Notes to Epistemological Problems of Testimony

1. See the entry on feminist social epistemology for an extended discussion of this debate.

2. The status of moral testimony, or testimony with moral content, has gained considerable attention in the recent literature. Authors working in this area tend to fall into one of two camps: Pessimists and Optimists. On the one hand, Pessimists argue that there is something problematic about relying on the say-so of others when it comes to moral issues, e.g., it is impossible to acquire moral knowledge via testimony, there something rationally unacceptable about relying on moral testimony, etc. On the other hand, Optimists argue that insofar as non-moral testimony is unproblematic, moral testimony is unproblematic too. See K. Jones (1999), Driver (2006), Nickel (2001), Cholbi (2007), Hopkins (2007), McGrath (2009, 2011), Hills (2009, 2013), Markovits (2012), Sliwa (2012), Crisp (2014), Enoch (2014), Groll and Decker (2014), Howell (2014), Wiland (2017), and McShane (2018a, 2018b, forthcoming) for more on the different versions of Pessimism and Optimism about moral testimony, as well as related issues pertaining to moral expertise and morally worthy action.

3. Much like the issues surrounding moral testimony, there is a related debate about aesthetic testimony, or testimony about aesthetic propositions. Authors working in this area also tend to fall into one of two camps: Pessimists and Optimists. Pessimists about aesthetic testimony argue that there is something problematic about relying on the say-so of others, e.g., it is impossible to acquire knowledge via aesthetic testimony, it is inappropriate to rely on aesthetic testimony, etc. Optimists about aesthetic testimony deny that this is the case. See, e.g., Tormey (1973), Scruton, (1976), Wollheim (1980), Mothersill (1994), Hopkins (2000, 2011), Sibley (1974 [2001]), Livingston (2003), Budd (2003), Meskin (2004), Levinson (2005), Alan Goldman (2006), Laetz (2008), Robson (2012, 2015), and McKinnon (2017), for more on the different versions of Pessimism and Optimism.

4. There are two types of defeaters that are relevant here. First, there are psychological defeaters, which are beliefs or doubts that function in virtue of being attitudes that the hearer actually has, e.g., if you believe that your friend is an unreliable testifier, or if you doubt that they are speaking reliably on this occasion, then you possess a psychological defeater such that you are not justified in believing what your friend says. Second, there are normative defeaters, which are beliefs or doubts that function in virtue of being attitudes that, rationally speaking, the hearer ought to have, e.g., regardless of what you actually think, if you have loads of evidence such that you ought to believe that your friend is an unreliable testifier, or if you have good reason to doubt whether your friend is telling the truth on this occasion, then you possess a normative defeater such that you are not justified in believing what your friend tells you. See Lackey (2008) for an extended discussion of the role that defeaters play in the context of testimonial justification.

5. For the purpose of this article I will use “Justified” and “Warranted” interchangeably. But see, e.g., Burge (1993) for a view that draws an important distinction between the two.

6. There are two things worth mentioning here. First, some proponents of the Transmission View argue that TV-N should be replaced with

TV-N*: For every testimonial chain, A1…, An, speaker An, and hearer B, B knows that p on the basis of An’s testimony only if the first speaker in the chain, A1, knows that p in some non-testimonial way. (See Dummett (1994), Faulkner (2000), E. Fricker (2006a, 2006b), and Burge (2013) for this view).

TV-N* avoids the problem posed by the creationist teacher case discussed above, since even if Stella does not know that p, presumably the evolutionary biologists who wrote the books that Stella read do. However, Lackey (1999, 2008), Graham (2006b) and Carter and Nickel (2014) offer objections to TV-N* on the grounds that there are cases in which a hearer can acquire testimonial knowledge that p even if the first person in the testimonial chain lacks the knowledge in question.

Second, all of these school teacher cases involve a speaker who is being insincere, i.e., they are saying something that they either don’t believe, or else lack justification for believing. For a recent discussion of the important role that sincerity plays in the Transmission View, see Wright (2019).

7. The Inheritance View is sometimes called the “Transmission View”. I am sticking with the former to distinguish this account from related positions about the extent to which testimony transmits, as opposed to generates, knowledge and justification.

8. Burge distinguishes between “entitlements” and “justifications”, where the distinction roughly tracks externalist and internalist notions of justifications respectively. I will use “entitlement” and “justification” synonymously since, for the purpose of the debates discussed here, nothing substantive hangs on this.

9. Wright (2019) defends a qualified Inheritance View according to which a hearer’s belief that p can be, but is not always, justified by whatever evidence that is justifying the speaker’s belief that p. More on this view in Section 3.3.

10. See Burge (1993, 1997) for more on testimony and a priori knowledge, and see Christensen and Kornblith (1997) and Malmgren (2006) for some worries with Burge’s view.

11. These are not the only two worries with the Inheritance View. For instance, some have argued that this view should be rejected on the grounds that it is incompatible with highly intuitive claims about how practical stakes can impact which actions are rational for one to perform, e.g., MacFarlane (2005), Lackey (2008) and Peet and Pitcovski (2017). And Barnett (2015) argues that the spirit of the “Two Sources” problem for Testimonial Reliabilism (from section 3.2.2) poses a similar worry for the Inheritance View as well.

12. Some proponents of the Assurance View, e.g., Hinchman (2014) and Moran (2018), maintain that in order for a hearer’s belief to be justified in the first place, certain background conditions must be met. For instance, the hearer cannot possess any relevant undefeated defeaters, and the speaker must be a reliable testifier. Thus, on these views, the hearer’s belief is justified in large part by the speaker’s assurance, but also in part by considerations having to do with the speaker’s reliability. However, Lackey (2008) objects to these qualified Assurance Views on the following grounds: Once these background conditions are added to the Assurance View, it is no longer clear what kind of epistemic role these non-evidential assurances are playing when it comes to justifying the hearer’s belief.

13. Moran (2005) talks about the speaker offering their audience an assurance. A. Ross (1986) puts it in terms of the speaker offering the hearer a “guarantee”, and Hinchman (2005) puts it in terms of the speaker issuing an “invitations to trust”.

14. Keren (2012) offers a response to this argument. It is worth noting that McMyler (2011, 2013) and Moran (2005) offer a second motivation for the claim that assurances are non-evidential in nature. Here is the basic idea: If a hearer acquires testimonial justification for believing p, then it is possible for the hearer to also acquire a right of complaint against the speaker if p turns out to be false; but this right of complaint can only be acquired if testimonial justification is understood in terms of non-evidential assurances; thus, this is how testimonial justification should be understood. For reasons of space I won’t discuss this argument in any more detail here, but see Lackey (2008) and Leonard (2016) for replies.

15. A note about the taxonomy: I am considering Testimonial Reliabilism to be a non-evidential view because Reliabilism about justification in general has traditionally been understood in this way, e.g., Alvin Goldman (1979). However, this is not to say that it would be impossible to give a kind of hybrid view that combines Testimonial Reliabilism with the idea that our testimonial-based beliefs are justified (at least in part) by some evidence. More on these hybrid approaches in Section 3.3.

16. Graham sometimes puts his view in terms of the information-theoretic terminology developed in Dretske (1982).

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Nick Leonard <>

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