BMW, but I don’t intend to work the kind of job that would allow me to buy one. But there’s nothing incoherent about my continuing to desire to own one.) According to Kant:
How an imperative of skill is possible requires no special discussion. Whoever will the end, wills (so far as reason has decisive influence on his actions) also the means that are indispensably necessary to his actions and that lie in his power. This proposition, as far as willing is concerned, is analytic. (4:417)
But if Kant’s view is to provide a plausible account of instrumental coherence, it should instead refer to the means believed to be indispensably necessary, since there is nothing incoherent about not willing necessary means of which you are unaware, and something incoherent about not willing the means you believe are necessary, even when they actually aren’t (Korsgaard 1997, 236).
Kant’s parenthetical remark in the passage above is important. For Kant, when one fails to will the necessary means to one’s ends, then reason has failed to have decisive influence. In other words, one is irrationally incoherent. Less guardedly, Kant says “the proposition (if I fully will the effect, then I will the action required of it) is analytic” (4:417). But it is puzzling how this proposition could be analytic. If it were analytic, then it would be conceptually impossible to be instrumentally incoherent since whenever one doesn’t will the means, then one doesn’t will the end. (For defense of this conceptual impossibility, see Finlay 2009 and Lee 2022.) And if it’s conceptually impossible to be instrumentally incoherent, we’d be unable to make sense of why Kant formulates his account of instrumental incoherence in terms of imperatives, which, on Kant’s view, are commands addressed to a will that is capable of both following and not following the commands (Kant 1785, 4:414; Hill 1973, 430; Korsgaard 1997, 236). So, perhaps we should read Kant’s claim as that if one wills the end, rationality requires that one will the means. (For an alternative reading, see Lee 2018.)
Even so, there is a debate over the interpretation of Kant’s claim, particularly about the logical scope of “requires.” According to the wide-scope interpretation of Kant’s claim, what reason requires is that one either will the means or not will the end. In contrast, according the narrow-scope interpretation of Kant’s claim, if one wills the end, then what reason requires is that one will the means. The wide-scope interpretation posits a disjunctive requirement (that one either not will the end or will the means) that, like Kant’s categorical imperative, applies to every rational agent, regardless of the particular ends she wills. But it’s hard to square the existence of such a universally applicable requirement with some other claims Kant makes about how hypothetical imperatives are to be distinguished from categorical ones, and how hypothetical imperatives could be derived from an analysis of the concept of willing an end. (See Schroeder 2005b. For a defense of the wide-scope interpretation against Schroeder’s objections, see Rippon 2014. For a related discussion of these issues, see Schwartz 2008.)
But the narrow-scope interpretation appears to leave Kant’s view vulnerable to “detachment” objections. Suppose you will some immoral end but, irrationally, don’t will the immoral means you believe necessary to carry out this immoral end. On the narrow-scope interpretation, reason would require that you will the immoral means. But that seems implausible. At the very least, it would lead to something Kant wouldn’t accept: reason issuing contradictory commands. Your willing the immoral means would be required by a hypothetical imperative but forbidden by the categorical imperative (Hill 1973, 436).
Kant could avoid the detachment problem if he holds, as some interpreters claim, that it is impossible to will (Wille) immoral ends (Schroeder 2005b, §3). If this interpretation is right, then reason would never require one to will immoral means. But it would also leave Kant without an account of instrumental incoherence, at least as we have been understanding it. After all, agents can display instrumental incoherence in the pursuit of both moral and immoral ends. To use Kant’s own examples, the doctor who doesn’t intend the means believed necessary to making his patient healthy is instrumentally incoherent in the same way as is the poisoner who doesn’t intend the means believed necessary to kill his victim (4:415). So, this interpretation would have Kant avoiding the detachment objection, but at the cost of no longer presenting an account of instrumental incoherence that holds regardless of whether the end is reasonable or good.
Let’s now turn to Kant’s explanation of the normative authority of hypothetical imperatives. While Kant presents a complicated and intricate argument to explain the normative authority of the categorical imperative, he claims that hypothetical imperatives require “no special discussion,” and spends comparatively little time discussing them (4:417). Kant’s approach here—which might seem to play into the hands of instrumentalists (see §4.1 above) who, while skeptical of the rational authority of the categorical imperative, follow Kant in thinking that the authority of hypothetical imperatives is obvious and unproblematic—has been challenged. Although the “ought” of a hypothetical imperative is contingent on an agent’s ends, that “ought” still needs to be explained. Additionally, it’s not clear that a hypothetical “ought” is any more compatible with a naturalistic worldview than a categorical one. Specifically, some of the same metaethical challenges that have been raised about the status of the categorical “ought” could be raised about normative claims in general, including the hypothetical “ought” (Hampton 1998, Ch. 4; Shafer-Landau 2006, §6).
So, what is Kant’s explanation of the normative authority of hypothetical imperatives? According to Korsgaard (1997), Kant’s views changed over the course of his philosophical development. Kant’s early “dogmatic rationalist” view (evident in the Groundwork) held that we should comply with these hypothetical imperatives simply because they express what a perfectly rational agent would do. But the mature Kantian view—which Korsgaard endorses—explains the normative authority of hypothetical imperatives in terms of the commitments that are constitutive of willing. According to this view, what’s involved in willing some end (as opposed to merely desiring it) is being committed to taking the means to that end. It’s not that complying with this commitment is constitutive of intention (this would render instrumental irrationality conceptually impossible) but that having this commitment is constitutive of intention. So, when one is instrumentally irrational, one fails to live up to one’s own commitments. Korsgaard writes:
…willing an end just is committing yourself to realizing the end. Willing an end, in other words, is an essentially first-personal and normative act. To will an end is to give oneself a law, hence, to govern oneself. … What is constitutive of willing the end is … the inward, volitional act of prescribing the end along with the means it requires to yourself. (Korsgaard 1997, 245)
But is Korsgaard right that willing an end necessarily involves prescribing that end to yourself? Korsgaard argues that to will some end, you must at least take that end to be good in some sense, and you must also think that there is a reason for pursuing that end (246, 250–1). But it seems possible for one to have some akratic end while failing to see anything even pro tanto good about it, or any reason to pursue it (Wallace 2006, §1). And it’s clear that one could display instrumental rationality or irrationality relative to these akratic ends. So, Korsgaard’s view seems unable to explain the authority of instrumental rationality with respect to such ends—ends that an agent has but doesn’t prescribe to herself.
Korsgaard offers a second Kantian explanation of the authority of instrumental rationality. She argues that incessant instrumental irrationality threatens one’s status as an agent:
So the reason that I must conform to the instrumental principle is that if I don’t conform to it, if I always allow myself to be derailed by timidity, idleness, or depression, then I never really will an end. The desire to pursue the end and the desires that draw me away from it each hold sway in their turn, but my will is never active. The distinction between my will and the operation of the desires and impulses in me does not exist and that means that I, considered as an agent, do not exist. (1997, 247)
But this argument doesn’t provide a reason to conform to the instrumental principle in every case in which the instrumental principle is applicable. Rather, it provides a reason to do so only when accompanied by enough other instances of non-conformity to threaten one’s status as an agent (Kolodny 2005, 544; Shaver 2006, 342). So, like the previous Kantian argument, and like the Hume’s skepticism discussed in §4.3, this argument also fails to explain why instrumental rationality applies in every case in which it does.
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