Notes to Śāntarakṣita

1. Frauwallner 1961, 141–43. For a further discussion of the dating of Śāntarakṣita, see Ruegg 1981, 88–89 and Ruegg 1982, 514–515, and for an overview of Śāntarakṣita’s life and works see Eltschinger and Marks 2019.

2. There are eleven texts attributed to Śāntarakṣita in the Tibetan Tengyur (bstan ‘gyur), the collection of translations of Indian Buddhist canonical writings. These include texts in the sections of “Collections of Praises” (bstod tshogs) and “Commentaries on Tantras” (rgyud ’grel) in addition to his philosophical works. Only three of these eleven survive in Sanskrit. A twelfth text, Investigation of the Ultimate (Paramārthaviniścaya, Don dam pa gtan la dbab pa), which Śāntarakṣita references in two of his other philosophical works, is no longer extant in any language and is thus a great loss to those interested in the philosophical thought of this great Indian philosopher.

3. For and extensive discussion of the dating of Nāgārjuna and the problems involved with determining his dates with precision, see Walser 2005. For a translation and edition of Nāgārjuna’s most important work, The Fundamental Verses of the Middle Way (Mūlamadhyamakakārikā), see Katsura and Siderits (2013).

4. Yogācāra and Cittamātra, are but two names among several closely related schools of thought in India at the time whose philosophical views shared many key tenets.

5. For a detailed study of this text, see Blumenthal (2004). See also Ichigō (1985, 1989). Consideration of Śāntarakṣita’s encyclopedic work, Tattvasaṃgraha must also be considered for a more complete understanding of Śāntarakṣita’s Madhyamaka thought as well as other aspects of his philosophical thinking. See Goodman 2022 for a translation of selected chapters. It is quite unfortunate that Śāntarakṣita’s text Paramārthaviniścaya (Don dam pa gan la dbab pa, Investigation of the Ultimate) is no longer extant in any language (see fn 2 above). A commentary on Jñānagarbha’s Madhyamaka treatise, Satyadvayavihaṅga, entitled Satyadvayavihaṅgapañjikā (Commentary on [Jñānagarbha’s] ‘Distinction Between the Two Truths’ ) is attributed to Śāntarakṣita, though that attribution has been contested since the early fifteenth century. Contemporary scholars have not reached consensus on the attribution. It may represent an early period in Śāntarakṣita’s Madhyamaka thought, or it may be an altogether false attribution, but its ideas certainly vary in important ways from the later thought of Śāntarakṣita found in MA and MAV.

6. See Blumenthal (2004, 297). bdag dang gzhan smra’i dngos ’di dag // yang dag tu nag cig pa dang // du ma’i rang bzhin bral ba’i phyir // rang bzhin med de gzugs brnyan bzhin //. Sanskrit preserved in Prajñākaramati’s Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā ad 9.2: niḥsvabhāvā amī bhāvās tattvataḥ svaparoditāḥ / ekānekasvabhāvena viyogāt pratibimbavat // (Ruegg 1981, 91, note 294). On the “neither one nor many” argument see Hugon (2015).

7. Ibid. (2004, 297–98). ’bras bu rim can nyer sbyor bas // rtag rnams gcig pu’i bdag nyid min // ‘bras bu re re tha dad na // de dag rtag las nyams par ‘gyur //.

8. Ibid. (2004, 312–13). dngos po gang gang rnam dpyad pa / de dang de la gcig nyid med / gang la gcig nyid yod min pa / de la du ma nyid kyang med // gcig dang du ma ma gtogs par / rnam pa gzhan dang ldan pa yi / dngos po mi rung ‘di gnyis ni / phan tshun spangs te gnas phyir ro //.

9. Ibid. (2004, 313). de phyir dngos po ‘di dag ni / kun rdzob kho na’i mtshan nyid ‘dzin / gal te ‘di bdag don ‘dod na / de la bdag gis ci zhig bya // ma brtags gcig pun yams dga’zhing / skye dang ‘jig pa’ichos can pa / don byed pa dag nus rnams kyis / rang bzhin kun rdzob pa yin rtogs //.

10. In Tibetan classifications of Indian Buddhist thinkers, Śāntarakṣita was considered to be the quintessential exponent of the school of thought which was simply known as Yogācāra-Madhyamaka (rnal ‘byor spyod pa’i dbu ma pa) during the early period of Buddhism in Tibet, and later as “Yogācāra-Svātantrika-Madhyamaka” (rnal ‘byor spyod pa’i dbu ma rang rgyud pa). The terms retranslated into Sanskrit from the Tibetan are neologisms, never used by the actual Indian philosophers to whom they were applied.

11. Blumenthal, 2004, 320. rgyu dang ‘bras bur gyur pa yang / shes pa ‘ba’ zhig kho na ste / rang gis grub pa gang yin pa / de ni shes par gnas pa yin //.

12. Ibid. 284. sems tsam la na brten nas su / phyi rol dngos med shes par bya / tshul ‘dir brten nas de la yang / shin tu bdag med shes par bya //.

13. For a detailed treatment of this process, see Blumenthal (2004).

14. Sara McClintock discusses Śāntarakṣita’s use of sliding scales of analysis in his application of logical form in McClintock (2003) and (2010). Blumenthal (2004) discusses the use of shifting provisionalities in MA as well. Georges Dreyfus discusses a similar utilization of sliding scales in the works of Dharmakīrti in Dreyfus (1997).

15. The tradition of logico-epistemological discourse, including both Buddhist and non-Buddhist proponents is often referred to by the Sanskrit neologism, “pramāṇavāda” in reference to this discourse on pramāṇas, means of valid knowledge.

16. The pre-Dignāga Nyāyā school proposed four types of pramāṇa: perception (pratyakṣa), inference (anumāna) , verbal testimony (śabda), and analogy (upamāna).

17. There are four types of perception put forth by Dignāga and subsequent pramāṇavāda thinkers, all of which cognize particulars (svalakṣaṇa): sense perception (indriyajñāna), mental perception (manovijñāna), self-cognizing cognition (svasaṃvedana), and yogic direct perception (yogijñāna).

18. Every inference (anumāna) has three key components: a subject (dharmin), a predicate (sādhyadharma), and a reason (hetu). There is also an optional example (dṛṣṭānta) given at the end. Perhaps the most common example in Buddhist literature of an inference (anumāna) would be, “Sound is impermanent because it is a product, like a pot.” In this case, “sound” is the subject, “is impermanent,” is the predicate, and “because it is a product,” is the reason. In order for the reason to be considered valid, it must meet three modes of criterion (trirūpya). The first is that the subject has the property of the reason (pakṣadharmatā). In this example, the first criterion is satisfied if all instances of sound actually are (i.e., “have the property of”) products. The second criterion is know as the forward pervasion (anvayavyāpti). This is the first of a two part examination of the relationship between the predicate and the reason. This criterion is satisfied if all instances of the predicate are pervaded by the reason, or in the given example, if all impermanent things are included among, or pervaded by, the category of things that are produced. In Buddhist discourse, a ‘product’ refers to a phenomena that is produced by causes and conditions. The final criterion is the counter pervasion (vyatirekavyāpti) and this is satisfied if there are no instances of the reason that are not also instances of the predicate. In the given example, if there are not products that are not impermanent, then this criterion is satisfied.

19. Dreyfus 1997 and Hattori 1980 both emphasize the importance of the psychological dimension to Śāntarakṣita’s exclusion theory.

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James Blumenthal
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