#### Supplement to Conventionality of Simultaneity

## Further Discussion of Malament's Theorem

Havas (1987, 444) says, “What Malament has shown, in fact, is that in Minkowski space-time … one can always introduce time-orthogonal coordinates … , an obvious and well-known result which implies ε=1/2.” In a comprehensive review of the problem of the conventionality of simultaneity, Anderson, Vetharaniam, and Stedman (1998, 124–125) claim that Malament’s proof is erroneous. Although they appear to be wrong in this claim, the nature of their error highlights the fact that Malament’s proof, which uses the time-symmetric relation κ, would not be valid if a temporal orientation were introduced into space-time (see, for example, Spirtes 1981, Ch. VI, Sec. F; and Stein 1991, 153n).

Sarkar and Stachel (1999) argue that there is no physical warrant for the requirement that a simultaneity relation be invariant under temporal reflections. Dropping that requirement, they show that Malament’s other criteria for a simultaneity relation are then also satisfied if we fix some arbitrary event in space-time and say either that any pair of events on its backward null cone are simultaneous or, alternatively, that any pair of events on its forward null cone are simultaneous. They show further that, among the relations satisfying these requirements, standard synchrony is the unique such relation that is independent of the position of an observer and the half-null-cone relations are the unique such relations that are independent of the motion of an observer. If the backward-cone relation were chosen, then simultaneous events would be those seen simultaneously by an observer at the cone’s vertex. As Sarkar and Stachel (1999, 209) note, Einstein (1905, 39 of the Dover translation or 126 of the Princeton translation) considered this possibility and rejected it because of its dependence on the position of the observer. Since the half-null-cone relations define causally connectible events to be simultaneous, it would seem that they would also be rejected by adherents of the views of Reichenbach and Grünbaum.

Ben-Yami (2006) also argues against Malament’s requirement of
invariance under temporal reflections, but for different reasons than
those of Sarkar and Stachel. Ben-Yami (2006, 461) takes his
fundamental causal relation to be the following: “If
event *e*_{1} is a cause of
event *e*_{2}, then *e*_{2} does not
precede *e*_{1}.” He thus allows events to be
simultaneous with their causes, and consequently the range of
Reichenbach’s ε is extended to include both 0 and
1. Ben-Yami’s causal relation is not time-symmetric, which is his
reason for rejecting the requirement of invariance under temporal
reflections. He concludes (Ben-Yami 2006, 469-470) that, with his
modified causal relation, there are “infinitely many possible
simultaneity relations: any space-like or light-like conic
hypersurface of an event on *O* defines a simultaneity relation
for that event relative to *O*, and then, by translations, for
any event on *O*.” However he then goes on to argue
against the assumption that an observer, represented by *O*,
would remain inertial forever, and ultimately concludes not only that
standard simultaneity cannot be defined but that the only two
simultaneity relations that can be defined relative to an event are
those determined by its future and past light cones.

Giulini (2001, 653) argues that it is too strong a requirement to ask
that a simultaneity relation be invariant under causal transformations
(such as scale transformations) that are not physical symmetries,
which Malament as well as Sarkar and Stachel do. Using
“*Aut*” to refer to the appropriate invariance group
and “nontrivial” to refer to an equivalence relation on
spacetime that is neither one in which all points are in the same
equivalence class nor one in which each point is in a different
equivalence class, Giulini (2001, 657–658) defines two types of
simultaneity: Absolute simultaneity is a
nontrivial *Aut*-invariant equivalence relation on spacetime such
that each equivalence class intersects any physically realizable
timelike trajectory in at most one point, and simultaneity relative to
some structure *X* in spacetime (for Malament, *X* is
the world line of an inertial observer) is a
nontrivial *Aut*_{X}-invariant equivalence
relation on spacetime such that each equivalence class intersects any
physically realizable timelike trajectory in at most one point,
where *Aut*_{X} is the subgroup of *Aut* that
preserves *X*. First taking *Aut* to be the
inhomogeneous (i.e., including translations) Galilean transformations,
Giulini (2001, 660–662) shows that standard Galilean (i.e.,
pre-relativistic) simultaneity is the unique absolute simultaneity
relation. Then taking *Aut* to be the inhomogeneous Lorentz
transformations (also known as the Poincaré transformations),
Giulini (2001, 664–666) shows that there is no absolute
simultaneity relation and that standard Einsteinian synchrony is the
unique relative simultaneity when *X* is taken to be a
foliation of spacetime by straight lines (thus, like Malament,
singling out a specific inertial frame, but in a way that is different
from Malament’s choice of *X*).