Supplement to Sextus Empiricus

Interpreting Frede

It is a difficulty with Frede’s interpretation that in his 1979 paper, he persistently puts the difference between the kind of belief the skeptic can have and the kind that the skeptic can’t have in these terms: the skeptic ‘has no beliefs about how things really are’ but ‘he does have beliefs about how things are’ (1979: 9; his emphasis). The qualifier ‘really’ is supposed to match Sextus’ frequent claim that skeptics suspend judgment as to whether something is such-and-such ‘by nature’, or ‘in nature’, etc. (ibid). Thus, it can seem as if Frede thinks the way to frame the difference between the beliefs the skeptic can have and those he can’t is to point to an alleged difference in content between ‘p’ and ‘really, p’. In his 1984 paper, he puts the difference between the two beliefs in terms of having a view and taking a position (1984: 133), and frequently glosses the first as a mere belief that p, as opposed to the second which is a matter of believing that it is true that p (135; 138; etc.). Once again, he seems to be claiming that the content of the skeptic’s beliefs is different from that of the dogmatists’ beliefs, and this time the difference is marked by the presence of the operator ‘it is true that’. Commentators have not been sympathetic to these two ways of putting things (see for instance Fine 2000: 83–8). Frede’s view is best captured by the distinction discussed earlier, namely the difference between coming to believe something on the basis of marshalling reasons for and against it, and coming to believe it because you are going along with an impression you have. Why did Frede also put the distinction in terms of believing that p and believing that it is true that p? For a start, Frede accepted the Stoic view that ‘it is true that p’ and ‘p’, although logically equivalent, express different propositions (1984: 133). But to flesh out the difference between believing that p and believing that it is true that p, one could point to a distinction Strawson drew in his 1949 paper ‘Truth’. In that paper, Strawson discussed the expression ‘That’s true!’, in particular when it is used after someone else has made an assertion, a use that Strawson compares to one use of the word ‘Ditto!’: ‘I am agreeing with, endorsing, underwriting what you said’ (Strawson 1949: 90). So just as Strawson thinks that to be prepared to assert ‘it is true that p’ involves endorsing the proposition that p in a way that merely asserting that p doesn’t, Frede thinks that believing that it is true that p marks an endorsement of the proposition that p that’s missing from merely believing that p; this endorsement amounts to your taking yourself to have more reasons in favour of p than against. Hence why the skeptic will not assert that it is true that p: he

has no stake in the truth of the impression he is left with. He is ever ready to consider the matter further, to change his mind. He has no attachment to the impressions he is left with. (1984: 138)

Copyright © 2019 by
Benjamin Morison <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free