Virtually every aspect of self-deception, including its definition and paradigmatic cases, is a matter of controversy among philosophers. Minimally, self-deception involves a person who (a) as a consequence of some motivation or emotion, seems to acquire and maintain some false belief despite evidence to the contrary and (b) who may display behavior suggesting some awareness of the truth. Beyond this, philosophers divide over whether self-deception is intentional, whether it involves belief or some other sub- or non-doxastic attitude, whether self-deceivers are morally responsible for their self-deception, whether self-deception is morally problematic (and if it is, in what ways and under what circumstances), whether self-deception is beneficial or harmful, whether and in what sense collectives can be self-deceived (and how, if they can be self-deceived, this might affect individuals within such collectives), and whether our penchant for self-deception might be socially, psychologically or biologically adaptive or merely an accidental byproduct of our evolutionary history.
The discussion of self-deception and its associated puzzles sheds light on the ways motivation affects belief acquisition and retention and other belief-like cognitive attitudes; it also prompts us to scrutinize the notions of belief, intention, and the limits of such folk psychological concepts to adequately explain phenomena of this sort. Self-deception also requires careful consideration of the cognitive architecture that might accommodate this apparent irrationality regarding our beliefs.
Self-deception isn’t merely a philosophically interesting puzzle but a problem of existential concern. It raises the distinct possibility that we live with distorted views that may make us strangers to ourselves and blind to the nature of our morally significant engagements.
- 1. Paradoxes, Puzzles, and Problems of Self-Deception
- 2. Intentionalist Approaches
- 3. Revisionist Approaches
- 4. Twisted or Negative Self-Deception
- 5. Morality and Self-Deception
- 6. Origin of Self-Deception: Adaptation or Spandrel
- 7. Collective Self-Deception
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Paradoxes, Puzzles, and Problems of Self-Deception
“What is self-deception?” sounds like a straightforward question, but the more philosophers have sought to answer it, the more puzzling it has become. Traditionally, self-deception has been modeled on interpersonal deception, where A intentionally gets B to believe some proposition p, all the while knowing or believing truly that ~p. Such deception is intentional and requires the deceiver to know or believe that ~p and the deceived to believe that p. One reason for thinking self-deception is analogous to interpersonal deception of this sort is that it helps us to distinguish self-deception from mere error since the acquisition and maintenance of the false belief are intentional, not accidental. It also helps to explain why we think self-deceivers are responsible for and open to the evaluation of their self-deception. If self-deception is properly modeled on interpersonal deception, self-deceivers intentionally get themselves to believe that p, all the while knowing or believing truly that ~p. On this traditional model, then, self-deceivers apparently must (1) hold contradictory beliefs—the dual-belief requirement—and (2) intentionally get themselves to hold a belief they know or believe truly to be false.
The traditional model of self-deception, however, has been thought to raise two paradoxes: One concerns the self-deceiver’s state of mind—the so-called static paradox. How can a person simultaneously hold contradictory beliefs? The other concerns the process or dynamics of self-deception—the so-called dynamic or strategic paradox. How can a person intend to deceive herself without rendering her intentions ineffective? (Mele 1987a; 2001)
The dual-belief requirement raises the static paradox since it seems to pose an impossible state of mind, namely, consciously and simultaneously believing that p and ~p. As deceiver, she believes that ~p, and, as deceived, she believes that p. Accordingly, the self-deceiver consciously believes that p and ~p. But if believing both a proposition and its negation in full awareness is an impossible state of mind, self-deception, as it has traditionally been understood, seems impossible as well. Static paradoxes also arise regarding motivation, intention, emotion, and the like insofar as self-deceivers seem to harbor psychological states of these kinds that seem deeply incompatible (Funkhouser 2019).
The requirement that the self-deceiver intentionally gets herself to hold a belief she knows to be false raises the dynamic or strategic paradox since it seems to involve the self-deceiver in an impossible project, namely, both deploying and being duped by some deceitful strategy. As deceiver, she must be aware that she’s deploying a deceitful strategy; but, as deceived, she must be unaware of this strategy for it to be effective. And yet it’s difficult to see how the self-deceiver could fail to be aware of her intention to deceive. A strategy known to be deceitful seems bound to fail. How could I be taken in by your efforts to get me to believe something false if I know what you’re up to? But if it’s impossible to be taken in by a strategy one knows is deceitful, then, again, self-deception, as it has traditionally been understood, seems to be impossible as well.
These paradoxes have led a minority of philosophers to be skeptical that self-deception is conceptually possible or even coherent (Paluch 1967; Haight 1980; Kipp 1980). Borge (2003) contends that accounts of self-deception inevitably give up central elements of our folk-psychological notions of “self” or “deception” to avoid paradox, leaving us to wonder whether this framework itself is what gets in the way of explaining the phenomenon. Such skepticism toward the concept may seem warranted, given the obvious paradoxes involved. Most philosophers, however, have sought some resolution to these paradoxes instead of giving up on the notion itself, not only because empirical evidence suggests that self-deception is not only possible but pervasive (Sahdra and Thagard 2003) but also because the concept does seem to pick out a distinct kind of motivated irrationality.
Philosophical accounts of self-deception roughly fall into two main groups: those that maintain that the paradigmatic cases of self-deception are intentional and those that deny this. Call these approaches intentionalist and revisionist, respectively. Intentionalists find the model of intentional interpersonal deception apt since it helps to explain the selectivity of self-deception and the apparent responsibility of self-deceivers, as well as provide a clear way of distinguishing self-deception from other sorts of motivated belief, such as wishful thinking. To avoid paradox, these approaches introduce a variety of divisions that shield the deceiving from the deceived mind. Revisionists are skeptical of these divisions and the ‘psychological exotica’ (Mele 2001) apparently needed to avoid the static and dynamic paradoxes. Instead, they argue that revision of the intention requirement, the belief requirement, or both offers a simpler account of self-deception that avoids the paradoxes raised by modeling it on intentional interpersonal deception.
2. Intentionalist Approaches
The chief problem facing intentional models of self-deception is the dynamic paradox, namely, that it seems impossible to form an intention to get oneself to believe what one currently disbelieves or believes is false. For one to carry out an intention to deceive oneself, one must know what one is doing; to succeed, one must be ignorant of this same fact. Intentionalists agree that self-deception is intentional or, at least, robustly purposive, but divide over whether it requires holding contradictory beliefs and, thus, over the specific content of the alleged intention involved (see §3.2 Revision of Belief). Insofar as even the bare intention to acquire the belief that p for reasons having nothing to do with one’s evidence for p seems unlikely to succeed if directly known, most intentionalists introduce some sort of temporal or psychological partition to insulate self-deceivers from their deceptive stratagems. When self-deceivers are not consciously aware of what they truly believe or intend, it’s easier to see how they can play the role of the deceiver and the deceived. By dividing the mind into parts, temporally or psychologically, these approaches seek to show that self-deception does not involve paradox.
2.1 Temporal Partitioning
Some intentionalists argue that self-deception is a complex, temporally extended process during which a self-deceiver can consciously set out to deceive herself that p, knowing or believing that ~p, and along the way lose her belief that ~p, either forgetting her original deceptive intention entirely or regarding it as having, albeit accidentally, brought about the true belief she would have arrived at anyway (Sorensen 1985; Bermúdez 2000). So, for instance, an official involved in some illegal behavior might destroy any records of this behavior and create evidence that would cover it up (diary entries, emails, and the like), knowing that she will likely forget having done these things over the next few months. When her activities are investigated a year later, she has forgotten her tampering efforts and, based upon her falsified evidence, comes to believe falsely that she was not involved in the illegal activities of which she is accused. Here, the self-deceiver need never simultaneously hold contradictory beliefs even though she intends to bring it about that she believes that p, which she regards as false at the outset of the process of deceiving herself and true at its completion.
The self-deceiver need not even forget her original intention to deceive. Take an atheist who sets out to get herself to believe in God because it seems the best bet if God turns out to exist. She might well remember such an intention at the end of the process and deem that by God’s grace even this misguided path led her to the truth. What enables the intention to succeed in such cases is the operation of what Johnston (1988) terms ‘autonomous means’ (e.g., the normal degradation of memory, the tendency to believe what one practices, etc.), not the continued awareness of the intention, hinting that the process may be subintentional (See §3.1 Revision of Intention).
While such temporal partitioning accounts appear to avoid the static and dynamic paradoxes, many, if not most, cases of self-deception aren’t of this temporally extended type. Regularly, self-deception seems to occur instantaneously (Jordan 2022), as when a philosopher self-deceives that her article is high quality even while reading the substantive and accurate criticisms in the rejection letter from the prestigious peer-reviewed journal she submitted it to (example due to Mele 2001). Additionally, many of these temporally extended cases lack the distinctive opacity, indirection, and tension associated with garden-variety cases of self-deception (Levy 2004).
2.2 Psychological Partitioning
Another strategy employed by intentionalists is the division of the self into psychological parts that play the role of the deceiver and deceived, respectively. These strategies range from positing strong division in the self, where the deceiving part is a relatively autonomous subagency capable of belief, desire, and intention (Rorty 1988), to more moderate division, where the deceiving part still constitutes a separate center of agency (Pears 1984, 1986; 1991), to the relatively modest division of Davidson (1982, 1986), where there need only be a boundary between conflicting attitudes and intentions.
Such divisions are prompted in large part by the acceptance of the dual-belief requirement. It isn’t simply that self-deceivers hold contradictory beliefs, which though strange, isn’t impossible since one can believe that p and believe that ~p without believing that p & ~p. The problem such theorists face stems from the appearance that the belief that ~p motivates and thus forms a part of the intention to bring it about that one acquires and maintains the false belief that p (Davidson 1986). So, for example, the Nazi official’s recognition that his actions implicate him in serious evil motivates him to implement a strategy to deceive himself into believing he is not so involved; he can’t intend to bring it about that he holds such a false belief if he doesn’t recognize it is false, and he wouldn’t want to bring such a belief about if he didn’t recognize the evidence to the contrary. So long as this is the case, the deceiving self, whether it constitutes a separate center of agency or something less robust, must be hidden from the conscious self being deceived if the self-deceptive intention is to succeed.
While these psychological partitioning approaches seem to resolve the static and dynamic puzzles, they do so by introducing a picture of the mind that raises puzzles of its own. On this point, there appears to be consensus even among intentionalists that self-deception can and should be accounted for without invoking speculative or stipulative divisions not already used to explain non-self-deceptive behavior, what Talbott (1995) calls ‘innocent’ divisions. That said, recent, if controversial, research (e.g., Bargh and Morsella 2008; Hassin, Bargh, and Zimmerman 2009; Huang and Bargh 2014) seems to support the possibility of the sort of robust unconscious but flexible goal pursuit that could explain the way self-deceivers are able to pursue their deceptive goal while retaining the beliefs necessary for navigating the shifting evidential terrain (see Funkhouser and Barrett 2016, 2017 and Doody 2016 for skepticism about the applicability of this research to self-deception). If this kind of research shows that no ‘psychological exotica’ are necessary to explain self-deception, there is less pressure to deflate the phenomenon in ways that minimize the active, strategic role self-deceivers play in the process.
3. Revisionist Approaches
A number of philosophers have moved away from modeling self-deception directly on intentional interpersonal deception, opting instead to revise either the intention or the belief requirement traditional intentionalist models assume. Those revising the intention requirement typically treat self-deception as a species of motivationally biased belief, thus avoiding the problems involved with intentionally deceiving oneself. Call these non-intentionalist and deflationary approaches.
Those revising the belief requirement do so in a variety of ways. Some posit other, non-doxastic or quasi-doxastic attitudes toward the proposition involved (‘misrepresentation’ Jordan 2020, 2022; ‘hope,’ ‘suspicion,’ ‘doubt,’ ‘anxiety’ Archer 2013; ‘besires’ Egan 2009; ‘pretense’ Gendler 2007; ‘imagination’ Lazar 1999). Others alter the content of the proposition believed (Holton 2001; Funkhouser 2005; Fernández 2013), while others suggest the doxastic attitudes involved are indeterminate, somehow ‘in-between believing’ (Schwitzgebel 2001; Funkhouser 2009) or subject to shifting degrees of credulity throughout the process of self-deception (Chan and Rowbottom 2019). Call these revision of belief approaches.
Deflationary approaches focus primarily on the process of self-deception, while the revision of belief approaches focus on the product. A revision of either of these aspects, of course, has ramifications for the other. For example, if self-deception doesn’t involve belief, but some other non-doxastic attitude (product), then one may well be able to intentionally enter that state without paradox (process). This section considers non-intentional and deflationary approaches and the worries such approaches raise (§3.1). It also considers revision of belief approaches (§3.2).
3.1 Revision of Intention: Non-Intentionalist and Deflationary Approaches
Non-intentionalists argue that most ‘garden-variety’ cases of self-deception can be explained without adverting to subagents, or unconscious beliefs and intentions, which, even if they resolve the static and dynamic puzzles of self-deception, raise puzzles of their own. If such non-exotic explanations are available, intentionalist explanations seem unwarranted and unnecessary.
Since the central paradoxes of self-deception arise from modeling self-deception on intentional interpersonal deception, non-intentionalists suggest this model be jettisoned in favor of one that takes ‘to be deceived’ to be nothing more than believing falsely or being mistaken in believing something (Johnston 1988; Mele 2001). For instance, Sam mishears that it will be a sunny day and relays this misinformation to Joan with the result that she believes it will be a sunny day. Joan is deceived into believing it will be sunny, and Sam has deceived her, albeit unintentionally. Initially, such a model may not appear promising for self-deception since simply being mistaken about p or accidentally causing oneself to be mistaken about p doesn’t seem to be self-deception at all but some sort of innocent error. Non-intentionalists, however, argue that in cases of self-deception, the false belief is not accidental but, rather, motivated by desire (Mele 2001), emotion (Lazar 1999), anxiety (Johnston 1988; Barnes 1997), or some other attitude regarding p or related to p. So, for instance, when Allison believes, against the preponderance of evidence available to her, that her daughter is not having learning difficulties, non-intentionalists will explain the various ways she misreads the evidence by pointing to such things as her desire that her daughter not have learning difficulties, her fear that she has such difficulties, or anxiety over this possibility. In such cases, Allison’s self-deceptive belief that her daughter is not having learning difficulties fulfills her desire, quells her fear, or reduces her anxiety, and it’s this function—not an intention—that explains why her belief formation process is biased. Allison’s false belief is not an innocent mistake but a consequence of her motivational states.
Non-intentionalists divide over the dual-belief requirement. Some accept the requirement, seeing the persistent efforts to resist the conscious recognition of the unwelcome truth or to reduce the anxiety generated by this recognition as characteristic of self-deception (Bach 1981; Johnston 1988). So, in Allison’s case, her belief that her daughter is having learning difficulties, along with her desire that this not be the case, motivates her to employ means to avoid this thought and to believe the opposite.
Others, however, argue the needed motivation can as easily be supplied by uncertainty or ignorance whether p, or suspicion that ~p (Mele 2001; Barnes 1997). Thus, Allison need not hold any opinion regarding her daughter’s having learning difficulties for her false belief to count as self-deception since it’s her regarding evidence in a motivationally biased way in the face of evidence to the contrary, not her recognition of this evidence, that makes her belief self-deceptive. Accordingly, Allison needn’t intend to deceive herself nor believe at any point that her daughter, in fact, has learning difficulties. If we think someone like Allison is self-deceived, then self-deception requires neither contradictory beliefs nor intentions regarding the acquisition or retention of the self-deceptive belief. Such approaches are ‘deflationary’ in the sense that they take self-deception to be explicable without reaching for exotic cognitive architecture since neither intentions nor dual-beliefs are required to account for self-deception. (For more on the dual-belief requirement, see §3.2 Revision of Belief.)
Mele (2001, 2012) has offered the most fully articulated deflationary account, and his view has been the target of the most scrutiny, so it is worth stating what he takes to be the jointly sufficient conditions for entering self-deception:
- The belief that p, which S acquires, is false
- S treats data relevant, or at least seemingly relevant, to the truth value of p in a motivationally biased way
- This biased treatment is a nondeviant cause of S’s acquiring the belief that p
- The body of data possessed by S at the time provides greater warrant for ~p than for p
- S consciously believes at the time that there is a significant chance that ~p
- S’s acquiring the belief that p is a product of “reflective, critical reasoning,” and S is wrong in regarding that reasoning as properly directed
Mele (2012) added the last two conditions to clarify his account in view of some of the criticisms of this kind of approach addressed in the next section.
To support non-intentionalism, some have looked to the purposive mechanisms of deception operating in non-human organisms as a model (Smith 2014), while others have focused on neurobiological mechanisms triggered by affect to explain the peculiarly purposive responses to evidence involved in self-deception (Lauria et al. 2016).
Deflationary Worries and Modifications
Critics contend these deflationary accounts do not adequately distinguish self-deception from other sorts of motivated believing (such as wishful thinking), nor can they explain the peculiar selectivity associated with self-deception, its characteristic ‘tension,’ the way it involves a failure of self-knowledge, or the agency of the self-deceiver.
Self-Deception and Wishful Thinking: What distinguishes wishful thinking from self-deception, according to intentionalists, just is that the latter is intentional while the former is not (Bermúdez 2000). Specifically, wishful thinking does not seem ‘deceptive’ in the requisite sense. Non-intentionalists respond that what distinguishes wishful thinking from self-deception is that self-deceivers recognize evidence against their self-deceptive belief whereas wishful thinkers do not (Bach 1981; Johnston 1988) or that they merely possess, without recognizing it, greater counterevidence than wishful thinkers (Mele 2001). In either case, self-deceivers exert more agency than wishful thinkers over their belief formation. In wishful thinking, motivation triggers a belief formation process in which the person does not play an active, conscious role, “while in self-deception the subject is a willing participant in directing cognition towards the doxastic embrace of the favored proposition” (Scott-Kakures 2002; see also Szabados 1973). While the precise relationship between wishful thinking and self-deception is clearly a matter of debate, non-intentionalists offer plausible ways of distinguishing the two that do not invoke the intention to deceive.
Self-Deception and Selectivity: Another worry—termed the ‘selectivity problem’—originally raised by Bermúdez (1997, 2000) is that deflationary accounts don’t seem to be able to explain the selective nature of self-deception (i.e., why motivation seems only selectively to produce bias). Why is it, such intentionalists ask, that we are not rendered biased in favor of the belief that p in many cases where we have a very strong desire that p (or anxiety or some other motivation related to p)? Intentionalists argue that an intention to get oneself to acquire the belief that p offers the most straightforward answer to this question.
Others, following Mele (2001, 2012, 2020), contend that selectivity may be explained in terms of the agent’s assessment of the relative costs of erroneously believing that p or ~p (see Friedrich (1993) and Trope and Lieberman (1996) on lay hypothesis testing). Essentially, this approach suggests that the minimization of costly errors is the central principle guiding hypothesis testing. So, for example, Josh would be happier believing falsely that the gourmet chocolate he finds so delicious isn’t produced by exploited farmers than falsely believing that it is since he desires that it not be so produced. Because Josh considers the cost of erroneously believing his favorite chocolate is tainted by exploitation to be very high—no other chocolate gives him the same pleasure—it takes a great deal more evidence to convince him that his chocolate is so tainted than it does to convince him otherwise. It’s the low subjective cost of falsely believing the chocolate is not tainted that facilitates Josh’s self-deception. But we can imagine Josh having the same strong desire that his chocolate not be tainted by exploitation and yet having a different assessment of the cost of falsely believing it’s not tainted. Say, for example, he works for an organization promoting fair trade and non-exploitive labor practices among chocolate producers and believes he has an obligation to accurately represent the labor practices of the producer of his favorite chocolate and would, furthermore, lose credibility if the chocolate he himself consumes is tainted by exploitation. In these circumstances, Josh is more sensitive to evidence that his favorite chocolate is tainted—despite his desire that it not be—since the subjective cost of being wrong is higher for him than it was before. It is the relative, subjective costs of falsely believing p and ~p that explain why desire or other motivation biases belief in some circumstances and not others.
While error-cost accounts offer some explanation of selectivity, one might still complain that even when these conditions are met, self-deception needn’t follow (Bermúdez 2000, 2017). Some non-intentionalist respond that these conditions are as complete an explanation of self-deception as is possible. Given the complexity of the factors affecting belief formation and the lack of a complete account of its etiology, we shouldn’t expect a complete explanation in each case (Funkhouser 2019; Mele 2020). Others argue that attention to the role of emotion in assessing and filtering evidence sheds further light on the process. According to such approaches, affect plays a key role in triggering the conditions under which motivation leads to self-deception (Galeotti 2016a; Lauria et al. 2016; Lauria and Preissmann 2018). Our emotionally-loaded appraisal of evidence, in combination with evidential ambiguity and our potential to cope with the threatening reality, helps to explain why motivation tips us toward self-deception. Research on the role of dopamine regulation and negative somatic markers provides some empirical support for this sort of affective model (Lauria et al. 2016; Lauria and Preissmann 2018).
Non-intentionalists also point out that intentionalists have selectivity problems of their own since it isn’t clear why intentions are formed in some cases rather than others (Jurjako 2013) or why some intentions to acquire a self-deceptive belief succeed while others do not (Mele 2001, 2020) See Bermúdez (2017) for a response to these worries.
Self-Deception and Tension: A number of philosophers have complained that deflationary accounts fail to explain certain ‘tensions’ or conflicts supposed to be present in cases of genuine self-deception (Audi 1997; Bach 1997; Nelkin 2002; Funkhouser 2005; Fernández 2013; Jordan 2022). Take Ellen, who says she is doing well in her biology class but systematically avoids looking at the results on her quizzes and tests. She says she doesn’t need to look; she knows she didn’t miss anything. When her teacher tries to catch her after class to discuss her poor grades, she rushes off. Similarly, when she sees an email from her teacher with the subject line “your class performance,” she ignores it. The prospect of looking at the test results, talking with her teacher, or reading her email sends a flash of dread through her and a pit to her stomach, even as she projects calm and confidence. Ellen’s behavior and affective responses suggest to these critics that she knows she isn’t doing well in her biology class, despite her avowals to the contrary. Ellen’s case highlights a variety of tensions that may arise in the self-deceived. Philosophers have focused on tensions that arise with respect to evidence (since there is a mismatch between what the evidence warrants and what is believed or avowed); to unconscious doxastic attitudes (since they are at variance with those consciously held); to self-knowledge (since one has a false second-order belief about what one believes); to the various components of belief—behavioral, verbal, emotional, physical—(since what one does, says, feels, or experiences can come apart in a number of ways) (Funkhouser 2019); and to authorship (since one may be aware of authoring her self-deception and presenting her self-deception to herself as not having been authored, i.e., as the truth) (Jordan 2022). These tensions seem to be rooted in the self-deceiver’s awareness of the truth. But, since deflationary accounts deny the dual-belief requirement, specifically, that self-deceivers must hold the true belief that ~p, it’s not clear why self-deceivers would experience tension or display behaviors in conflict with their self-deceptive belief p.
Deflationary theorists counter that suspicion that ~p, thinking there’s a significant possibility that ~p, may suffice to explain these kinds of tensions (Mele 2001, 2009, 2010, 2012). Clearly, a person who self-deceptively believes that p and suspects that ~p may experience tension; moreover, such attitudes combined with a desire that p might account for the behaviors highlighted by critics.
While these attitudes may explain some of the tension in self-deception, a number of critics think they are inadequate to explain deep-conflict cases in which what self-deceivers say about p is seriously at odds with non-verbal behavior that justifies the attribution of the belief that ~p to them (Audi, 1997; Patten 2003; Funkhouser 2005; Gendler 2007; Fernández 2013). While some propose these cases are just a type of self-deception that deflationary approaches cannot explain (Funkhouser 2009, 2019; Fernández 2013), others go further, suggesting these cases show that deflationary approaches aren’t accounts of self-deception at all but of self-delusion since deflationary self-deceivers seem single-mindedly to hold the false belief (Audi 2007; Funkhouser 2005; Gendler 2007).
Some defenders of deflation acknowledge that the significant difference between what deflationary accounts have in view (namely, people who do not believe the unwelcome truth that ~p, having a motivation-driven, unwarranted skepticism toward it) and what deep-conflict theorists do (namely, people who know the unwelcome truth that ~p and avoid reflecting on it or encountering evidence for it) warrants questioning whether these phenomena belong to the same psychological kind, but argue that it’s the deep-conflict cases that represent something other than self-deception. Those who unconsciously hold the warranted belief and merely say or pretend they hold the unwarranted one (Audi 1997; Gendler 2007) hardly seem deceived (Lynch 2012). They seem more to resemble what Longeway (1990) calls escapism, the avoidance of thinking about what we believe to escape reality (See Lynch 2012).
Funkhouser (2019) suggests that this dispute over the depth of conflict and intensity of tension involved in self-deception is, in part, a dispute over which cases are central, typical, and most interesting. Whether deep-conflict cases constitute a distinct psychological kind or whether they reflect people’s pre-theoretical understanding of self-deception remains unclear, but deflationary approaches seem to be capable of explaining at least some of the behavior such theorists insist justifies attributing an unconscious belief that ~p. Deep-conflict theorists need to explain why we should think when one avows that p, one does not also believe it to some degree, and why the behavior in question cannot be explained by nearby proxies like suspicion or doubt that p (Mele 2010, 2012). Some deflationary theorists contend that a degree of belief model might render deep-conflict cases more sensible (see Shifting Degrees of Belief).
Self-Deception and Self-Knowledge: Several theorists have argued that deflationary approaches miss certain failures of self-knowledge involved in cases of self-deception. Self-deceivers, these critics argue, must hold false beliefs about their own belief formation process (Holton 2001; Scott-Kakures 2002), about what beliefs they actually hold (Funkhouser 2005; Fernández 2013), or both. Holton (2001), for instance, argues that Mele’s conditions for being self-deceived are not sufficient because they do not require self-deceivers to hold false beliefs about themselves. It seems possible for a person to acquire a false belief that p as a consequence of treating data relevant to p in a motivationally biased way when the data available to her provides greater warrant for p and still retain accurate self-knowledge. Such a person would readily admit to ignoring certain data because it would undermine a belief she cherishes. She makes no mistakes about herself, her beliefs, or her belief formation process. Such a person, Holton argues, would be willfully ignorant but not self-deceived. If, however, her strategy was sufficiently opaque to her, she would be apt to deny she was ignoring relevant evidence and even affirm her belief was the result of what Scott-Kakures (2002) calls “reflective, critical reasoning.” These erroneous beliefs represent a failure of self-knowledge that seems, according to these critics, essential to self-deception, and they distinguish it from wishful thinking (see above), willful blindness, and other nearby phenomena.
In response to such criticisms, Mele (2009, 2012) has offered the following sufficient condition: S’s acquiring the belief that p is a product of “reflective, critical reasoning,” and S is wrong in regarding that reasoning as properly directed. Some worry that meeting this condition requires a degree of awareness about one’s reasons for believing that would rule out those who do not engage in reflection on their reasons for belief (Fernández 2013) and fails to capture errors about what one believes that seem essential for dealing with deep-conflict cases (Fernández 2013; Funkhouser 2005). Whether Mele’s (2009) proposed condition requires too much sophistication from self-deceivers is debatable but suggests a way of accounting for the intuition that self-deceivers fail to know themselves without requiring them to harbor hidden beliefs or intentions.
Self-Deception and Agency: Some worry that deflationary explanations render self-deceivers victims of their own motivations; they don’t seem to be agents with respect to their self-deception but unwitting patients. But, in denying self-deceivers engage in intentional activities for the purpose of deceiving themselves, non-intentionalists needn’t deny self-deceivers engage in any intentional actions. It’s open to them to accept what Lynch terms agentism: “Self-deceivers end up with their unwarranted belief as a result of their own actions motivated by the desire that p” (Lynch 2017). According to agentism, motivation affects belief by means of intentional actions, not simply by triggering biasing mechanisms. Self-deceivers can act with intentions like “find any problem with unwelcome evidence” or “find any p-supporting evidence” with a view of determining whether p is true. These kinds of intentions may explain the agency of self-deceivers and how they could be responsible for self-deception and not merely victims of their own motivations. It isn’t perfectly clear whether Mele-style deflationists are committed to agentism, but even if they are, questions remain about whether such unwittingly deceptive intentional actions are enough to render self-deceivers true agents of their deception since they think that they are engaging in actions to determine the truth, not to deceive themselves.
3.2 Revision of Belief: Adjustment of Attitude or Content
Approaches that focus on revising the notion that self-deception requires holding that p and ~p, the dual-belief requirement implied by traditional intentionalism, either introduce some “doxastic proxy” (Baghramian and Nicholson 2013) to replace one or both beliefs or alter the content of the self-deceiver’s belief in a way that preserves tension without involving outright conflict. These approaches resolve the doxastic paradox either by denying that self-deceivers hold the unwelcome but warranted belief ~p (Talbott 1995; Barnes 1997; Burmúdez 2000; Mele 2001), denying they hold the welcome but unwarranted belief p (Audi 1982, 1988; Funkhouser 2005; Gendler 2007; Fernández 2013; Jordan 2020, 2022), denying they hold either belief p or ~p (Archer 2013; Porcher 2012), or contending they have shifting degrees of belief regarding p (Chan and Rowbottom 2019). Lauria et al. (2016) argue for an integrative approach that accommodates all these products of self-deception on the basis of empirical research on the role affect plays in assessments of evidence.
Denying the Unwelcome Belief: Both intentionalists and non-intentionalists may question whether self-deceivers must hold the unwelcome but warranted belief. For intentionalists, what’s necessary is some intention to form the target belief p, and this is compatible with having no views at all regarding p (lacking any evidence for or against p) or believing p is merely possible (possessing evidence too weak to warrant belief that p or ~p) (Bermúdez 2000). Moreover, rejecting this requirement relieves the pressure to introduce deep divisions (Talbott 1995). For non-intentionalists, the focus is on how the false belief is acquired, not whether a person believes it’s contradictory. For them, it suffices that self-deceivers acquire the unwarranted false belief that p in a motivated way (Mele 2001). The selectivity and tension typical of self-deception can be explained without attributing ~p since nearby proxies like suspicion that ~p can do the same work. Citing Rorty’s (1988) case of Dr. Androvna, a cancer specialist who believes she does not have cancer but who draws up a detailed will and writes uncharacteristically effusive letters suggesting her impending departure, Mele (2009) points out that Androvna’s behavior might easily be explained by her holding that there’s a significant chance I have cancer. And this belief is compatible with Androvna’s self-deceptive belief that she does not, in fact, have cancer.
Denying the Welcome Belief: Another strand of revision of belief approaches focuses on the welcome belief that p, proposing alternatives to this belief that function in ways that explain what self-deceivers typically say and do. Self-deceivers display ambiguous behavior that not only falls short of what one would expect from a person who believes that p but seems to justify the attribution of the belief that ~p. For instance, Androvna’s letter-writing and will-preparation might be taken as reasons for attributing to her the belief that she won’t recover, despite her verbal assertions to the contrary. To explain the special pattern of behavior displayed by self-deceivers, some of these theorists propose proxies for full belief, such as sincere avowal (Audi 1982, 1988); pretense (Gendler 2007); an intermediate state between belief and desire, or ‘besire’ (Egan 2009); some other less-than-full belief state akin to imaginations or fantasies (Lazar 1999); or simply ‘misrepresentation’ (Jordan 2020, 2022). Such states may guide and motivate action in many, though not all, circumstances while being relatively less sensitive to evidence than beliefs.
Others substitute a higher-order belief to explain the behavior of self-deceivers as another kind of proxy for the belief that p (Funkhouser 2005; Fernández 2013). On such approaches, self-deceivers don’t believe p; they believe that they believe that p, and this false second-order belief—“I think that I believe that p”—underlies and underwrites their sincere avowal that p as well as their ability to entertain p as true. Self-deception, then, is a kind of failure of self-knowledge, a misapprehension or misattribution of one’s own beliefs. By shifting the content of the self-deceptive belief to the second-order, this approach avoids the doxastic paradox and explains the characteristic ‘tension’ or ‘conflict’ attributed to self-deceivers in terms of the disharmony between the first-order and second-order beliefs, the latter explaining their avowed belief and the former their behavior that goes against that avowed belief (Funkhouser 2005; Fernández 2013).
Denying both the Welcome Belief and the Unwelcome Belief: Given the variety of proxies that have been offered for both the welcome and the unwelcome belief, it should not be surprising that some argue that self-deception can be explained without attributing either belief to self-deceivers, a position Archer (2013) refers to as ‘nondoxasticism.’ Porcher (2012) recommends against attributing beliefs to self-deceivers on the grounds that what they believe is indeterminate since they are, as Schwitzgebel (2001, 2010) contends, “in-between-believing,” neither fully believing that p nor fully not believing that p. For Porcher (2012), self-deceivers show the limits of the folk psychological concepts of belief and suggest the need to develop a dispositional account of self-deception that focuses on the ways that self-deceivers’ dispositions deviate from those of stereotypical full belief. Funkhouser (2009) also points to the limits of folk psychological concepts and suggests that in cases involving deep conflict between behavior and avowal, “the self-deceived produce a confused belief-like condition so that it is genuinely indeterminate what they believe regarding p.” Archer (2013), however, rejects the claim that the belief is indeterminate or that folk psychological concepts are inadequate, arguing that folk psychology offers a wide variety of non-doxastic attitudes such as ‘hope,’ ‘suspicion,’ ‘anxiety,’ and the like that are more than sufficient to explain paradigm cases of self-deception without adverting to belief.
Shifting Degrees of Belief: Some contend that attention to shifting degrees of belief offers a better explanation of paradigm cases of self-deception—especially the behavioral tensions—and avoids the static paradox (Chan and Rowbottom 2019). In their view, many so-called non-doxastic attitudes entail some degree of belief regarding p. Shifts in these beliefs are triggered by and track shifts in information and non-doxastic propositional attitudes such as desire, fear, anxiety, and anger. For instance, a husband might initially have a high degree of belief in his spouse’s fidelity that plummets when he encounters threatening evidence. His low confidence reveals afresh how much he wants her fidelity and prompts him to despair. These non-doxastic attitudes trigger another shift by focusing his attention on evidence of his spouse’s love and fidelity, leaving him with a higher degree of confidence than his available evidence warrants. On this shifting belief account, the self-deceiver holds both p and ~p at varying levels of confidence that are always greater than zero (example due to Chan and Rowbottom 2019).
While revision of belief approaches suggest a number of non-paradoxical ways of thinking about self-deception, some worry that those approaches denying that self-deceivers hold the welcome but unwarranted belief that p eliminate what is central to the notion of self-deception, namely, deception (see, e.g., Lynch 2012; Mele 2010). Whatever the verdict, these revision of belief approaches suggest that our way of characterizing belief may not be fine-grained enough to account for the subtle attitudes or meta-attitudes that self-deceivers bear on the proposition in question. Taken together, these approaches make it clear that the question regarding what self-deceivers believe is by no means resolved.
4. Twisted or Negative Self-Deception
‘Twisted’ or negative self-deception differs from ‘straight’ or positive self-deception because it involves the acquisition of an unwelcome as opposed to a welcome belief (Mele 1999, 2001; Funkhouser 2019). Roughly, the negatively self-deceived have a belief that is neither warranted nor wanted in consequence of some desire, emotion, or combination of both. For instance, a jealous husband, uncertain about his wife’s fidelity, comes to believe she’s having an affair on scant and ambiguous evidence, something he certainly doesn’t want to be the case. Intentionalists may see little problem here, at least in terms of offering a unified account, since both positive and negative self-deceivers intend to produce the belief in question, and nothing about intentional deception precludes getting the victim to believe something unpleasant or undesirable. That said, intentionalists typically see the intention to believe p as serving a desire to believe p (Davidson 1985; Talbott 1995; Bermúdez 2000, 2017), so they still face the difficult task of explaining why negative self-deceivers intend to acquire a belief they don’t want (Lazar 1999; Echano 2017). Non-intentionalists have a steeper hill to climb since it’s difficult to see how someone like the anxious husband could be motivated to form a belief that he doesn’t at all desire. The challenge for the non-intentionalist, then, is to supply a motivational story that explains the acquisition of such an unwelcome belief. Ideally, the aim is to provide a unified explanation for both the positive and negative varieties with a view to theoretical simplicity. Attempts to provide such an explanation now constitute a significant and growing body of literature that centers on the nature of the motivations involved and the precise role affect plays in the process.
Since the desire for the welcome belief cannot serve as the motive for acquiring the unwelcome one, non-intentionalists have sought some ulterior motive (Pears 1984), such as the reduction of anxiety (Barnes 1997), the avoidance of costly errors (Mele 1999, 2001), or denial that the motivation is oriented toward the state of the world at all (Nelkin 2002).
The jealous husband might be motivated to believe his wife is unfaithful because it supports the vigilance needed to eliminate all rival lovers and preserve the relationship—both of which he desires (Pears 1984). Similarly, I might be anxious about my house burning down and come to hold the unwelcome belief that I’ve left the burner on. Ultimately, acquiring the unwelcome belief reduces my anxiety because it prompts me to double-check the stove (Barnes 1997). Some are skeptical that identifying such ulterior desires or anxieties is always possible or necessary (Lazar 1999; Mele 2001). Many, following Mele (2001, 2003), see a simpler explanation of negative cases in terms of the way motivation, broadly speaking, affects the agent’s assessment of the relative costs of error. The jealous husband—not wanting to be made a fool—sees the cost of falsely believing his spouse is faithful as high, while the person anxious about their house burning down sees the cost of falsely believing the burner is on as low. Factors such as what the agent cares about and what she can do about the situation affect these error cost assessments and may explain, in part, the conditions under which negative self-deception occurs.
Since negative self-deception often involves emotions—fear, anxiety, jealousy, rage—a good deal of attention has been given to how this component is connected to the motivation driving negative self-deception. Some, like Mele (2001, 2003), acknowledge the possibility that emotion alone or in combination with desire is fundamental to what motivates bias in these cases but remain reluctant to say such affective motives are essential or entirely distinguishable from the desires involved. Others worry that leaving motivation so ambiguous threatens the claim to provide a unified explanation of self-deception (Galeotti 2016a). Consequently, some have sought a more central role for affect, seeing emotion as triggering or priming motivationally biased cognition (Scott-Kakures 2000, 200; Echano 2017) or as operating as a kind of evidential filter in a pre-attentive—non-epistemic—appraisal of threatening evidence (Galeotti 2016a). On this latter affective-filter view, our emotions may lead us to see evidence regarding a situation we consider significant to our wellbeing as ambiguous and therefore potentially distressing, especially when we deem our ability to deal with the unwelcome situation as limited. Depending on how strong our affective response to the distressing evidence is, we may end up discounting evidence for the situation we want, listening instead to our negative emotions (anxiety, fear, sorrow, etc.), with the result that we become negatively self-deceived (see Lauria and Preissmann 2018). Research on the role of dopamine regulation and negative somatic markers provides some neurobiological evidence in support of this sort of affective-filter model and its potential to offer a unified account of positive and negative self-deception (Lauria et al. 2016; Lauria and Preissmann 2018).
While the philosophers considered so far take the relevant motives to be about the state of the world, some hold that the relevant motives have to do with self-deceivers’ states of mind. If this latter desire-to-believe approach is taken, then there may be just one general motive for both kinds of self-deception. Nelkin (2002, 2012), for instance, argues that the motivation for self-deceptive belief formation should be restricted to a desire to believe that p and that this is compatible with not wanting p to be true. I might want to hold the belief that I have left the stove burner on but not want it to be the case that I have actually left it on. The belief is desirable in this instance because holding it ensures it won’t be true. What unifies cases of self-deception—both twisted and straight—is that the self-deceptive belief is motivated by a desire to believe that p; what distinguishes them is that twisted self-deceivers do not want p to be the case, while straight self-deceivers do. Some, like Mele (2009), argue that such an approach is unnecessarily restrictive since a variety of other motives oriented toward the state of the world might lead one to acquire the unwelcome belief; for example, even just wanting to not be wrong about the welcome belief (see Nelkin 2012 for a response). Others, like Galeotti (2016a), worry that this desire-to-believe account renders self-deceivers’ epistemic confusion into something bordering on incoherence since it seems to imply self-deceivers want to believe p regardless of the state of the world, and such a desire seems absurd even at an unconscious level.
Whether the motive for self-deception aims at the state of the world or the state of the self-deceiver’s mind, the role of affect in the process remains a significant question that further research in neurobiology may shed light upon. The role of affect has been underappreciated but seems to be gathering support and will no doubt guide future theorizing, especially on negative self-deception.
5. Morality and Self-Deception
Even though much of the contemporary philosophical discussion of self-deception has focused on epistemology, philosophical psychology, and philosophy of mind, historically, the morality of self-deception has been the central focus of discussion. Self-deception has been thought to be morally wrong or, at least, morally dangerous insofar as it represents a threat to moral self-knowledge, a cover for immoral activity, or a violation of authenticity. Some thinkers, what Martin (1986) calls ‘the vital lie tradition,’ however, have held that self-deception can, in some instances, be salutary, protecting us from truths that would make life unlivable (e.g., Rorty 1972, 1994). There are two major questions regarding the morality of self-deception: First, can a person be held morally responsible for self-deception, and if so, under what conditions? Second, is there anything morally problematic with self-deception, and if so, what and under what circumstances? The answers to these questions are clearly intertwined. If self-deceivers cannot be held responsible for self-deception, then their responsibility for whatever morally objectionable consequences self-deception might have will be mitigated if not eliminated. Nevertheless, self-deception might be morally significant even if one cannot be taxed for entering it. To be ignorant of one’s moral self, as Socrates saw, may represent a great obstacle to a life well lived, whether or not one is at fault for such ignorance.
5.1 Moral Responsibility for Self-Deception
Whether self-deceivers can be held responsible for their self-deception is largely a question of whether they have the requisite control over the acquisition and maintenance of their self-deceptive belief. In general, intentionalists hold that self-deceivers are responsible since they intend to acquire the self-deceptive belief, usually recognizing the evidence to the contrary. Even when the intention is indirect, such as when one intentionally seeks evidence in favor of p or avoids collecting or examining evidence to the contrary, self-deceivers seem to intentionally flout their own normal standards for gathering and evaluating evidence. So, minimally, they are responsible for such actions and omissions.
Initially, non-intentionalist approaches may seem to remove the agent from responsibility by rendering the process by which she is self-deceived subintentional. If my anxiety, fear, or desire triggers a process that ineluctably leads me to hold the self-deceptive belief, it seems I cannot be held responsible for holding that belief. How could I be held responsible for processes that operate without my knowledge and which are set in motion without my intention? Most non-intentionalist accounts, however, do allow for the possibility that self-deceivers are responsible for individual episodes of self-deception or for the vices of cowardice and lack of self-control from which they spring. To be morally responsible in the sense of being an appropriate target for praise or blame requires, at least, that agents have control over the actions in question. Mele (2001), for example, argues that many sources of bias are controllable and that self-deceivers can recognize and resist the influence of emotion and desire on their belief acquisition and retention, particularly in matters they deem to be important—morally or otherwise. The extent of this control, however, is an empirical question. Nelkin (2012) argues that since Mele’s account leaves the content of motivation driving the bias unrestricted, the mechanism in question is so complex that “it seems unreasonable to expect the self-deceiver to guard against” its operation.
Other non-intentionalists take self-deceivers to be responsible for certain epistemic vices, such as cowardice in the face of fear or anxiety and lack of self-control with respect to the biasing influences of desire and emotion. Thus, Barnes (1997) argues that self-deceivers “can, with effort, in some circumstances, resist their biases” (83) and “can be criticized for failing to take steps to prevent themselves from being biased; they can be criticized for lacking courage in situations where having courage is neither superhumanly difficult nor costly” (175). Whether self-deception is due to a character defect or not, ascriptions of responsibility depend upon whether the self-deceiver has control over the biasing effects of her desires and emotions.
Some question whether self-deceivers do have such control. For instance, Levy (2004) has argued that deflationary accounts of self-deception that deny the contradictory belief requirement should not suppose that self-deceivers are typically responsible since it is rarely the case that self-deceivers possess the requisite awareness of the biasing mechanisms operating to produce their self-deceptive belief. Lacking such awareness, self-deceivers do not appear to know when or on which beliefs such mechanisms operate, rendering them unable to curb the effects of these mechanisms, even when they operate to form false beliefs about morally significant matters. Lacking the control necessary for moral responsibility in individual episodes of self-deception, self-deceivers seem also to lack control over being the sort of person disposed to self-deception.
Non-intentionalists may respond by claiming that self-deceivers often are aware of the potentially biasing effects their desires and emotions might have and can exercise control over them (DeWeese-Boyd 2007). They might also challenge the idea that self-deceivers must be aware in the ways Levy suggests. One well-known account of control, employed by Levy, holds that a person is responsible just in case she acts on a mechanism that is moderately responsive to reasons (including moral reasons), such that were she to possess such reasons, this same mechanism would act upon those reasons in at least one possible world (Fischer and Ravizza 1999). Guidance control, in this sense, requires that the mechanism in question be capable of recognizing and responding to moral and non-moral reasons sufficient for acting otherwise. Nelkin (2011, 2012), however, argues that reasons-responsiveness should be seen as applying primarily to the agent, not the mechanism, requiring only that the agent has the capacity to exercise reason in the situation under scrutiny. The question isn’t whether the biasing mechanism itself is reasons-responsive but whether the agent governing its operation is—that is, whether self-deceivers typically could recognize and respond to moral and non-moral reasons to resist the influence of their desires and emotions and instead exercise special scrutiny of the belief in question. According to Nelkin (2012), expecting self-deceivers to have such a capacity is more likely if we understand the desire driving their bias as a desire to believe that p, since awareness of this sort of desire would make it easier to guard against its influence on the process of determining whether p. Van Loon (2018) points out that discussion of moral responsibility and reasons-responsiveness have focused on actions and omissions that indirectly affect belief formation when it is more appropriate to focus on epistemic reasons-responsiveness. Attitudinal control, not action control, is what is at issue in self-deception. Drawing on McHugh’s (2013, 2014, 2017) account of attitudinal control, Van Loon argues that self-deceivers on Mele-style deflationary accounts are responsible for their self-deceptive beliefs because they recognize and react to evidence against their self-deceptive belief across a wide-range of counter-factual scenarios even though their recognition of this evidence does not alter their belief and their reaction to such evidence leads them viciously to hold the self-deceptive belief.
Galeotti (2016b) rejects the idea that control is the best way to think about responsibility in cases of self-deception since self-deceivers on deflationary approaches seem both confused and relatively powerless over the process. Instead, following a modified version of Sher’s (2009) account of responsibility, she contends that self-deceivers typically have, but fail to recognize, evidence that their acts related to belief formation are wrong or foolish and so fall below some applicable standard (epistemic, moral, etc.). The self-deceiver is under motivational pressure, not incapacitated, and on exiting self-deception, recognizes “the faultiness of her condition and feels regret and shame at having fooled herself” (Galeotti 2016b). This ex-post reasons-responsiveness suggests self-deceivers are responsible in Sher’s sense even if their self-deception is not intentional.
In view of these various ways of cashing out responsibility, it’s plausible that self-deceivers can be morally responsible for their self-deception on deflationary approaches and certainly not obvious that they couldn’t be.
5.2 The Morality of Self-Deception
Insofar as it seems plausible that, in some cases, self-deceivers are apt targets for censure, what prompts this attitude? Take the case of a mother who deceives herself into believing her husband is not abusing their daughter because she can’t bear the thought that he is a moral monster (Barnes 1997). Why do we blame her? Here we confront the nexus between moral responsibility for self-deception and the morality of self-deception. Understanding what obligations may be involved in cases of this sort will help to clarify the circumstances in which ascriptions of moral responsibility are appropriate. While some instances of self-deception seem morally innocuous, and others may even be thought salutary in various ways (Rorty 1994), most theorists have thought there to be something morally objectionable about self-deception or its consequences in many cases. Self-deception has been considered objectionable because it facilitates harm to others (Linehan 1982; Gibson 2020; Clifford 1877) and to oneself, undermines autonomy (Darwall 1988; Baron 1988), corrupts conscience (Butler 1726), violates authenticity (Sartre 1943), manifests a vicious lack of courage and self-control that undermines the capacity for compassionate action (Jenni 2003), violates an epistemic duty to properly ground self-ascriptions (Fernández 2013), violates a general duty to form beliefs that “conform to the available evidence” (Nelkin 2012), or violates a general duty to respect our own values (MacKenzie 2022).
Linehan (1982) argues that we have an obligation to scrutinize the beliefs that guide our actions that is proportionate to the harm to others such actions might involve. When self-deceivers induce ignorance of moral obligations in connection with the particular circumstances, likely consequences of actions, or nature of their own engagements, by means of their self-deceptive beliefs, they may be culpable for negligence with respect to their obligation to know the nature, circumstances, likely consequences, and so forth of their actions (Jenni 2003; Nelkin 2012). Self-deception, accordingly, undermines or erodes agency by reducing our capacity for self-scrutiny and change (Baron 1988). If I am self-deceived about actions or practices that harm others or myself, my abilities to take responsibility and change are also severely restricted.
Joseph Butler (1726), in his well-known sermon “On Self-Deceit,” emphasizes the ways in which self-deception about one’s moral character and conduct—‘self-ignorance’ driven by inordinate ‘self-love’—not only facilitates vicious actions but hinders the agent’s ability to change. Such ignorance, claims Butler, “undermines the whole principle of good … and corrupts conscience, which is the guide of life” (1726). Holton (2022) explores the way our motivation to see ourselves as morally good may play a role in this lack of moral self-knowledge. Existentialist philosophers such as Kierkegaard and Sartre, in very different ways, view self-deception as a threat to ‘authenticity’ insofar as self-deceivers fail to take responsibility for themselves and their engagements in the past, present, and future. By alienating us from our own principles, self-deception may also threaten moral integrity (Jenni 2003). MacKenzie (2022) might be seen as capturing precisely what’s wrong with this sort of inauthenticity when she contends that we have a duty to properly respect our values, even non-moral ones. Since self-deception is always about something we value in some way, it represents a failure to properly respect ourselves as valuers. Others note that self-deception also manifests a certain weakness of character that disposes us to react to fear, anxiety, or the desire for pleasure in ways that bias our belief acquisition and retention in ways that serve these emotions and desires rather than accuracy (Butler 1726; Clifford 1877). Such epistemic cowardice (Barnes 1997; Jenni 2003) and lack of self-control may inhibit the ability of self-deceivers to stand by or apply moral principles they hold by biasing their beliefs regarding particular circumstances, consequences, or engagements or by obscuring the principles themselves. Gibson (2020), following Clifford (1877), contends that self-deception increases the risk of harm to the self and others and the cultivation of epistemic vices like credulity that may have devastating social ramifications. In all these ways and a myriad of others, philosophers have found some self-deception objectionable in itself or for the consequences it has, not only on our ability to shape our lives but also for the potential harm it may cause to ourselves and others.
Evaluating self-deception and its consequences for ourselves and others is a difficult task. It requires, among other things: determining the degree of control self-deceivers have; what the self-deception is about (Is it important morally or otherwise?); what ends the self-deception serves (Does it serve mental health or as a cover for moral wrongdoing?); how entrenched it is (Is it episodic or habitual?); and, whether it is escapable (What means of correction are available to the self-deceiver?). As Nelkin (2012) contends, determining whether and to what degree self-deceivers are culpably negligent will ultimately need to be determined on a case-by-case basis in light of answers to such questions about the stakes at play and the difficulty involved. Others like Mackenzie (2022) hold that every case of self-deception is a violation of a general duty to respect our own values, though some cases are more egregious than others.
If self-deception is morally objectionable for any of these reasons, we ought to avoid it. But, one might reasonably ask how that is possible given the subterranean ways self-deception seems to operate. Answering this question is tricky since strategies will vary with the analyses of self-deception and our responsibility for it. Nevertheless, two broad approaches seem to apply to most accounts, namely, the cultivation of one’s epistemic virtues and the cultivation of one’s epistemic community (Galeotti 2016b). One might avoid the self-deceptive effects of motivation by cultivating virtues like impartiality, vigilance, conscientiousness, and resistance to the influence of emotion, desire, and the like. Additionally, one might cultivate an epistemic community that holds one accountable and guides one away from self-deception (Rorty 1994; Galeotti 2016b, 2018). By binding ourselves to communities we have authorized to referee our belief formation in this way, we protect ourselves from potential lapses in epistemic virtue. These kinds of strategies might indirectly affect our susceptibility to self-deception and offer some hope of avoiding it.
6. Origin of Self-Deception: Adaptation or Spandrel
Quite aside from the doxastic, strategic, and moral puzzles self-deception raises, there is the evolutionary puzzle of its origin. Why do human beings have this capacity in the first place? Why would natural selection allow a capacity to survive that undermines the accurate representation of reality, especially when inaccuracies about individual ability or likely risk can lead to catastrophic errors?
Many argue that self-deceptively inflated views of ourselves, our abilities, our prospects, or our control—so-called ‘positive illusions’—confer direct benefits in terms of psychological well-being, physical health, and social advancement that serve fitness (Taylor and Brown 1994; Taylor 1989; McKay and Dennett 2009). Just because ‘positive illusions’ make us ‘feel good,’ of course, it does not follow that they are adaptive. From an evolutionary perspective, whether an organism ‘feels good’ or is ‘happy’ is not significant unless it enhances survival and reproduction. McKay and Dennett (2009) argue that positive illusions are not only tolerable; evolutionarily speaking, they contribute to fitness directly. Overly positive beliefs about our abilities or chances for success appear to make us more apt to exceed our abilities and achieve success than more accurate beliefs would (Taylor and Brown 1994; Bandura 1989). According to Johnston and Fowler (2011), overconfidence is “advantageous, because it encourages individuals to claim resources they could not otherwise win if it came to a conflict (stronger but cautious rivals will sometime fail to make a claim, and it keeps them from walking away from conflicts they would surely win).” Inflated attitudes regarding the personal qualities and capacities of one’s partners and children would also seem to enhance fitness by facilitating the thriving of offspring (McKay and Dennett 2009).
Alternatively, some argue that self-deception evolved to facilitate interpersonal deception by eliminating the cues and cognitive load that consciously lying produces and by mitigating retaliation should the deceit become evident (von Hippel and Trivers 2011; Trivers 2011, 2000, 1991). On this view, the real gains associated with ‘positive illusions’ and other self-deceptions are byproducts that serve this greater evolutionary end by enhancing self-deceivers’ ability to deceive. Von Hippel and Trivers (2011) contend that “by deceiving themselves about their own positive qualities and the negative qualities of others, people are able to display greater confidence than they might otherwise feel, thereby enabling them to advance socially and materially.” Critics have pointed to data suggesting high self-deceivers are deemed less trustworthy than low self-deceivers (McKay and Dennett 2011). Others have complained that there is little data to support this hypothesis (Dunning 2011; Van Leeuwen 2007a, 2013a), and what data there is shows us to be poor lie-detectors (Funkhouser 2019; Vrij 2011). Some challenge this theory by noting that a simple disregard for the truth would serve as well as self-deception and have the advantage of retaining true representations (McKay and Prelec 2011) or that often self-deceivers are the only ones deceived (Van Leeuwen 2007a; Kahlil 2011). Van Leeuwen (2013a) raises the concern that the wide variety of phenomena identified by this theory as self-deception render the category so broad that it is difficult to tell whether it is a unified phenomenon traceable to particular mechanisms that could plausibly be sensitive to selection pressures. Funkhouser (2019) worries that the unconscious retention of the truth that von Hippel and Trivers (2011) propose would generate tells of its own and that the psychological complexity of this explanation is unnecessary if the goal is to deceive others (which is itself contentious) since that goal would be easier to achieve through self-delusion. So, von Hippel and Trivers’ (2011) theory may explain self-delusion but not cases of self-deception marked by deep conflict (Funkhouser 2017b).
In view of these shortcomings, Van Leeuwen (2007a) argues the capacity for self-deception is a spandrel—a byproduct of other aspects of our cognitive architecture—not an adaptation in the strong sense of being positively selected. While Funkhouser (2017b) agrees that the basic cognitive architecture that allows motivation to influence belief formation—as well as the specific tools used to form or maintain biased belief—were not selected for the sake of self-deception, it nevertheless makes sense to say, for at least some contents, that self-deception is adaptive (2017b).
Whether it is an adaptation or a spandrel, it’s possible this capacity has nevertheless been retained as a consequence of its fitness value. Lopez and Fuxjager (2011) argue that the broad research on the so-called “winner effect”—the increased probability of achieving victory in social or physical conflicts following prior victories—lends support to the idea that self-deception is at least weakly adaptive since self-deception in the form of positive illusions, like past wins, confers a fitness advantage. Lamba and Nityananda (2014) test the theory that self-deceived are better at deceiving others—specifically, whether overconfident individuals are overrated by others and underconfident individuals underrated. In their study, students in tutorials were asked to predict their own performance on the next assignment as well as that of each of their peers in the tutorial in terms of absolute grade and relative rank. Comparing these predictions and the actual grades given on the assignment suggests a strong positive relationship between self-deception and deception. Those who self-deceptively rated themselves higher were rated higher by their peers as well. These findings lend suggestive support to the claim self-deception facilitates other deception. While these studies certainly do not supply all the data necessary to support the theory that the propensity to self-deception should be viewed as adaptation, they do suggest ways to test these evolutionary hypotheses by focusing on specific phenomena.
Whether or not the psychological and social benefits identified by these theories explain the evolutionary origins of the capacity for self-deceit, they may well shed light on its prevalence and persistence, as well as point to ways to identify contexts in which this tendency presents high collective risk (Lamba and Nityananda 2014).
7. Collective Self-Deception
Collective self-deception has received scant direct philosophical attention as compared with its individual counterpart. Collective self-deception might refer simply to a group of similarly self-deceived individuals or to a group-entity (such as a corporation, committee, jury, or the like) that is self-deceived. These alternatives reflect two basic perspectives that social epistemologists have taken on ascriptions of propositional attitudes to collectives. On the one hand, such attributions might be taken summatively as simply an indirect way of attributing those states to members of the collective (Quinton 1975/1976). This summative understanding, then, considers attitudes attributed to groups to be nothing more than metaphors expressing the sum of the attitudes held by their members. To say that students think tuition is too high is just a way of saying that most students think so. On the other hand, such attributions might be understood non-summatively as applying to collective entities, themselves ontologically distinct from the members upon which they depend. These so-called ‘plural subjects’ (Gilbert 1989, 1994, 2005) or ‘social integrates’ (Pettit 2003), while supervening upon the individuals comprising them, may well express attitudes that diverge from individual members. For instance, saying NASA believed the O-rings on the space shuttle’s booster rockets to be safe need not imply that most or all the members of this organization personally held this belief, only that the institution itself did. The non-summative understanding, then, considers collectives to be, like persons, apt targets for attributions of propositional attitudes and potentially of moral and epistemic censure as well. Following this distinction, collective self-deception may be understood in either a summative or non-summative sense.
In the summative sense, collective self-deception refers to a self-deceptive belief shared by a group of individuals whom each come to hold the self-deceptive belief for similar reasons and by similar means, varying according to the account of self-deception followed. We might call this self-deception across a collective. In the non-summative sense, the subject of collective self-deception is the collective itself, not simply the individuals comprising it. The following sections offer an overview of these forms of collective self-deception, noting the significant challenges posed by each.
7.1 Summative Collective Self-Deception: Self-Deception Across a Collective
Understood summatively, we might define collective self-deception as the holding of a false belief in the face of evidence to the contrary by a group of people as a result of shared desires, emotions, or intentions (depending upon the account of self-deception) favoring that belief. Collective self-deception is distinct from other forms of collective false belief—such as might result from deception or lack of evidence—insofar as the false belief issues from the agents’ own self-deceptive mechanisms (however these are construed), not the absence of evidence to the contrary or presence of misinformation. Accordingly, the individuals constituting the group would not hold the false belief if their vision weren’t distorted by their attitudes (desire, anxiety, fear, or the like) toward the belief. What distinguishes collective self-deception from solitary self-deception is just its social context; namely, that it occurs within a group that shares both the attitudes bringing about the false belief and the false belief itself.
Merely sharing desires, emotions, or intentions favoring a belief with a group does not entail that the self-deception is properly social since these individuals may well self-deceive regardless of the fact that their motivations are shared with others (Dings 2017; Funkhouser 2019); they are just individually self-deceiving in parallel. What makes collective self-deception social, according to Dings (2017), is that others are a means used in each individual’s self-deception. So, when a person situates herself in a group of like-minded people in response to an encounter with new and threatening evidence, her self-deception becomes social. Self-deception also becomes social in Dings’ (2017) view when a person influences others to make them like-minded with regard to her preferred belief, using their behavior to reinforce her self-deception. Within highly homogeneous social groups, however, it may be difficult to tell who is using the group instrumentally in these ways, especially when that use is unwitting. Moreover, one may not need to seek out such a group of like-minded people if they already comprise one’s community. In this case, those people may become instrumental to one’s self-deception simply by dint of being there to provide insulation from threatening evidence and support for one’s preferred belief. In any case, this sort of self-deception is both easier to foster and more difficult to escape, being abetted by the self-deceptive efforts of others within the group.
Virtually all self-deception has a social component, being wittingly or unwittingly supported by one’s associates (see Ruddick 1988). In the case of collective self-deception, however, the social dimension comes to the fore since each member of the collective unwittingly helps to sustain the self-deceptive belief of the others in the group. For example, my cancer-stricken friend might self-deceptively believe her prognosis to be quite good. Faced with the fearful prospect of death, she does not form accurate beliefs regarding the probability of her full recovery, attending only to evidence supporting full recovery and discounting or ignoring altogether the ample evidence to the contrary. Caring for her as I do, I share many of the anxieties, fears, and desires that sustain my friend’s self-deceptive belief, and as a consequence, I form the same self-deceptive belief via the same mechanisms. In such a case, I unwittingly support my friend’s self-deceptive belief, and she mine—our self-deceptions are mutually reinforcing. We are collectively or mutually self-deceived, albeit on a very small scale. Ruddick (1988) calls this ‘joint self-deception,’ and it is properly social just in case each person is instrumental in the formation of the self-deceptive belief in the other (Dings 2017).
On a larger scale, sharing common attitudes, large segments of a society might deceive themselves together. For example, we share a number of self-deceptive beliefs regarding our consumption patterns. Many of the goods we consume are produced by people enduring labor conditions we do not find acceptable and in ways that we recognize are environmentally destructive and likely unsustainable. Despite our being at least generally aware of these social and environmental ramifications of our consumptive practices, we hold the overly optimistic beliefs that the world will be fine, that its peril is overstated, that the suffering caused by the exploitive and ecologically degrading practices are overblown, that our own consumption habits are unconnected to these sufferings, and even that our minimal efforts at conscientious consumption are an adequate remedy (see Goleman 1989). When self-deceptive beliefs such as these are held collectively, they become entrenched, and their consequences, good or bad, are magnified (Surbey 2004).
The collective entrenches self-deceptive beliefs by providing positive reinforcement through others sharing the same false belief as well as by protecting its members from evidence that would destabilize the target belief. There are, however, limits to how entrenched such beliefs can become and remain. Social support cannot be the sole or primary cause of the self-deceptive belief, for then the belief would simply be the result of unwitting interpersonal deception and not the deviant belief formation process that characterizes self-deception. If the environment becomes so epistemically contaminated as to make counter-evidence inaccessible to the agent, then we have a case of simple false belief, not self-deception. Thus, even within a collective, a person is self-deceived just in case her own motivations skew the belief formation process that results in her holding the false belief. But, to bar this from being a simple case of solitary self-deception, others must be instrumental to her belief formation process such that if they were not part of that process, she would not be self-deceived (Dings 2017). For instance, I might be motivated to believe that climate change is not a serious problem and form that false belief as a consequence. In such a case, I’m not socially self-deceived, even if virtually everyone I know shares a similar motivation and belief. But, say I encounter distressing evidence in my environmental science class that I can’t shake on my own. I may seek to surround myself with like-minded people, thereby protecting myself from further distressing evidence and providing myself with reassuring evidence. Now, my self-deception is social, and this social component drives and reinforces my own motivations to self-deceive.
Relative to solitary self-deception, the collective variety presents greater external obstacles to avoiding or escaping self-deception and is, for this reason, more entrenched. If the various proposed psychological mechanisms of self-deception pose an internal challenge to the self-deceiver’s power to control her belief formation, then these social factors pose an external challenge to the self-deceiver’s control. Determining how superable this challenge is will affect our assessment of individual responsibility for self-deception as well as the prospects of unassisted escape from it.
7.2 Non-Summative Collective Self-Deception: Self-Deception of a Collective Entity
Collective self-deception can also be understood from the perspective of the collective itself in a non-summative sense. Though there are varying accounts of group belief, generally speaking, a group can be said to believe, desire, value, or the like just in case its members “jointly commit” to these things as a body (Gilbert 2005). A corporate board, for instance, might be jointly committed as a body to believe, value, and strive for whatever the CEO recommends. Such commitment need not entail that each individual board member personally endorses such beliefs, values, or goals, only that they do so as members of the board (Gilbert 2005). While philosophically precise accounts of non-summative self-deception remain largely unarticulated—an exception is Galeotti’s (2018) detailed analysis of how collective self-deception occurs in the context of politics—the possibilities mirror those of individual self-deception. When collectively held attitudes motivate a group to espouse a false belief despite the group’s possession of evidence to the contrary, we can say that the group is collectively self-deceived in a non-summative sense.
For example, Robert Trivers (2000) suggests that ‘organizational self-deception’ led to NASA’s failure to represent accurately the risks posed by the space shuttle’s O-ring design, a failure that eventually led to the Challenger disaster. The organization as a whole, he argues, had strong incentives to represent such risks as small. As a consequence, NASA’s Safety Unit mishandled and misrepresented data it possessed that suggested that under certain temperature conditions, the shuttle’s O-rings were not safe. NASA, as an organization, then, self-deceptively believed the risks posed by O-ring damage were minimal. Within the institution, however, there were a number of individuals who did not share this belief, but both they and the evidence supporting their belief were treated in a biased manner by the decision-makers within the organization. As Trivers (2000) puts it, this information was relegated “to portions of … the organization that [were] inaccessible to consciousness (we can think of the people running NASA as the conscious part of the organization).” In this case, collectively held values created a climate within NASA that clouded its vision of the data and led to its endorsement of a fatally false belief.
Collective self-deceit may also play a significant role in facilitating unethical practices by corporate entities. For example, a collective commitment by members of a corporation to maximizing profits might lead members to form false beliefs about the ethical propriety of the corporation’s practices. Gilbert (2005) suggests that such a commitment might lead executives and other members to “simply lose sight of moral constraints and values they previously held.” Similarly, Tenbrunsel and Messick (2004) argue that self-deceptive mechanisms play a pervasive role in what they call ‘ethical fading,’ acting as a kind of ‘bleach’ that renders organizations blind to the ethical dimensions of their decisions. They argue that such self-deceptive mechanisms must be recognized and actively resisted at the organizational level if unethical behavior is to be avoided. More specifically, Gilbert (2005) contends that collectively accepting that “certain moral constraints must rein in the pursuit of corporate profits” might shift corporate culture in such a way that efforts to respect these constraints are recognized as part of being a good corporate citizen. In view of the ramifications this sort of collective self-deception has for the way we understand corporate misconduct and responsibility, understanding its specific nature in greater detail remains an important task.
Collective self-deception, understood in either the summative or non-summative sense, raises significant questions, such as whether individuals within collectives bear responsibility for their self-deception or the part they play in the collective’s self-deception and whether collective entities can be held responsible for their epistemic failures (see Galeotti 2016b, 2018 on these questions). Finally, collective self-deception prompts us to ask what means are available to collectives and their members to resist, avoid, and escape self-deception. Galeotti (2016b, 2018) argues for a variety of institutional constraints and precommitments to keep groups from falling prey to self-deception.
Given the capacity of collective self-deception to entrench false beliefs and to magnify their consequences—sometimes with disastrous results—collective self-deception is not just a philosophical puzzle; it is a problem that demands attention.
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