Notes to Naturalistic Approaches to Social Construction

1. Alexander Bird (2005) interestingly notes the novelty of Kuhn’s appeal to psychological evidence and the respect in which, in his reliance on various sorts of evidence (psychological and historical), his earlier work is more naturalistic than what followed.

2. To varying degrees, Alan Nelson (1994), Arthur Fine (1996), and Ian Hacking (1999) explore the further suggestion that constructionist work sometimes seems to support what Fine calls “social particularism”—a view on which (due to the influence of numerous and highly idiosyncratic social factors in every scientific investigation) no very general account of scientific process, including its causes and outcomes, can be given.

3. Many commentators make such a distinction (e.g. Andreasen 1998, p. 217ff). To some philosophical ears, it may sound odd to speak of facts as being constructed if facts are abstract while construction is some sort of spatio-temporally located process. For present purposes, we can say that a fact is socially constructed just in case the corresponding event is socially constructed (see the section on events vs. facts in Events).

4. While it is unsurprising that such facts are socially constructed, they nonetheless raise questions for social ontology, for example, questions about how to reconcile the apparent objectivity of social facts with a naturalistic conception of the world (cf. Searle 1995).

5. This terminology of “overt” (and that below of “covert”) social construction is adapted from Griffiths 1997.

6. In the case of race and gender categories, the emphasis also offers something more, the possibility of constructionist interpretations of the categories in question: interpretations that emphasize the reality of the category, but a reality that grows out of our social, cultural, and conceptual practices. It is this sort of constructionist account that offers the possibility of a social referent for a term construed on a causal theory of reference, as noted below (see Mallon 2006).

7. This sort of distinction is drawn by others, e.g. Haslanger 1995, Kukla 2000.

8. As with other causal claims, these causal constructionist claims may be filled in terms of generalizations about types or tokens.

9. Because racial terms were presumably introduced in to refer to some non-social kind, the constructionist would likely need to insist that the referent of racial terms involved in covert constructions “switched” at some point from an intended but failed referent to an unintended but successful one. Discussion of reference switching has an old and continuing presence in the theory of reference (e.g. Evans 1973; Tye 1998).

10. See Hacking 1999 on interpreting Pickering’s (1984) claims about constructing quarks in this way.

11. An important subset of representations of the world are human beliefs, and these are a sort of human trait. Thus the discussion of the construction of representations (above) overlaps with the social construction of human traits.

12. Hacking’s own interpretation of looping effects remains controversial (e.g. Mallon 2003; Murphy 2006 Chp. 7). Murphy notes that Hacking’s own interpretation of the “looping effect” is not always causal—he sometimes (e.g. Hacking 1999) suggests a semantic interpretation of the approach.

Copyright © 2019 by
Ron Mallon <>

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