Supplement to Rigid Designators

Stipulating Identity Trans-world, Without Qualitative Criteria for a Designatum to Satisfy

Kripke discusses at some length a natural worry about rigidity’s commitment to transworld identity. The worry is that in order “to make sense of the notion of rigid designator, we must antecedently make sense of ‘criteria of transworld identity’” (1980, p. 49). A rigidity theorist must accordingly provide explicit criteria for how any object, with respect to any possible world, would qualify as the designatum: criteria in which “all reference to objects, as opposed to qualities, has disappeared” (1980, p. 52). Since these criteria are very hard to provide, rigidity seems unattainable or otherwise problematic. Perhaps the need for such criteria “shows how the very notion of rigid designator runs in a circle” (1971, p. 146).

Kripke doesn’t cite anyone as holding just this worry about rigidity. But there is a long tradition of worrying along these lines; so the worry must have some appeal. Perhaps the appeal can be indicated by way of considerations to be adduced here. The worry is, at its basis, epistemological. Some sort of grasp on what the intended referent is supposed to be would be needed to coin a term that successfully refers. We can’t merely scrawl an expression, pronounce it, and without further work achieve reference by our words; we need some idea of what a name is to attach to, if we hope to name anything. We need to provide directions, so to speak, rich enough to orient a name to a referent for different situations we discuss, as when we say that so-and-so did this or that but could have done otherwise. If there were genuine qualitative criteria for individuals, criteria accessible to us, then they would do the job: in that case, if we were to specify that the name we coin is to refer to whatever object has such and such “height, weight, and general appearance in that we can tell by broadly empirical means whether a given object has it or lacks it” (Plantinga 1974, p. 93), then we would specify enough to allow our term to find its target, so to speak, with respect to any given world. Historically, some have bit the bullet and affirmed qualitative criteria in order to uphold rigid reference (Lowe 2008 discusses Locke on just this head; Brown 2000 discusses Brentano). Qualitative criteria might carry the burden of explaining how we have enough information to refer, when we name something.

Qualitative criteria may not be the only means of carrying that burden. The epistemological worry behind a demand for qualitative criteria is not bound to that specific demand. You might hold that objects have substantive essences—characteristics that account for what an object is, or for what it would be to be that object—whether or not you suppose those essential characteristics to be qualitative. Then you could express the fundamental worry at hand in something like this fashion, with Jonathan Lowe (2008, p. 41): “It should strike one as odd to the point of paradoxicality to maintain that we can talk or think comprehendingly about things without knowing what it is that we are talking or thinking about—that is, without grasping their essences.”

You might see all of this as an argument that we do indeed have a knowledge of essences (Lowe 2008, p. 42n; 2007, pp. 290–291). But Kripke (1980) and Putnam (1975) have done much to throw doubts on whether we have knowledge of essences belonging to things we talk about. It does not seem easy to say, in any nontrivial way, what makes you to be you, according to most views about essences. A common view would be that you are essentially a product of certain biological parents; but we might not know which ones. Perhaps we never do. Jackson (1998, p. 50) expresses the usual sentiment: “We rarely know the essence of the things our worlds denote (indeed, if Kripke is right about the necessity of origin, we do not know our own essences).”

Should we then despair about achieving rigid designation? There is historical precedent for that response (John Duns Scotus, for example, forsook rigid reference; King discusses Scotus on this head: forthcoming, §3 and §4). But despair has not been the usual response since Kripke has elevated rigidity to cynosural levels of attention. Still, philosophers may have been dismissing grounds for despair too quickly.

It is tempting to dismiss the epistemological troubles at hand by appeal to the familiar mechanisms of ostention or stipulation, both associated with the causal theory of reference. But these mechanisms do not even together settle the troubles. I cannot simply point to an object like you and thereby settle designation, contrary to what we might initially think. Although I can point to an object like you I cannot point to that particular’s essence. Nor can I differentiate, in pointing, between distinct objects, right where I point: you, your body, a collection of atoms, etc. If you and these other particulars are different objects, and if it is beyond my ability to specify enough to single out your distinctive differences, then how am I able to attach a name to you by stipulating that the name is to follow through various possible worlds the one who is you and not the others to which I also point? This problem, discussed today under the label ‘qua problem’, has been known since antiquity.[14]

We speakers evidently need some sort of compensatory device to serve instead of defining criteria of identity to supplement stipulation and ostention in order to get your name, say, to keep track of the relevant object, namely you, whose essence is not fully understood, with respect to other worlds.

What resources are available to rigidity theorists to explain our ability to designate you from world to world? What compensatory devices are on the table of discussion? Various workers have built up a tangled nest of supporting strands around the causal theory of reference, in part in order to explain this. Mechanisms often supposed, for better or for worse, to help to bring it about that our stipulation, ostention, and so on, successfully guides our assigned designator to the right candidate for designation, include mechanisms articulated in both the “causal–descriptive theory of reference,” a hybrid theory appealing to descriptive information as well as causal factors, and in the “recognitional theory of reference,” a non-descriptive theory. Some theorists also appeal to the theory of direct reference. Again, none of these mechanisms for achieving reference appeals to a speaker’s ability to offer a qualitative or similarly rich descriptive account of criteria necessary and sufficient for designation, from world to world. Hence, it is not uncommon to acknowledge today that a speaker can use a word to express just the appropriate content even though that speaker “does not understand what he himself means when he utters his word” (Bealer 2002 pp. 98–99). Locke despaired of being able to designate “we know not what”; but that is just what most philosophers today say that we do, by way of something like what Swinburne calls “uninformative rigid designators” (Swinburne 2007 p. 156). Let the interested reader follow up elsewhere these issues about how words get hooked up to what they should get hooked up to (for further discussion and citations see LaPorte 2013, pp. 190–193).

Copyright © 2022 by
Joseph LaPorte <>

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