Margarete Susman

First published Sat Aug 20, 2022

Margarete Susman stands out as a distinct voice among the first generation of German women in philosophy in the 20th century. In her capacity as a philosopher, cultural critic, and essayist, she was a regular member of the circle of Georg Simmel, which included Martin Buber, Ernst Bloch, and Georg Lukacs, among others. Jewish thought and the question of the status and role of women in modern society are the two central foci of Susman’s critical interest. They guide her work, which examines the challenges modernity poses to culture and society as it tracks the profound and radical upheavals that define the times of Susman’s life: the Wilhelmine Empire, World War I, the social and political revolutions of Weimar Germany, the rise of the Nazis to power, the Shoah, and the emergence of the new world during the postwar period.

Her pioneering essays on Franz Rosenzweig and Franz Kafka helped establish Susman as a leading thinker of modern Jewish thought. Often her work assumes the form of studies of other thinkers or intellectual or social movements. These studies are not merely exegetical and interpretative, however, but articulate Susman’s own response to the question of how to deal with the historical constellations of past philosophical thought in the face of the unprecedented exigencies of the present. In them, Susman stakes out a dialogical space for her own critical concerns. She does so by maintaining a reflective receptivity whose explorative openness opposes the tendency to closure informing the style of academic, disciplinary discourse.

After authoring two volumes of poetry (an additional early volume had appeared as a private edition), Susman went on to produce her first monograph, Das Wesen der modernen deutschen Lyrik (The Character of Modern German Poetry, 1910), which introduced the concept of the “lyrical I” as the key feature in modern poetry. Her first philosophical book, Vom Sinn der Liebe (Of the Meaning of Love, 1912), is an engaging study of sex, gender, and love whose approach to difference and alterity continues to command attention. The publication of the book led to a lasting friendship with Gustav Landauer, who wrote an enthusiastic review and whose political ideas Susman shared.

A sample of characteristic essays written over three decades, from the early 1920s to the late 1940s, was published in Gestalten und Kreise (Figures and Circles, 1954, hereafter GK). The essay collection conveys the themes Susman was principally preoccupied with as well as her approach to essay writing. Susman’s Das Buch Hiob und das Schicksal des jüdischen Volkes (The Book of Job and the Destiny of the Jewish People, 1946) was one of the earliest attempts at responding to the catastrophic events of the Shoah and the challenge they posed to the very meaning of being Jewish after the genocidal annihilation of European Jewry. In this book, Susman argues that, like the Book of Job had suggested, the question of meaning was ultimately not to be answered by any rationalization of human loss and suffering through the invocation of a grander scheme but was instead to be approached by acknowledging the impossibility of grasping the unfathomable and comprehending meaning as the continuous project of human existence whose temporality comes into focus only from the viewpoint of a future yet to be realized.

1. Biography

Susman was born on October 14, 1872, in Hamburg, Germany to a well-situated, Jewish, middle-class family. In 1882, the family moved to Zurich, Switzerland, where Susman attended primary school and the gymnasium. While her father was supportive of her as a poet, arranging for a private publication of a volume of her poetry on the occasion of her twentieth birthday, he staunchly opposed her wish to study. In 1894, after his death, the family returned to Germany to settle in Hanover. In order to allow Susman to study, her older sister Paula assumed sole responsibility for the care of their ailing mother. After studying painting in Düsseldorf and Paris, Susman began to study philosophy in Munich with Theodor Lipps. She subsequently moved to Berlin, where she studied with Georg Simmel, becoming a regular participant in his after-hours private discussion group. In 1906, Susman married a fellow painter, Eduard von Bendemann. Though initially willing to comply with his parents’ request that, as a condition of their marriage, she convert to Christianity, Susman decided the day before her baptism that it was impossible for her to abandon Judaism. Her parents-in-law accepted her decision. The same year, Georg Simmel published his book Religion as part of Martin Buber’s series Society: Series in Social-Psychological Studies, dedicating it to Susman and Gertrud Kantorowicz.

From 1907 to 1932, she was a regular contributor to the Frankfurter Zeitung. During this time, she reviewed new publications in literature and philosophy, often with a particular focus on the German-Jewish experience. From 1912 to 1915, she lived with her family in Rüschlikon, near Zurich. The family returned to Germany in 1915, first living in Frankfurt and then, beginning in 1919, living on a farm close to the Swiss border in Säckingen on the Rhine. Although inspired by the vision of Gustav Landauer and the life reform movement to move to the countryside to get away from the postwar chaos in Frankfurt, the long hours of work on the farm left Susman only with the nights for reading (Susman 1964: 96).

Susman’s review of Franz Rosenzweig’s Star of Redemption (1921) in Der Jude, Weimar Germany’s premier Jewish literary journal, which was published by Buber from 1916–1928, was one of the earliest critical recognitions of the significance of Rosenzweig’s philosophically critical turn, or what he called “new thinking”. Rosenzweig credited Susman with having understood his work like nobody else. In a letter to her, responding to her review, he wrote:

The following will confirm how profoundly you understood the book: the line that you chose as motto for your essay I wrote back in November 18 in completely clear awareness that it is the core and central proposition of the whole [book]. (collected in Rosenzweig 1979: volume 2.1, 752)

From 1926 to 1935, Susman published her most important essays in the bi-monthly journal Der Morgen, which, from 1925–1938, was the leading intellectual forum of German Jewry. With the German philosopher Arnold Metzger, Susman read, in 1927, another seminal book that had just left the press and that in her view would compare unfavorably to Rosenzweig’s: Heidegger’s Being and Time (1927).

In 1928, the von Bendemanns divorced and Susman moved to Frankfurt where she stayed until 1933. On New Year’s Eve of 1933, she found herself the only passenger on the night train from Amsterdam to Zurich; she arrived in Zurich on the morning of the new year and remained there until the end of her life, in 1966. In her autobiography, she called this chapter of her life “emigration home”. Her last publication in Germany included an essay (1935a) examining Adalbert Stifter’s subliminal antisemitism in his novella Abdias (1842). The essay also appeared as a postface to the novella published in the Schocken small book series dedicated to Jewish cultural resistance in Nazi Germany in the 1930s. The other essay with which she ended a decade of contributing to Der Morgen, “On the Intellectual Contribution of Jews in the German Region” (“Vom geistigen Anteil der Juden im deutschen Raum”, 1935b), was a brief survey of signature contributions to German culture and philosophy from Moses Mendelssohn to Franz Kafka. The essay concluded with the suggestion that Jewish life might well have ended in Germany and would perhaps resume one day in another corner of the world.

For Susman, the return to Zurich was more than a homecoming to the city of the formative years of her late childhood and adolescence; it was a return to a place that was becoming a temporary safe haven for Europe’s refuges, especially its German speaking emigrant intelligentsia. Here, Susman found a new intellectual home in the religious socialist circle of Leonhard Ragaz. Her work appeared in his journal Neue Wege from 1935–1965. In Zurich, Susman also became the center of a circle of young German and Swiss Jewish intellectuals, acting as a mentor to and source of intellectual and emotional support for many of its participants, notably the philosophers Michael Landmann, Hermann Levin Goldschmidt, and Jacob Taubes.

In 1946, she published The Book of Job and the Destiny of the Jewish People. The book was among the first attempts to wrestle with the predicament of how to continue life after Auschwitz. Susman returns to the figure of Job, servant of God, as the paradigmatic figure to reimagine Jewish life after the Shoah. While this book dealt with the challenge to making sense of the Jewish experience, Interpretation of a Great Love: Goethe and Charlotte von Stein (Deutung einer grossen Liebe: Goethe und Charlotte Stein, 1951) scrutinized the remains of the German state of mind by revisiting the twists and turns of the legendary yet conflicted love of Germany’s famed cultural icon, Goethe. Examining the profound but painful and ultimately doomed love affair of the most revered German thinker and artist, Susman shed light on the darker sides of the deep-running issues haunting German affective life.

Deutung biblischer Gestalten (Interpretation of Biblical Figures, hereafter DBG), which featured essays from the 1930s and 1940s, came in 1955. Susman, who had gone blind in her final years, dictated her last publication, her autobiography Ich habe viele Leben gelebt: Erinnerungen (I Have Lived Many Lives: Memoirs), published in 1964.

2. “Judaism and Culture”

In her first essay, “Judentum und Kultur” (“Judaism and Culture”, 1907, hereafter JuK), which was also her first article to appear in Frankfurter Zeitung, Susman offers a succinct argument for the Jewish tradition’s critical significance for rethinking modernity as well as philosophy more generally. Critical of a reductionism that would cast Judaism as simply a form of ethics, she argues that doing so would mean to unthinkingly submit to the tripartition of all human endeavors into esthetics, logics, and ethics. She suggests that, arbitrary and ultimately unfeasible, this approach turns a blind eye to what might well be the most fundamental dimension of all human endeavors, the religious one. For Susman, the sphere of the religious constitutes the focal point of all culture; all other forms of producing value—the ethical, esthetic, and logical ones—gather around it as that which grounds their purpose. Ethics, Susman notes, contrary to widely shared views, has never been Judaism’s single purpose but the means to pursue its task in history (JuK 1).

Written in the wake of Simmel’s Religion (1906), which painted a vivid picture of the profound role religion continues to play in modern culture and society, “Judentum und Kultur” argues against the call for assimilation and for the enduring and vital significance of Judaism’s role in modern culture. In an early gesture towards interfaith dialogue, the essay suggests, without referencing Leo Baeck’s argument in The Essence of Judaism (1905), that Judaism is not a religion of dogmas, thereby adding to Baeck’s argument a striking and unexpected point. Western culture, she notes, rests on Christian foundations that inform modernity, inflecting its deepest longings and desires for redemption. Taking off the “straightjacket” of Christian religion would be tantamount to ripping apart the arteries and pulses of the culture—in short, it would amount to a collapse of “our whole culture”. While Christianity, unlike Judaism, has become a completely universalized religion that envisions human redemption in purely universal terms, its history is also

an answer the history of humanity offers to the question of whether Judaism is free of dogmas and contains a living core.

For Christianity, she observes, “originated after all from Judaism” (JuK 2). This insight constitutes a constant in Susman’s thought; it accounts for the way she views the deeper affinities between Christianity and Judaism despite the fierce antagonism that exists between them, which she at no point denies.

While this intuition resonates with Hermann Cohen’s view concerning the intimate embrace the two historical forces continue to be engaged in, the particular way in which Susman sets religion squarely beside ethics, epistemology, and aesthetics as a fourth and equally irreducible “orientation” of its own anticipates the critical motif that informs Cohen’s Religion Out of the Sources of Judaism (1919).

3. The Lyrical I

Susman’s first monograph, Das Wesen der modernen deutschen Lyrik (The Character of Modern German Poetry, 1910) examines the philosophical significance of modern poetry from Goethe to George and Rilke. Tracking the trajectory of the emergence of modern poetry as a distinct art form with its own artistic logics, Susman’s treatise presents a critical intervention against Wilhelm Dilthey’s conception of poetry as a reflection of the poet’s authentic experience, i.e., Erlebnis as distinguished from Erfahrung, which is a product of discursive reasoning. Taking her cue from Simmel’s approach to art, Susman attends to poetry’s generative power. Poetry generates its own forms artistically rather than deriving them from a pre-existent order of life.

Rather than expressing authentic experience, poetry creates with its distinct forms the conditions to create life forms through which experience becomes possible in the first place. The “lyrical I”, which Susman introduces here, is thus not just a term of literary theory but also has wider philosophical implications.

For Susman, the “lyrical I” is the particular form the poet creates with poetry: “the ‘lyrical I’ [is] a form […] the poet creates from the given I” (1910: 16). It is different from the poet’s empirical I and not to be confused with subjectivity. Distancing herself from the idea that poets express their innermost, authentic selves, Susman highlights the “purely formal character” of the lyrical I that is given its symbolic articulation “completely independently of its individual and general aspects” (1910: 18). According to Susman the lyrical I is the “expression” or “form of an I”. Like the artwork it retains its formal character completely independent from its individual or general content because it is created rather than given. In other words, the poet does not find the lyrical I in her- or himself but, like “the speaking and acting figures of a drama, [the poet] first must create the lyrical I out of what he finds in his given I” (1910: 18).

The lyrical I is the formative principle of poesis. Its constructive rather than mimetic or merely reflective aspect suggests it has epistemological consequences for how we conceive ourselves beyond aesthetics:

Among the forms art produces, the lyrical I is distinguished by being the only form (Gestalt) in an artwork whose contents project the whole scope and extent of the artwork and which alone defines its thrust, its world. (1910: 19)

The lyrical I, in other words projects a world view or particular way to see and experience the world as a whole. It is however not the subjective representation of an “empirical I” but the “objective form of the I” that the poem contrives (1910: 19). The lyrical I is, as it were, the esthetic expression of the individual’s unique and irreducible incommensurability in the act of symbolic representation: “For every individual is incommensurable in relation to every other” (1910: 21). The project of expressing the singularity of the individual, Susman notes, is delivered from the individual’s incommensurability by way of symbolic representation:

For precisely the incommensurable of the individual [des Individuellen], which is the world’s true infinity, is the content of the symbol. (1910: 21f.)

Susman understands the symbol thus as a poetic means of expressing diversity rather than uniform unity. The symbol allows for the expression of the individual’s incommensurability in a language in which the word’s fecundity produces the poetic experience. Poetry is transformative because it uses language abstractly as well as in a concrete manner. This unique combination is for Susman what defines its symbolic use (1910: 23f.). The development of modern poetry consists in this process of symbolizing the modern experience, a process iterated in the articulations of the diversity of lyrical I’s it brings forth. As a result, poetry must be understood as performing a philosophically critical task, a task that Susman describes in terms that can be read as summarizing Simmel’s thought succinctly: “Form presents existence for us. To form means to give the things their existence for us” (1910: 91).

4. Of the Meaning of Love

Vom Sinn der Liebe (Of the Meaning of Love, 1912) marks Susman’s debut as a philosopher. With this monograph, Susman enters a field of inquiry hitherto exclusively reserved to men; she responds to this challenge by making love the central subject of her investigation. Articulating a metaphysical discourse of her own, she highlights lacunae left by a philosophical discourse determined by male sensitivities. In his essay “The Relative and the Absolute in the Problem of the Sexes” (1911), Simmel had, just a year earlier, analyzed the predicament of the discursive silencing of women, going so far as to cast the understanding of women’s concerns as a sheer cognitive impossibility for the male world (Simmel 1911 [2001 and 1984]). A theory and metaphysics of love, he noted two years later, in “The Problem of Fate” (1913), shortly after the publication of Susman’s monograph, was “just as important as the theory of knowledge and the metaphysics of art”. There, Simmel had wondered where except in the one-sided attempts by Plato and Schopenhauer philosophy had in earnest discussed the question of what is love (Simmel 1913 [2001: 483 and 2007: 78]). The dedication of Susman’s book to Simmel’s wife Gertrud further highlights the philosophical affinity with Simmel and his wife. By taking a subject traditionally deemed a women’s issue seriously and attending to it in a philosophically comprehensive manner, Susman took charge of a subject that since Augustine had been relegated to the domain of theology and since Kant had become a matter of moral philosophy. Neither Kierkegaard nor Nietzsche changed much when they continued to theorize love from a purely male-defined perspective.

Susman’s book presents a critical intervention that shows that love is not just a fundamental, formative force in human life but deserves comprehensive theoretical attention. In making love the subject of, and prism for, philosophical exploration, Susman reimagines philosophical discourse as a more inclusive practice of thinking which opens direct lines of inquiry into the exigencies and existential sensibilities of the time. Inspired by the new forms of philosophical investigations initiated by Simmel and Henri Bergson, whose German translation of Introduction to Metaphysics by Susman was published in 1909 by arrangement of Simmel, Susman argues the exploration of the question of the status of women and gender must be metaphysically central to, or constitutive of, a philosophy that wishes to live up to the claim of inclusive universalism.

In Part 1, Susman highlights how love is not only a force that arises from the individual but the power that produces the individual in the first place.

Love arises from life’s great darkness as the longing for form, a longing that forces ever higher forms up to the human individual in which it experiences its victory over death, leading beyond life into eternity. (1912: 20)

Embedded in the dynamics of the forces of life, love is a primordial life force that precedes but also informs the process of individuation. It defies conceptual grasp as its roots reach deeper than the sphere of the mind. While love eludes the firm grasp of the concept, it opens our eyes to the profound alterity of the other. Love and alterity are intimately intertwined and produce aporetic tension: How to reconcile alterity, construed as a condition for love, with the desire for union? Susman describes the paradoxical nature of love this way:

Love is to suffer being Other [Anderssein] and to more profoundly suffer being One [Einssein]—and its eternal demand is to reconcile the being Other with the being One. (1912: 33)

The very union of souls would destroy precisely the individuation that makes each the love object of the other (1912: 45). Love

can never grasp the essence of the Other because their essence cannot be experienced under the category of form. Where there is essence there is form no longer. (1912: 44)

As a result, the You emerges as that which remains out of reach (1912: 51f.). Love can only approximately represent the Other through symbolizations that reflect the Other’s life and actions. The incommensurability of the You, moreover, is what facilitates our individuation. All of this implies that love is not in itself an ultimate answer to anything, but it is the relationship that can either confuse or clarify our relationship with everything. Even the deepest kind of love cannot provide us with the ultimate meaning of our lives, but love is what makes the meaning of our lives legible (1912: 49). Susman’s ideas presciently articulate critical concerns that return in the work of Buber and Levinas. Buber’s I and Thou (1923) offers a strikingly similar description of the deep paradoxical structure of the otherness of self and other while Levinas’s insistence on the unbridgeable difference between myself and a structure of alterity constitutive for human existence shares its metaphysical and phenomenological concerns with Susman.

In Part 2 of the book, Susman plumbs the tragic dimension of love that in modern life assumes a new form. No longer “the pure tragic of an incursion of an absolute into life” that it had been taken to be in the past, the tragedy of love in the modern world consists in the fact that the very force of love for the singular drives object and desire increasingly further apart (1912: 81):

Only in infinity are the parallel ascending flames permitted to touch each other—there where they no longer feel each other. (1912: 82)

While Tristan and Isolde, who together constitute the purest prototype of the past’s conception of love, are a reminder of love’s absolute and all-consuming power, the individuated, modern soul suffers from the metaphysical loneliness that love so painfully inflicts (1912: 83).

Besides this individuating aspect of love, there is love’s sexual aspect (geschlechtliche Bestimmtheit, 1912: 84), which Susman explores in Part 3. An appreciation of the nexus between love and sexuality is fundamental for a deeper understanding of the human condition. The notion of das Geschlechtliche includes, besides sexuality, with its sensual, affective, and animal aspects, all that exists and drives us while remaining below the threshold of consciousness: everything which exceeds the life of the conscious mind and even that which extends to the depths of the conditions of life and its reproductive arrangements:

In the duality of its sexuality (das Geschlecht) the human being, to whom life serves, had to become subject to life. (1912: 87)

Humanity’s attempts at denial and suppression through askesis have only highlighted the fundamental inseparability of Geschlecht and love (1912: 93).

Part 4 examines how the difference of Geschlecht sets the sexes apart in more ways than simply with regard to sexuality. As Susman argues, this difference is rooted in the depths of the “blind life’s” interference with individual life (1912: 105). The law of begetting and birthing structures the lives of men and women in profoundly different ways. Man’s relation to objectivity and tendency to posit values above and beyond himself, Susman suggests, is oriented to the outside, or what stands apart. Man as a creating, constructing being is outside-oriented, while woman returns to herself, taking the world back into herself. Motherhood and her maternal dimension structure how woman relates to the world, defining both genders in ways that complement each other. Susman, herself a young mother who had given birth to her son Erwin in 1907, highlights the limitations of both genders which set them apart from one another. The world according to man, she argues, requires a radical rethinking from woman’s perspective. Unlike romantic accounts of birth-giving and motherhood that celebrate human reproduction as a higher transcendental goal while reinforcing conventional patterns of gender roles, Susman’s does not suggest that woman has a more direct and immediate link to life and reality. She has neither an ontological advantage over man, nor an ontological disadvantage: the difference between men and women is just that: alterity rather than one-sided inadequacy.

Women, then, have no less access to the metaphysical than men, though the kind of access they have is distinct: it is different from and complements, rather than falls short of, the access that men have. Susman suggests that, for better or for worse, both sexes depend on each other in every aspect of their existence. Their relationship is thus based on a reciprocally complementary difference whose divisive force makes the experience of love profoundly different for each. While the act of love might unite them, birth not only forms the new unit of a family but causes differences between woman and man to proliferate.

As Susman notes, rather than an unproblematic dyad of mother and child, the woman finds in pregnancy and birth “the Other, the Alien, Life” (1912: 109). Rather than pure bliss, motherhood is a difficult and conflicted experience: the woman finds her life entangled with another being’s life, but, once she gives birth, this life is no longer hers but one she has to allow to be its own (1912: 110). Susman argues a resolute departure from a Christian-inflected discourse on birthing, motherhood, and family. Her move to demythologize motherhood and expose the strange and challenging experiences that come with it discards the theologically committed register of sacredness and transcendence, replacing it with a metaphysics of life that is pointedly immanent. Her disenchanted approach to motherhood, which operates as a critique of traditional notions of gender roles, resonates with Derrida’s exposure of the assumed wholesomeness and sanctity of the mother-child relation as profoundly problematic (Derrida, Circumfessions).

While man’s life, akin to a Promethean seeker and bringer of light, involves creation and a kind of destruction that respects no form, woman’s life is, in keeping with her nature, embedded in the world of matter and becoming; her destiny forms her as life’s immediate hold on her asserts its power. Man, on the other hand, is, in keeping with his nature, intractable to the processes of life (1912: 115). Contra the intellectuality of past periods that consistently excluded women from producing culture (1912: 122), and in spite of seeming to position women beyond the cultural by aligning them with the world of nature, matter, and becoming, Susman reclaims for women a life of the mind of their own, one that does not submit to and that is not assimilated by the male world. “In a culture built by men but realized and maintained by women” (1912: 125), the destiny of women cannot be to submit “as slave where she is supposed to be helping mother” (1912: 124). For, in a world where women are subject to men, they cannot realize the mission of their particular calling (1912: 128).

It is in art, this part of the book concludes, that love is given the clarity of expression to which life can only aspire. It is art’s power of symbolization that is able to give form to the reconciliation of love and the “dark dynamics of matter to which we are bound”, a reconciliation completed through life itself (1912: 129):

Where religion and philosophy have failed us, where they both have lost grasp of this dark, confused matter as something alien art alone has shown us a fluctuating, quivering image of a possible reconciliation and exaltation. (1912: 136)

It is this image of love that guides us as we look for a way of resolving the profound tension that informs our existence. Through art’s mediation, we can achieve what religion and philosophy cannot: we can

think that man and woman unite in an enhanced life in order to create a culture that can only come into being by both grasping themselves and each other and what can become of both together. (1912: 137)

Achieving this, Susman argues, will involve renegotiating rather than destroying what separates men and women. She articulates this vision of humanity as one in which both women and men become more human; the culture that emerges from this humanity will be “completely doubly gendered (zwiegeschlechtlich)” (1912: 137).

Genuine love, Susman concludes, is only symbolized in the love of an individual which points to the greater human destiny of love as the bond that sustains humanity as a whole; love in this sense of the word requires the full and undiminished participation of women in their irreducible individuality. Susman’s book thus argues that philosophy can no longer afford to exclude women as philosophers from its discourse because women bring to thought what men are not able to address, demonstrating in the process how such inclusion contributes to a genuine advance in philosophy. As feminist discourse becomes established in the wake of World War I, Susman’s approach to the issue of the status of women continues to develop. The issue of the relation between the genders remains one of the two focal points of her critical agenda, the other one being the question of the place of Jewish thought and tradition in modernity.

5. Spinoza and the Jewish Disposition vis-à-vis the World

Her first strictly philosophical essay, as Susman understood it, was dedicated to Spinoza, who, in her view, was modern Judaism’s “only unique personality of truly creative magnitude” as she had noted in “Judaism and Culture” in 1907 (JuK 2). “Spinoza und das jüdische Weltgefühl” (“Spinoza and the Jewish Disposition vis-à-vis the World”, 1913) appeared in the anthology Vom Judentum, edited by the Jewish Student Association Bar Kochba in Prague. Susman was the only contributing woman author.

For Susman, Spinoza represents the “type of the pure metaphysician” (1913: 53) whose philosophical approach reflects the basic disposition of Jewish tradition in metaphysically refined terms. As she reconstructs Spinoza’s central metaphysical argument, she argues that we can only get to the heart of Spinoza’s thought if we recognize the deeper religious disposition vis-à-vis the world (Weltgefühl) that guides his metaphysics (1913: 57). It is precisely this deeper reaching disposition that informs Spinoza’s thought and allows it to move beyond a merely rationalist outlook. In Spinoza, the metaphysical God gives way to the religious God at precisely the point where the nexus of the world extends beyond the human mind. At this point for the first time the world is truly connected to the human being and their action. While the purely logical nexus of the world does not allow for the transition to the living human soul, this transition becomes possible for Spinoza because of the particular way he conceives of immanence as the dynamics of God’s internal force of infinite self-love. This turn of the divine world against itself eventually becomes active affect (1913: 58). This point of the turning of the world against itself, Susman notes, is what we call self-consciousness, which in turn coincides with God’s consciousness. The soul and its form of adequate knowledge rest on God’s self-affection extending to the dynamics of the increasing, active affect that leads to the blissful joy that relates solely to God and his law. This holy joy Spinoza calls the intellectual love of God (1913: 59).

In Spinoza, Susman notes, love is the turning of life onto itself, and as such God’s acting on himself. This emphatic notion of love as metaphysical concept is grounded in an idea Susman attributes to Spinoza: that self-consciousness “is nothing else than the knowledge of the soul in the light of eternity, the knowledge of its essence in God”. As a result, self-consciousness “can only act (wirken) and thus become actual (wirklich) by way of love” (1913: 59). As Susman observes, “one of the two great forms of human love shines out here from Spinoza’s system” (1913: 59). This is the kind of love that does not surrender like that of the mystics but is empowering and self-enhancing (1913: 60). Rather than subjecting the soul to a heteronomous rule, this form of love understands itself to be the only freedom of the soul. In sharp distinction to the notion of freedom in Kant and Fichte, Spinoza’s is like Moses’ legislation in contrast to Prometheus’ deed (1913: 60). Spinoza’s notion of freedom does not mean liberation from the law of the world but rather to grasp in ever more conscious way its sway. The more we understand our actions to be merely expression of the nature of things the freer we are. We are not free to know what we wish but only to grasp the nexus of things by way of thinking. Our free will does not consist in arbitrariness but in grasping through our actions the interconnection of the divine law (1913: 61). Since all processes in nature occur in God, the form of inner consequence (Müssen) replaces the ought (Sollen), i.e., a form of an inner urge, or love, as the human being is oriented towards the idea of things, i.e., is truly human. As Susman notes:

To depend on God’s law is nothing else but being determined by a comprehensive being, by a universal law that is at the same time immanent in me. (1913: 62)

Susman goes on to distinguish two kinds of dispositions vis-à-vis the world, the Jewish and the Indian, including its Greek Dionysian and German mystical variations, in order to situate Spinoza more pointedly in the Jewish tradition. While Jewish thought, she argues, subordinates everything to the idea, Indo-Germanic thought subordinates everything to the I. Both world views have the question of redemption as their point of departure and both emerge from a religious foundation. The one crystalizes early on into a sharp dualism, the other into the first great philosophy of identity. While the Indian disposition elevates the self and its quest for freedom to the center of its striving, the Jewish, with God at its center, privileges law, obligation, and faith as its fundamental values. For Susman, however, law is mediated by love bound to a you.

For all love arises originally from the dualist disposition vis-à-vis the world. The thought of mediation is humanity’s proper thought of love. (1913: 67)

Its redemptive force, as Susman notes, generates the Messianic idea (1913: 67). With this excursus, Susman returns to Spinoza, whose system of identity appears to exclude this kind of love. Nonetheless, she argues, Spinoza is as different from the Indian disposition as it is from Judaism. His notion of self-preservation is the very opposite of self-interest; instead, it is “recognition of one’s own essence in and through God” (1913: 69). This form of self-preservation is only realized by love of God: “For I am not seeking myself in [this love of God] but God’s law in myself” (1913: 69). The identity of the world is thus produced by love as the mediating force between the human being and God, the dynamic moment of divine infinity that creates the true connection between I and God (1913: 69f.).

Susman’s essay is a pointed intervention in the lasting controversy around the place of Spinoza in the history of philosophy as well as in Judaism and suggestively argues for his thought’s enduring significance in highlighting the constitutive role love plays in his system. Offering a provocative way of distinguishing two opposed metaphysical dispositions, Susman challenges the dominant narrative that yokes Western philosophy to a Greco-Christian legacy. She highlights the specifically Jewish moment that informs an alternative tradition of metaphysical thinking and argues for an inner tension that pits two different religious worldviews against each other, a tension she will go on to present in her work as a tension constitutive of the modern world.

6. Homelessness, Exile, Hope, and Redemption

Susman’s insistence on the underlying role of religion for understanding metaphysics and the task of philosophical inquiry as well as modern life more generally remains constant. Her analysis of the modern condition recognizes the philosophical necessity of understanding the religious dimension of the experience of modernity. Informed by a post-secular sensibility, Susman views the religious dimension as determinative of the grounds from which metaphysics arises. For Susman, philosophy must therefore include the practice of addressing the significance of its own theological-political commitments.

For Susman, homelessness, alienation, exile, hope, and redemption are more than terms that help us articulate the loss, failures, and the aspirations that inform the modern experience. They also demonstrate that we can only grasp the predicament of modern existence if we are willing to scrutinize it by sourcing the critical potential that the biblical tradition offers. Like Hermann Cohen, Buber, and Rosenzweig, who likewise have recourse to the “sources of Judaism” (Cohen 1919) in order to examine the predicament of modern existence, Susman finds in the Jewish tradition a vital resource.

The primordial condition in which humans find themselves is characterized by homelessness and suffering. Facing the infinitude of the world as the finite beings that we are, we experience the world as over against us and strange. The certainty of our future death reminds us that we are something other than the world:

And in this being other [Anderssein] we at the same time grasp our deepest particularity [unser tiefstes Eigenes]. What we humans actually are we are by way of our homelessness in the world: through our death and through the knowledge of our impending death. Human life is per se existence in an alien world and as such suffering. (“Das Judentum als Weltreligion” [“Judaism: A World Religion”], 1932 [GF 105] [RPE 74])

The need to face this condition “shared by all humans of all times and places” is what gives rise to religion in general (ibid.).

Ten years later, in the middle of WWII and facing the ravaging effects of the Shoa, Susman notes that the Jewish plight only reflects in the extreme what has become the universal human condition as that of homelessness of the human being on earth, a life in exile; Jewish existence intensifies this condition into an “exile in exile”, scattered among all other nations, “the only people without a land, state, and power” (“Ezechiel der Prophet der Umkehr”, [“Ezekiel: The Prophet of Return”] 1942, DBG 73f. [RPE 109 f.]). The diasporic existence of the Jewish people has become a reminder that the modern human condition has become quintessentially diasporic. As Susman observes in “Das Hiob-Problem bei Franz Kafka” (“The Question of Job in Franz Kafka”, 1929: 45 [RPE 67]): “We are absolutely and entirely in exile”. Not only does the Jewish people lack its own country, state, and political power, but its mode of existence suggests the obsolescence of conventional political wisdom, a vision that aligns with Landauer’s and also has recourse to the prophetic tradition. The stubborn and categorical resistance to instrumental reasoning lodged in this thought suggests that philosophy that turns a deaf ear to creaturely laments and human suffering does not live up to its claims of universal truth. Philosophical thinking that is attuned to suffering is, to Susman’s mind, on the other hand, receptive enough to address the existential need for hope and redemption. Rather than authorizing some cordoned-off philosophy of religion to cater to this need, though, Susman alters philosophy’s approach so that hope can be recognized from within philosophy as a legitimate category crucial for the emancipatory task of thought. But it is the recourse to prophecy, Susman maintains, that has first created the notion of world history in the proper sense as its vision attends to the undying dream of the human heart to illuminate the whole of human history (“Die Friedensbotschaft der Propheten”, [DBG 134]). As Susman argues, the promise of the prophets lies ahead of us:

We have no need of new prophets […] Every word of the prophets of old Israel goes straight to the truth of our time as if it had been spoken just now. (“Die messianische Idee als Friedensidee” [“The Messianic Idea as the Idea of Peace”] 1929 [GF 61])

The messianic idea of world peace, this great vision of the prophets, hints at the way religious thought informs the very core of modernity’s aspirations without rendering that core a mere theological affair. The messianic vision of a united and peaceful humanity situated in a pure futurity at the end of time may seem unreasonable and ungrounded, but that is Susman’s point: “The messianic hope is hope without a foundation” (“Die Messianische Idee als Friedensidee”, GF 59). Susman suggests that, rather than being exclusively reason-based, the Messianic idea of peace presents a genuinely universal form of thinking because it takes its cue from a paradoxical structure that envisions the universal as reflecting its own particularity in a way that mirrors the paradox of human existence on Earth (GF 60): “the overpowering law of God and the ultimate depths of the human heart are nothing that is separated” (“Judentum als Weltreligion”, GF 121 [RPE 87]). While resonating with a Kierkegaardian sense of paradox, Susman is here signaling closer affiliation with the Jewish strand of dialogical thinking of Buber and Rosenzweig. When universal thinking launches off from this starting point, the impossible can become its liberating force. Working in a different register, Susman conveys this thought of the impossible in the following way:

For it is part of the human beings that they are unable to stand on themselves, that they cannot be their own ground to stand on; they cannot determine their own above or below entirely according to themselves. Only in the stars above do they recognize the grounds under their feet, do they measure their above and below. (“Wandlungen der Frau”, 1933 [hereafter WF] [GK 174])

7. The Emancipation of Women and the Question of Gender Relations

While Susman’s approach to gender and the status of women in modern culture and society had initially been framed in Of the Meaning of Love (1912), which was discussed in section 3, above, her thinking on these subjects developed during WWI, the Weimar Republic, and afterwards, in their wake, as the debate on gender and women underwent radical changes. Starting with “Die Revolution und die Frau” (1918 [NFF 117–128]), a number of essays reflect her increasing attention to the political dimension of these concerns, whose particular cultural implications she further explores in Frauen der Romantik (Women of the Romantic Period, 1929) and Deutung einer grossen Liebe: Goethe und Charlotte von Stein (Interpretation of a Great Love: Goethe and Charlotte von Stein, 1951).

Susman mounts her critique of the muting of the female voice on an analysis of the image of domesticated woman that male culture has created and reinforced over the centuries. First formulated in Of the Meaning of Love, Susman’s analysis of the symbolical representation of women as a form of domination is now brought into sharper focus as a “struggle about language and image” (“Frauenproblem”, 1926: 432). For Susman, the decisive response to the crisis of the time consists in women taking back and owning their own image: “The tough struggle between man’s image of the woman and of woman herself” is “the whole problem of woman” (1926: 433). This work, which, according to Susman, will ultimately determine the success of women’s movement, involves the renegotiation of the symbolic representation of the role and place of women in culture and society.

Frauen der Romantik examines the lives of five German women, tracking the untold story of the women’s perspective of a literary movement that claimed to be all about love but cast women as ultimately uncreative but fortunate beneficiaries of male fantasy. A perceptive critique of Romanticism’s necrophiliac tendencies, whose renewal Susman witnessed under the banner of the rise of reactionary forces in Weimar Germany, the study also examined the undercurrents of religious difference under whose sign the prominent Jewish Romantics Dorothea von Schlegel (Moses Mendelssohn’s oldest daughter) and Rahel Varnhagen sought to find their own way, albeit in an often palpably restricted fashion. Similarly, Deutung einer grossen Liebe seeks to present a great albeit often conflicted dialogue between Goethe and the woman who became his guiding star, a relationship that was profoundly affected by the way the feminine gender role determined the lives of the even most creative and independent minds.

Susman views the rising up of women in the context of two other revolutions: the proletarian and the sexual revolution:

[T]his is the third revolution of our world: the woman who enters as independent human being with her own problems and own reality the hitherto exclusively male world. (“Mächte im Weltgeschehen”, hereafter MW, 654; see also “Auflösung und Werden in unserer Zeit” [Dissolution and Becoming in Our Age], 1928, hereafter AW, 342 and 348)

In order to comprehend the full ramifications of women’s revolution, Susman points out, we need to understand it as part of the profound sea change that these three revolutions bring about together.

Susman sees this liberation as something of a Pyrrhic victory, one that comes at the cost of the radical, destabilizing loss of all traditionally-valued certainties (AW 347). She casts the situation dryly:

When finally almost overnight the doors opened to the desired world this took place in the most tremendous collapse. It turned out: man had no world at all to offer to woman; all his orders and laws had disintegrated. (WF 1933 [GK 161])

It is not just that marriage and motherhood along with traditional ideas of femininity had been dissolved, but that the question “where is the world that a mother can offer her child?” no longer had an answer (GK 165). As women experience cataclysmic developments of these kinds more profoundly and more existentially than men, it is up to women to be leaders during these processes of cultural transition (GK 174). The task, as Susman understands it, is not for women to cease being women, but, on the contrary, to take back and appropriate “male existence in order to achieve full female humanity” (GK 175). Woman, then, “must not only recognize, understand, and love man—she must in order to grasp his life really become man” (GK 175). In other words, woman, according to Susman, has to fully own the world even though—and because—it has been defined by man and has excluded her for millennia. Only a full and radical appropriation of maleness, she suggests, will render the transformation of woman into a new, self-determined female possible, and this transformation has already begun (GK 176). As she notes elsewhere:

In the mind of the most modest and uneducated ordinary workingwoman still lives today a greater and deeper dream of life than in the most significant man of our world completely dedicated to matter of facts and work. (MW 654)

World War 1 and the social and political revolutions that followed brought about a fundamental change in inter-human relationships: “the old forms of love are dead” (WF 1933 [GK 173]). The time-honored conventions of binding the “world powers” love and sex into culturally stable forms through the mediating power of Eros have become obsolete and there are no non-anachronistic conceptions of woman and gender relations to turn to. The contemporary woman has become metaphysically homeless (WF 1933 [GK 163], “Das Frauenproblem in der gegenwärtigen Welt”, 146 and 151 and MW). For Susman, this is the most formidable challenge: women are forced to imagine themselves anew in a world marked by radical change. In this time of transition, they must create themselves by reimagining love and sex through an engagement with Eros of an unprecedented form (WF 1933 [GK 173]; “Das Frauenproblem”, and MW). In 1933, on the eve of the demise of the Weimar Republic, Susman writes that the women’s movement no longer exists in its original form, having transformed into the common project shared by women and men alike to bring about a human renewal. In a changed world this no longer means submission to the design of a male vision: “Men design the ways; women walk them. It is her way to walk the way herself” (WF 1933 [GK 177]).

8. Interpretative Studies: Gestalten und Kreise

In 1954, Susman published a collection of essays she had written in the period from 1921 to 1953. The anthology, titled Gestalten und Kreise (Figures and Circles), features interpretative studies on Jewish authors such as Moses Mendelssohn, Freud, Bergson, Franz Rosenzweig, Franz Kafka, and Karl Wolfskehl. The volume also included studies on other authors, such as Goethe and Nietzsche, as well as essays on Chassidism, Women’s Emancipation, and Anarchism. The essays exemplify Susman’s approach to doing philosophy, or her way of working, philosophically, by means of exploring the paradigmatic significance of historical constellations. Her method is a kind of deep reading focusing on how authors and their texts negotiate the challenges of the historical moment in which they live and write, and which they have come to exemplify. The book as a whole, Susman notes in her preface, is “an attempt to offer with the demise of an old world an entry point to a new one” (GK 5).

Unlike Dilthey—Simmel’s “antipode” (Ich habe viele Leben gelebt, 1964: 65)—Susman stays close to Simmel in interpreting individuals and intellectual movements in their historical context. While Susman feels historical configurations deserve our utmost appreciation, she does not take them to exude the kind of normative validity that Dilthey’s approach suggests they do. For her, “the act of understanding is itself temporal, historical”; the

unity it creates is nothing more than the life of an ephemeral moment. And yet, all our truth and the entire relationship of our time to our eternity rests on this moment. (AW 352)

Informed by an approach to death that resonates with Rosenzweig’s Star of Redemption, Simmel’s Lebensanschauung (Views of Life 1918), and Heidegger’s Being and Time (whose approach considering death initially takes its cue from Simmel), Susman views human mortality as that which informs human sense-making, which, as a project, is defined by its own temporality (AW 352 and 336–38). Her approach dovetails here with Rosenzweig, whose thought limns death as the marker of the finitude that enables human existence’s forward-looking viewpoint “into life” (Ins Leben, the concluding two words of Rosenzweig’s Star of Redemption). This forward-looking perspective oriented towards life that takes death as life’s point of departure rather than its end allows for an understanding of temporality and meaning pointedly opposed to the orientation towards death guiding Heidegger (“Franz Rosenzweig”, 1930 [GK 297–98]).

Susman first highlighted the significance and innovative impetus of Rosenzweig’s Star of Redemption in a review essay entitled “Der Exodus aus der Philosophie” (“The Exodus from Philosophy”) that appeared only months after the book’s publication. A month later, in a review of the book published in Der Jude (1922), she offered a more detailed discussion, which led to Rosenzweig’s enthusiastic response (quoted above in Section 1). Nine years later, in the wake of Rosenzweig’s death, Susman gave the first comprehensive account of Rosenzweig’s intellectual legacy (“Franz Rosenzweig”, 1930). Over two decades later, in Gestalten und Kreise, she revisited Rosenzweig’s life and thought as one of the great testimonies of Jewish history (GK 311). For Susman, Rosenzweig’s magnum opus is an avowal or profession (Bekenntnis, GK 296); it is more than mere knowledge (Erkenntnis). For Rosenzweig, the question of philosophy is no longer “what is?” but is instead that of the “whole, living and dying human” whose concern is: “Where is a truth that can redeem me?” (GK 298). The consternation this book produced was based, Susman observed, on the radical turn in thinking caused by the thinker’s return or teshuva (Umkehr, GK 302). It is the particular and creative combination of Jewish and German thought that gives rise to a new thinking that reimagines the project of philosophy at the interface of faith and knowledge as a task committed to attending to the existential exigencies of life.

“Moses Mendelssohn and His Decision” first appeared in 1932; it appeared in revised form in 1946. Both dates indicate historical watersheds bookending the beginning and end of Nazi persecution and the demise of Jewish life in central Europe, along with the end of the prolific period of German Jewish culture that had begun with Mendelssohn,

the beginning of the famous salons of the Romantic period—and hence the beginning of German intellectual sociability in general. (GK 269)

More than his writing, Susman suggests, Mendelssohn’s life exemplified the decision to embrace German culture and the project of Enlightenment in whose creation he played a crucial role. By embracing modernity while solidly grounded in the Jewish tradition (whose first modern representative he would become), he courageously set out to justify his commitment to both as a choice. Mendelssohn’s decision to live as a modern individual who celebrates Judaism by choice answered Lavater’s challenge to explain how he could remain Jewish and at the same time be a modern citizen of the world. Mendelssohn’s decision, however, put the burden on the individual to justify adherence to Judaism in terms of an individual choice rather than by belonging to the communal reality of a people. In the wake of the Shoah, Mendelssohn may thus only appear as a figure of a world that has come to its tragic end. However, Susman argues, Mendelssohn’s choice is a vision that points beyond what, in the middle of the twentieth century, could only be seen as a cataclysmic end. Challenging hindsight analyses that cast Mendelssohn’s trajectory as opportunistically reformist at best and a calamitous betrayal of Jewish tradition at worst, Susman instead highlights how Mendelssohn’s predicament ultimately represents and adumbrates the challenges each Jew continues to face today.

Gestalten und Kreise concludes with a lightly edited version of “Das Hiob-Problem bei Franz Kafka” (“The Problem of Job in Franz Kafka”, 1929), the first Kafka interpretation attending to the role of Jewish tradition in his writing.

This is in what consists the so strange, so profoundly religiously harrowing of Kafka’s world removed from God: this world is not seen from the perspective of the world, from life, it is seen from the perspective of God, the law, measured and judged according to it. […] The presentation of his God-forsaken world, immersed into nothing in its whole painful and sinister truth is ultimately nothing else but the presentation of his messianic longing. (GK 364; translated RPE 69)

Benjamin and Scholem’s Kafka interpretations follow Susman’s discussion in often quasi-verbatim ways. The concluding aphorism of Adorno’s Minima Moralia (1951, itself modelled on Adorno’s reading of Kafka) bears a striking resemblance to the epistemologically critical gesture that informs Susman’s Kafka interpretation.

While universal in outlook and range, Gestalten und Kreise carries a distinctly Jewish note that underscores the interconnectedness of philosophical and Jewish themes in Susman’s approach.

Embracing interpretation as sense-making, Susman practices an explicitly receptive, dialogical form of doing philosophy and writing; her writing, for instance, negotiates the relationship between the universal and particular through its performative dimensions as it proceeds. Making this receptivity a generative feature of her writing and thinking, Gestalten und Kreise exemplifies this particular mode of Susman’s writing, which might well be considered Susman’s particular form of écriture féminine.

9. The Book of Job and the Destiny of the Jewish People

Susman’s response to the murder of millions of Jews and the annihilation of German and most of European Jewry belongs to the earliest attempts to comprehend the abyss of the catastrophe often, at least since the 1980s, referred to as the Holocaust or Shoah. The Book of Job and the Destiny of the Jewish People, published first in 1946 and in a second edition in 1948, with a preface addressing the foundation of the State of Israel, is a meditation on the disastrous attempt at the extermination of the Jewish people. This catastrophic event posed a radical challenge to the question of how to respond to the project of philosophy. Along with the responses of Horkheimer, Adorno, Buber (whose Eclipse of God, published 1952 is a reply, as it were, to, Horkheimer’s Eclipse of Reason, published in 1947 and both intially given as lectures at Columbia University), Levinas, and Sartre, Susman’s intervention marks a decisive turn in rethinking philosophy. As Susman notes in the concluding pages of her book, the problem of the Shoah is not just a concern for the Jews but is deeply connected to the problem of humanity:

From the viewpoint of man, there is no solution to the Jewish problem just as there is no solution to the human problem; the Jewish problem is inseparably linked to the human problem, it is the problem of being human itself as it is posed in its ultimate depth. (1946 [1948: 216])

Working through the “Jewish problem” was not merely the responsibility of the theologians, Susman’s recourse to the Book of Job suggests, but was equally the task of philosophy, whose soundness could only be proven by the way it lived up to the task of facing its most radical challenge. Though Susman’s reading of the historical situation humanity faced in the wake of Auschwitz has recourse to the biblical Book of Job, the study is in fact a metaphysical meditation. While it is true that Susman does not shy away from the discourse of religion, the book’s argument remains staunchly non-theological. Susman actually follows the biblical text in its resolute criticism of all theological discourse. In her essay on Kafka from 1929, Susman had already treated Job’s as the paradigmatic experience for exploring the Jewish dimension of Kafka’s world. In this essay, she noted that

Judaism’s entire destiny of suffering in exile is prefigured in the destiny of Job who God has surrendered in his suffering to the Tempter. (“The Problem of Job in Kafka” 35; GK 352; RPE 58)

Carefully navigating the exigencies of theology and philosophy, Susman relies on the genre of the ancient wisdom literature instantiated by the Book of Job to set her argument, an argument that grounds reason in the task of addressing the experience of suffering and loss of meaning, making the realization of this task the linchpin of thought’s veracity. The distinction between philosophy and Jewish philosophy (with its attendant subordination of “Jewish Philosophy”, or articulation of the latter as a derivative subdiscipline with no epistemological standing) is thus rejected as the book’s act of mourning the six million innocent victims of the Shoah brings the metaphysical tensions such a distinction obscures into the open. Operating between modern philosophy’s turning a blind eye on the question of God and theology’s no less problematic appropriation of the name of God, Susman follows the Book of Job in its fundamental redefinition of the hermeneutic situation through a reversal of Job’s perspective. Job’s relentless questioning of God does not lead to an answer; it eventually leads, instead, to a change on the part of our understanding of God, who, assuming, in the eyes of Job, the role of querier, comes to pose the questions Job is unable to answer. God reveals himself only by turning the hermeneutic situation around and into a dialogical situation that thwarts discursive certainty and shows itself to be irreducible to the language which deploys philosophical or theological concepts. That is, God is revealed in a dialogical experience whose truth is realized in the moment of the human recognition of the limit of understanding. Meaning itself is the result of this dialogical relationship, which suggests our response to the latter is the ultimate task of human existence.

If it is no longer possible to define God, then this is true for Jewish people and non-Jewish people alike. The closure of this possibility corresponds, for Susman, to a closure of the possibility of defining humanity itself:

[W]e have lost not just the image of the Jewish human being but also the image of the human being in general; the name human being is today no less legible than the name of God. (1946 [1948: 151])

These losses and the unspeakable atrocities experienced during the Shoah are entwined, and only an “unlimited, indelible mourning”, Susman tells us, can be the answer to what happened in the ovens of the concentration camps (1946 [1948: 208]). Susman was, in fact, one of the earliest thinkers to formulate the injunction to never forget the atrocities committed by the German people. This injunction to reset philosophy anew is later repeated by Adorno and Fackenheim. Susman formulates it the following way:

Nothing of all that has been experienced by Jewish people on German territory, from German hands, or guided by them must be forgotten; this is the stern legacy of the victims to the survivors. (1946 [1948: 208])

Rather than yielding a fixation on the past that would lead only to a form of victimization, Job’s experience points the way to a transformative turn, a change in comprehension ultimately irreducible to religiosity. At the bottom of this change of mind is a new reliance on one’s own understanding of reason, the result of the dialogical encounter with the unfathomable from which hope arises as a messianic promise. It can arise precisely because messianic hope is not bound to the past; it is dependent, instead, on the way we work through it. Job is not given any explanation for his suffering by God; it remains inexplicable, but he learns to recognize that the unfathomable only determines him through how he responds to it. He acknowledges that

his part is not to grasp and understand [das Begreifen] but to live out of the unfathomable [aus dem Unbegreiflichen]. (1946 [1948: 178])

The challenge of the survivors of the Shoah is thus not only never to forget but to create new life in the face of this past. The messianic is not a speculative end of history but the vantage point here and now that opens history up at any given point if we are prepared to reject the conceptual blinkers of theological and teleological thinking. This is what gives the messianic its empowering force. The argument here has a remarkable affinity with ideas articulated in Walter Benjamin’s “On the Concept of History”, a text which, though written in 1939/1940, reached its first readers initially hectographed in 1942 in a limited edition, and did not appear until 1950 in print in German.

10. Legacy

One of the first women distinguished as a philosopher and public intellectual in Wilhelmine and Weimar Germany as well as in Switzerland (her home in early adolescence and her home again after 1933) and a prominent exponent of German Jewish intellectual life during the time of the Jewish Renaissance, Susman played an important role in the literary circles of Stefan George and Karl Wolfskehl. She was also a close associate of Georg Simmel and facilitated his reception after 1945 with her collaboration on the first edition of a collection of his selected essays, titled Brücke und Tür, and her monograph Die geistige Gestalt Georg Simmels (Georg Simmel’s Intellectual Contour). A distinct voice among philosophers and intellectuals during the Wilhelmine and Weimar periods, Susman became a symbol of the endurance of the legacy of German Jewish thought after 1945. Her thought both anticipated and left a formative imprint on the writings of Buber, Bloch, Benjamin, Scholem, Adorno, Jacob Taubes, Hermann Levin Goldschmidt, and others.


Susman’s Works

Citations to Susman’s works given above reference the German editions and also, where possible, the English editions. But the translations provided are by the author of this entry.

  • [JuK] 1907, “Judentum und Kultur” (Judaism and Culture), Frankfurter Zeitung, 16 May 1907, 1–2.
  • 1910, Das Wesen der modernen deutschen Lyrik (The Character of Modern German Poetry), Stuttgart: Strecker and Schröder.
  • 1912, Vom Sinn der Liebe (Of the Meaning of Love), Jena: Diederichs.
  • 1913, “Spinoza und das jüdische Weltgefühl” (Spinoza and the Jewish Disposition vis-à-vis the World), in Vom Judentum: Ein Sammelbuch, Verein jüdischer Hochschüler Bar Kochba in Prag, Leipzig: Kurt Wolff, 51–70.
  • 1918 [1992], “Die Revolution und die Frau” (The Revolution and Women), Das Flugblatt 4, Norbert Einstein (ed.). Reprinted in NFF 117–128.
  • 1921, “Der Exodus aus der Philosophie” (The Exodus from Philosophy), Frankfurter Zeitung, 17 June 1921.
  • 1922, “Der Stern der Erlösung”, Der Jude, 4: 259–264. Review of Rosenzweig 1921.
  • 1926, “Das Frauenproblem in der gegenwärtigen Welt” (The Question of the Woman in the World Today), Der Morgen: Monatschrift der Juden in Deutschland, 2(5): 431–452.
  • [AW] 1928, “Auflösung und Werden in unserer Zeit” (Dissolution and Becoming in Our Age), Der Morgen: Monatschrift der Juden in Deutschland, 4(4): 335–353.
  • 1929 [1930], Frauen der Romantik (Women of the Romantic Period), Jena: Diederichs. Second edition revised 1930.
  • 1929, “Das Hiob Problem bei Franz Kafka” (The Problem of Job in Kafka), Der Morgen, 5(1): 31–49. Revised and reprinted in GK 348–366. Translated as “The Question of Job in Franz Kafka” in RPE 53–71.
  • 1929, “Die messianische Idee als Friedensidee” (The Messianic Idea as the Idea of Peace), Der Morgen, 4: 375–385. Reprinted GF 56–67.
  • 1930, “Franz Rosenzweig”, Der Morgen: Monatschrift der Juden in Deutschland, 5(6): 541–561. Reprinted in GK 287–311.
  • 1932, “Das Judentum als Weltreligion” (Judaism: A World Religion), Mitteilungsblatt der jüdischen Reformgemeinde Berlin, 1 July 1932. Reprinted GF 105–121. Translated as “Judaism: A World Religion” in RPE 73–87.
  • 1932 [1946], “Moses Mendelssohn und seine Entscheidung” (Moses Mendelssohn and his Decision), Blätter des jüdischen Frauenbundes für Fraenarbeit und Frauenbewegung, 8(3/4). Revised and reprinted 1946 in Neue Wege, 40: 339–364. Reprinted in GK 259–286.
  • [WF] 1933, “Wandlungen der Frau” (Transformations of the Woman), Die neue Rundschau, 44: 105–124. Reprinted GK: 160–177.
  • 1935a, “Stifters Abdias”, Der Morgen, 11(1): 27–37. Reprinted as a “Nachwort” (postface) in an edition of Abdias : Erzählung, by Adalbert Stifter, (Bücherei des Schocken Verlags 31), Berlin: Schocken Verlag, 1935.
  • 1935b, “Vom geistigen Anteil der Juden im deutschen Raum” (On the Intellectual Contribution of Jews in the German Region), Der Morgen, 11(3): 107–116.
  • 1942, “Ezechiel der Prophet der Umkehr”, 36(5): 8–23. Reprinted in DBG 55–87. Translated as “Ezekiel: The Prophet of Return” in RPE 99–116.
  • 1946 [1948], Das Buch Hiob und das Schicksal des jüdischen Volkes (The Book of Job and the Destiny of the Jewish People), Zurich: Steinberg. Second edition 1948.
  • 1951, Deutung einer grossen Liebe: Goethe und Charlotte von Stein (Interpretation of a Great Love: Goethe and Charlotte von Stein), Zürich/Stuttgart : Artemis.
  • [GK] 1954, Gestalten und Kreise (Figures and Circles), Zurich: Diana.
  • 1954, “Die Friedensbotschaft der Propheten” (The Prophets’ “Message of Peace”), Festschrift zum 50 jährigen Bestehen, Schweizerischer Israelitischer Gemeindebund (ed.), Zurich: Schweizerischer Israelitischer Gemeindebund), 265–272. Reprinted in DBG 132–144.
  • [DBG] 1955, Deutung biblischer Gestalten (Interpretation of Biblical Figures), Zurich: Diana.
  • 1959, Die geistige Gestalt Georg Simmels (Georg Simmel’s Intellectual Contour), Tübingen: Mohr (Siebeck).
  • 1964, Ich habe viele Leben gelebt: Erinnerungen (I have lived many lives), Stuttgart: Deutsche Verlagsanstalt.
  • [GF] 1965, Vom Geheimnis der Freiheit: Gesammelte Aufsätze 1914–1964, Manfred Schlösser (ed.), Darmstadt and Zurich: Agora.
  • [NFF] 1992, “Das Nah- und Fernsein des Fremden”: Essays und Briefe, Ingeborg Nordmann (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Jüdischer Verlag.
  • [MW] 2015, “Mächte im Weltgeschehen”, Elisa Klapheck (ed.), Sinn und Form, 5: 640–657.
  • [RPE] 2021, Margarete Susman—Religious-Political Essays on Judaism, Laura Radosh (trans.), Elisa Klapheck (ed.), New York: Palgrave. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-89474-0

Edited volumes

  • Kircher, Erwin, 1906, Philosophie der Romantik, Margarete Susman and Heinrich Simon (eds), Jena: Diederichs.
  • Simmel, Georg, 1957, Brücke und Tür: Essays des Philosophen zur Geschichte, Religion, Kunst und Gesellschaft, Margarate Susman and Michael Landmann (eds), Stuttgart: Koehler.


  • Bergson, Henri, 1909, “Einführung in die Metaphysik”, Margarete Susman (trans.), Jena: Diederichs. Translation of “Introduction à la Métaphysique”, Revue de métaphysique et de morale, 1903, 11(1): 1–36.

Other Works Cited

  • Adorno, Theodor W., 1951, Minima moralia: Reflexionen aus dem beschädigten Leben, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • Baeck, Leo, 1905, Das Wesen des Judentums (The Essence of Judaism), Berlin: Nathansen & Lamm.
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Secondary Sources

  • Almog, Yael, 2019, “Jewish Diaspora and the Stakes of Nationalism: Margarete Susman’s Theodicy”, Religions, 10(2): article 103. doi:10.3390/rel10020103
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  • Goetschel, Willi, 2013, “Jewish Thought in the Wake of Auschwitz: Margarete Susman’s The Book of Job and the Destiny of the Jewish People”, in his The Discipline of Philosophy and the Invention of Modern Jewish Thought, New York: Fordham, 97–113 (ch. 6).
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  • –––, 2014, “‘A Few Human Beings Walking Hand in Hand’: Margarete Susman, Leonhard Ragaz, and the Origins of the Jewish-Christian Dialogue in Zurich”, The Leo Baeck Institute Yearbook, 59: 141–162. doi:10.1093/leobaeck/ybu003
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