Notes to Scientific Explanation

1. For treatments of non-causal explanation, see Lange (2017) and Reutlinger & Saatsi (2018).

2. In addition to Hempel (1965a) and Salmon (1989), see also Cartwright (1983), Earman (1986: 80–110), and van Fraassen (1989).

3. As an illustration of this attitude, consider Hempel’s discussion of “support for counterfactuals” as a criterion for distinguishing laws from accidental generalizations (1965b). While Hempel agrees that support for counterfactuals is, as it were, diagnostic of the law/accident distinction, he also holds that counterfactuals “present notorious philosophical difficulties” (1965b: 339) and because of this cannot be used to provide any independent purchase on the distinction between laws and accidentally true generalizations.

4. In addition to the requirement that laws must be exceptionless generalizations, these include the requirements that laws not contain terms referring to particular objects or places and the requirement that laws must contain only projectable predicates in the sense of Goodman (1955).

5. See Cartwright (1979) and Spirtes, Glymour & Scheines (1993 [2000]). The latter contains theorems specifying the extent of this underdetermination even given much stronger assumptions than those which Salmon was willing to make connecting causation and probability.

6. Cases of causation by omission are cases in which, to put the matter intuitively, the non-occurrence of some event causes an outcome, as when a doctor’s failure to provide medical help causes the death of his patient. In such cases, there is no transfer of energy or momentum from cause to effect and no natural candidate for a connecting process. Some writers (e.g., Dowe 2000) conclude on these grounds that causation by omission is not real or literal causation, although it possesses some features that makes it similar to cases of real causation. If omissions can be causes or figure in causal explanations, this presents an obvious prima facie problem for causal process theories like Salmon’s. Cases of causation by C of E by double prevention or disconnection are cases in which C prevents or interferes with the operation of a second factor D which if operative would block the occurrence of E. By removing the preventer D of E, C causes E to occur. Examples are common in biological contexts—see Schaffer (2000), Woodward (2002), and for more general discussion of this phenomenon, see Hall (2004) and Lewis (2000). Again, if it is accepted that citing a disconnecting cause provides a (scientific) explanation, this is a difficulty for causal process theories, at least as formulated by Salmon.

7. One might well wonder what the basis for this judgment is. Can’t the gas as a whole be “marked”—e.g., by heating it or introducing a radioactive tracer—and won’t the gas transmit this mark, at least for a while?

8. As mentioned in the introduction, this article will cover treatments of scientific explanation up to the end of the twentieth century. For entries on more developments see: “Scientific Explanation”, “Explanation in Mathematics”, “Causal Processes”, “Causation and Manipulability”, and “Mechanism in Science”.

9. Unification in science has also been associated with “consilience”, in which information or evidence from different sources supports a similar view or claim (Whewell 1840).

10. We are not aware of any systematic historical exploration of the origins of this particular use of “pragmatic” in connection with accounts of explanation. However, one conjecture (and it is only a conjecture) is that it derives, at least in significant part, from linguistics and, in particular, from the contrast between, on the one hand, syntax and semantics, (often thought to be “objective” and appropriate objects of general, systematic study) and “pragmatics” understood as having to do with the use of language by particular speakers directed toward particular audiences in particular contexts to achieve particular ends. This notion of “pragmatic” does suggest a connection with what is idiosyncratic to the psychology of particular language users and contexts and contrasts with projects that are regarded as providing a “syntax” or “semantics” of explanation.

11. The relevant notion of stability is the notion discussed in Woodward (2006).

12. Another influential pragmatic theory of explanation is due to Peter Achinstein (1983). For reasons of space we discuss only van Fraassen’s theory.

13. See, e.g., Hausman (1998) and Janzing et al. (2012).

14. A closely related point is that a characterization that “relativizes” some feature of an explanation to a context sometimes can, so to speak, be “de-relativized” by making it explicit how the feature in question depends on context—in other words, the apparent contextuality may be just a reflection of the fact that some relevant feature has not been made explicit. For example, an explanandum for which the contrast class is left implicit may seem to support a context-relative picture of explanation (for example, that different explanations of why the conductor is bent will be appropriate depending on context) but at least sometimes this appearance may be removed by making the intended contrast class explicit. It might be argued that once it is made explicit that what is of interest is why this conductor is bent while others are straight, it is an “objective” matter whether some candidate explanans accounts for this contrast. For this reason, it seems that we should regard a thorough-going pragmatic theory as one that claims that explanations have a contextual element that can’t be removed (in a way that satisfies objectivist constraints) by making the context explicit.

15. As noted below, whether one accepts this assessment will depend in part on whether one thinks that there are non-causal forms of why-explanation (in the broad sense of why-explanation gestured at in Section 1). If there are, then a more adequate theory of causation will take us only part of the way toward a more satisfactory theory of explanation.

16. Relevant recent work includes Hall (2004), Lewis (1986, 2000), Pearl (2000), and Spirtes, Glymour & Scheines (1993 [2000]).

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James Woodward <>
Lauren Ross <>

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