[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by Gerard Wegemer replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]
Thomas More (1478–1535), as the young “man for all seasons” first so called by Erasmus (9 June 1510 letter to More [EW 271.27] and c. September 1521 letter to Guillaume Budé [EW 1376.9]), has been recognized as one of the foremost early modern humanists in England, particularly in view of his well-known Utopia and his History of King Richard III. Whether years later Chancellor More remained such a man, or became repressive in his outlook and action, remains a topic of controversy. After law school and the best education available in London and Oxford, More mastered ancient Greek and encouraged Erasmus to do so as well, convinced of the need to return to the sources of classical and biblical thought. Throughout his life he stressed the importance of philosophy; he himself devoted his early morning hours to study and reflection even during his busiest years—as is evidenced by the twenty books, the 291 poems, and the surviving 151 letters that he wrote in the midst of an active civic life. He identified himself frequently as a “citizen of London” and was known as a distinguished lawyer, judge, member of Parliament, ambassador, and prominent proponent of women’s education; he became Speaker of the House of Commons, Chancellor of the Duchy of Lancaster, then for three years Lord Chancellor of England and prosecutor of heretics under King Henry VIII. In taking the oath of office as Chancellor, More swore to uphold England’s 128-year-old heresy laws and, while he was in office, six individuals were convicted of heresy by ecclesiastical courts and then executed under secular law. He himself was executed for failing to recognize the legislation of 1532–34 making Henry VIII head of the Church of England and for failing to support the king’s divorce from Catherine of Aragon and marriage to Anne Boleyn.
This entry is limited to Thomas More’s understanding and practice of philosophy, enlightened, as he believed it to be, by biblical revelation. Intellectually, he was most deeply indebted to Plato, Aristotle, Cicero, Seneca, the Bible, and the Latin and Greek Church Fathers (especially Augustine, Jerome, Basil, and Chrysostom; see Concordances in Other Internet Resources).
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Plato’s Socrates: the “best philosopher”
- 3. Early Poetry, Conscience, and Philosophic Considerations
- 4. Augustine; Lucian’s Humorous Dialectical Engagement
- 5. Towards a “Civil” Philosophy: Life of Pico, Epigrams, Richard III
- 6. Socratic Dialogue on Philosophy and the City: Utopia
- 7. “True dialectic and true philosophy, especially Aristotelian”
- 8. Free Speech, Conscience, and Dialectical Inquiry
- 9. Judgments “in conscience”
- 10. Polemical Works: Status of Reason, Liberty, Law
- 11. “Reason ought to reign like a king”
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
According to Erasmus, the young Thomas More “devoted himself to the study of Greek literature and philosophy”, and
[a]s a youth even worked on a dialogue in which he supported Plato’s doctrine of communalism, extending it even to wives. (23 July 1519 letter to Ulrich von Hutten [EW 1372.6–7; 1373.93–96])
Commenting on the older More, Erasmus described him as having a “clearly philosophic character” (late 1532 letter to John Faber [EW 1378.56]) and a home that could rightly be called “another Platonic academy” but which gave first place to piety, Scripture, and the wisest and most saintly Church Fathers (late 1532 [EW 1380.51] and 22 May <1518> letter to William Gonell [EW 289–90]). It was also a home in which his daughters received the same education as his son (c. September 1521 letter to Guillaume Budé [EW 1375–76]). As the More scholar Elizabeth McCutcheon recently summarized the education of More’s daughters, it was
based on a study of Greek and Latin texts, … all the liberal and humane arts (grammar, rhetoric, logic, poetry, mathematics, philosophy, and astronomy) as well as theology and medicine. (McCutcheon 2022: 130)
Both Erasmus and Richard Pace described More as a second Democritus, the “laughing philosopher” (Curtis 2006b: 91, 94). Pace reported about More that “[t]here is no school of philosophy he doesn’t approve of in part” but added that his special talent was for revealing the “ridiculous” (Pace: 105)—a special focus, as we will see, of More’s epigrams. For Socrates, ridiculous people (a common theme of the young More) are those who are mistaken about themselves, those who have not followed the Delphic “know thyself” prescript (Plato, Philebus 48c). More wrote that his favorite comic dialogue writer, Lucian, used “Socratic irony” (<1506> letter to Thomas Ruthall [EW 20.59]), and he praised Lucian for “fulfill[ing] the Horatian maxim and combining delight with instruction” while “[r]efraining from the arrogant pronouncements of the philosophers as well as from the wanton wiles of the poets” (<1506> [EW 20.7–11]). Erasmus shared More’s admiration for Lucian, who
so effectively portrays the manners, emotions, and pursuits of men, as if with a painter’s vivid brush, not so much inviting us to read about them as to see them with our own eyes, that … there is not a comedy, or a satire, that challenges comparison with his dialogues. (June 1506 letter to Christopher Urswick [CWE 2.116.51–55])
More studied Greek with the Italian-educated classical scholars William Grocyn, Thomas Linacre, and William Lily, and was “faithful to Aristotelian realism” (CW 6: 534; 23 October <1504> letter to John Colet [EW 270.75–78]; 21 October 1515 letter to Martin Dorp [EW 412.31–32]; Barron 2011: 11; McConica 2011: 25–26; Curtis 2011: 72). More presents a “philosophically sophisticated” treatment of dialectic and language in his “Letter to Dorp” (Kinney 1981: 180; EW 391–416), where he explains that the meanings of words depend on custom and common usage (EW 398, CW 15: 35) and that true dialectics is an “intellectual exercise” whose “goal is the truth and not winning a quarrel” (EW 407.59–60, 67–68; CW 15: 75). Nonetheless, in that same letter More shows his characteristic independence of mind by saying that he esteems Aristotle “more than many, but still along with many” (EW 411.80–81, SL 52).
His early biographer Thomas Stapleton remarked that among “philosophers [More] read especially Plato” and that “in his own works he imitated Plato’s manner of writing” (1588 [1928: 15]). This imitation has been noted in recent studies of Utopia (Schön 2022; Nelson 2004; Baker-Smith 1994; Duncan 1979) but rarely in writings on More’s other Socratic dialogues, although his “dialogic” cast of mind has long been recognized in various studies (recently: Gardner Rodgers 2011: 243; also E. McCutcheon 2011: 58–59; Renner 2018: 51, 54–62).
2. Plato’s Socrates: the “best philosopher”
Of all philosophers More gave pride of place to “Plato alone” (1520 letter to Brixius [EW 468.38, CW 3.2: 643]), describing him as “the great philosopher” and “wise” (1529 Dialogue of Sir Thomas More, Knight [EW 681.12, 29, CW 6: 334.23, 335.2]). Plato’s Socrates, whom More called “the best philosopher”, defined philosophy as (in More’s paraphrasing) “the meditation or exercise of [i.e., the preparation for] death” since “the study of philosophy labor[s] to sever the soul from the love and affections of the body while they be together” (1522 Four Last Things [EW 482.41–52]). As More expressed it in one of his early works, Socrates achieved “merry cheer”, “wisdom”, and “liberty” by escaping the “bondage” of Fortune and by understanding the “secret draughts [i.e., designs] of nature” (c. 1504 “Fortune Verses” [EW 14–15]).
More’s Socrates was primarily concerned with ethics. In presenting Socrates’ definition of philosophy as a preparation for death, More was alluding to Plato’s Phaedo, in which Socrates argues that the true philosopher must be freed from bodily appetites and pleasures that hinder the soul from reaching truth, virtue, and wisdom (963e–67e). In the Phaedo, Socrates also provocatively calls the body a prison of the soul (82e) and says he is looking forward to the liberty that death will provide his soul (1522, Four Last Things [EW 482.42–43]). Throughout his writings, More also frequently drew attention to the distortions in perception caused by the senses and the undisciplined passions, but his incarnational view consistently caused him to acknowledge that the body and soul are “so knit and joined together” as to “make between them one person”, able to act harmoniously with proper education, diligent training, and recourse to grace (1534 Dialogue of Comfort [EW 1176.59–60]; also c. 1510 Life of Pico [EW 85.30, 61–62; 90.15–93.210; 94.82]).
More, following Augustine (Augustine, The Trinity, Books 9–10), saw the soul as created in the image of God by reason, at least in part, of being endowed “with the three great gifts, memory, understanding, and will, in a certain manner of resemblance of the … Trinity” (c. 1510 Life of Pico [EW 74.62–65, 89.61–62]; 1534 Treatise on the Passion [EW 1031.32–35]). He saw as well that “brutish appetites” can “make the soul leave the noble use of his reason”—thus “turn[ing] the image of God into a beast” (EW 74). One of More’s most frequent themes, from his first published work to his last, was the character of that “spiritual battle” needed to allow “reason to rule as a king”—and therefore facilitating liberty through law, i.e., through law as reason embodied over time for the good of all.
More addressed the question of how one frees the soul “for truth and right reason in all things” (1506 Lucian Dialogues [EW 44.17]) in a series of rhyme royal poems (i.e., in seven-line iambic pentameter stanzas rhyming ababbcc) about the spiritual life in his most extensive addition to the first of his publications in English, The Life of John Pico, Earl of Mirandola. There More developed “Twelve Rules” and “Twelve Weapons” of “Spiritual Battle” needed to achieve joy through virtue and conscience, since “Of virtue more joy the conscience hath within / Than outward the body of all his filthy sin” (EW 87.139–40) and so “Thou shalt no pleasure comparable find / To th’inward gladness of a virtuous mind” (EW 89.74–75.) To distinguish this approach from that of the Stoics, he also developed in rhyme royal verse what he called “The Twelve Properties … of a Lover”. This love ballad makes clear that a “perfect lover” will gladly “suffer trouble, pain, and woe” for his human beloved, and all the more so for God (EW 90–93).
This early set of poems on the “spiritual battle” was followed by prose writings such as The Four Last Things and portions of his Dialogue of Sir Thomas More, Knight. These writings concerned the “spiritual exercise by which the soul willingly worketh with the body” to cultivate “inward spiritual pleasure” based on neither “false imagination” nor “vain pleasures of the flesh” but on a very true contemplation” and “the very pleasures of the soul” (1529 Dialogue of Sir Thomas More, Knight [EW 480, 488]). Regarding this “spiritual business” of cultivating the soul “to rule and bridle sensuality” and to be “subject and obedient to reason” (EW 584.67–71), More alludes regularly to the Phaedrus, where Socrates says that the reasoning charioteer must bridle and govern his passionate horses (EW 15.271, 26.15–36, 577.1–2, 580.83, 581.54, 584.69–71, 1101.56, 1232.71–72, 1350.46–47). More also urges his readers to cultivate the “garden of our soul” by engendering, planting, and watering in it the “spiritual affections” that God “by sundry means instructeth our reason to lean unto” (1534 Dialogue of Comfort [EW 1232.52–66]; also 1522 Four Last Things [EW 477.49–50]; 1529 Dialogue of Sir Thomas More, Knight [EW 584.34–35]).
3. Early Poetry, Conscience, and Philosophic Considerations
Lord Chancellor and Archbishop John Morton marveled at the twelve-year-old More’s extraordinary theatrical ability to
step in among the players, and never studying for the matter, make a part of his own there presently among them, which made the lookers-on more sport than all the players besides. (Roper’s Life of Sir Thomas More [EW 1391.10–14])
Reflecting on this passage and on More’s early poetry and life, Richard Sylvester—the Yale scholar who launched the Complete Works project—observed that he had, even from that early age, an awareness “of himself in relation to others”, showing “conscience in the old sense of the word, ‘a knowing with’” that always enabled him to determine a “part of his own” (1967: 30).
In his earliest known poem, “Pageant Verses” (c. 1496 [EW 3–4, CW 1: 3–7]), More shows his flair for dramatic representations of life. Each of the nine first-person monologues expresses, in rhyme royal verse, a different and fitting perspective about the ages of life and their specific characteristics (EW 3–4), each with a touch of humor. The poem not only includes in its scope the full scale of life (following the ages-of-man trope of Childhood, Youth, Maturity, Old Age) and what follows one’s earthly life (Death, Fame, Time, and a secular Eternity), but also ends, in Latin, with the Poet’s view of all that preceded in the light of a loving God, the one true good—and the Poet’s challenge for the reader to reflect and choose.
“Pageant Verses” begins with Childhood boasting of his stage of life: “[I]n play is all my mind”. Childhood humorously calls upon God twice to enable him to play games all day; to have all those “hateful books” burned “to powder small”, and thus send him a “life always in play”. This stanza brings out the power of pleasure’s allure—as do the following few stanzas, and as will Utopia and More’s later works. But the child does naturally turn to God in those lines (17 and 20), and in lines 14 and 20 he reveals an awareness of his own mind and of death. The next stanzas dramatize the pursuit of pleasure in different forms according to the particular age of life, but all show the prominence of pride: each speaker ups the boast, explaining how their pleasure or power exceeds that of the one before. Even the old ruler boasts—of his wisdom and discretion in achieving the “public weal”—in the stanza entitled “Age”.
“Rueful Lamentation” (EW 5–6)—written in 1503, when More was twenty-five—is a moving first-person monologue by Queen Elizabeth of York (the mother of Henry VIII) on her deathbed, bearing witness to what the Poet of “Pageant Verses” said about the “goods of th[is] fragile world” being “slippery”. Queen Elizabeth makes this point powerfully in the concluding refrain for each of her twelve stanzas: “Lo, here I lie”. More’s last two English poems, written in prison, are also about “flattering Fortune” and unreliable “Lady Luck” (c. 1534 [EW 16]).
More’s greatest English poem is “The Fortune Verses” (c. 1504), a dialogue between Lady Fortune and two other speakers with differing perspectives (EW 12–16). As one scholar put it:
More’s Fortune Verses present a three-way dialectical consideration of how best to live one’s life in the world controlled by Fortune. The poem is shown to progress from speaker to speaker in its several parts, in order to present an increasingly accurate understanding of the person of Fortune and her relationship to human life. (Mock 2011: 69)
The speaker in the opening Prologue is identified as “T.M.” and the meter is rhyme royal, the form, as we have seen, that More used most frequently in his other early poetry. This speaker addresses the reader directly in his fifty lines, giving a simplistic and entirely negative view of Fortune. This speaker even quotes, in French, a poet dismissing Fortune as “perverse” and the cause of all evils. The 250 lines that follow, however, are an engaging dialogue—not at all simplistic—between Lady Fortune and an exceptionally wise and persuasive interlocutor, all with More’s customary humor.
In the Fortune Verses, More dramatizes how human beings contend with the powerful allure of Fortune’s fleeting goods. He gives the examples of “wise Socrates” and other “old philosophers” who achieved “felicity” and “free liberty” by choosing “glad Poverty” instead of Fortune. This choice led them to a “wisdom” resulting in happiness rather than wretchedness (EW 14–15). By choosing poverty, Socrates and like-minded philosophers chose only “what nature may sustain, / Banishing clear all other surplusage” (EW 14.210–11; also 1201ff). The nature of “free liberty”, along with its relations to wisdom and virtue is one of More’s major themes throughout his writings.
These early poems show More’s preoccupation with challenging the reader to participate in, to reflect on, and, as the Poet of the “Pageant Verses” puts it, to “nourish his soul” on “true things” through the “fashioned figures” of “wondrous art” (EW 4). This youthful focus on truth and wonder is another early sign of More’s philosophic cast of mind.
4. Augustine; Lucian’s Humorous Dialectical Engagement
In 1501, at the age of 23, More was invited by William Grocyn, the rector of St. Lawrence Jewry in central London, to give lectures on Augustine’s City of God. According to Thomas Stapleton, More “did not treat this great work from the theological point of view, but from the standpoint of history and philosophy” (1588 [1928: 8–9]). In the same year, under Grocyn’s instruction, he began the serious study of Greek (EW 269.21, 24). He mastered it in three years—to such an extent that he could then challenge Erasmus to a Greek-translating contest that resulted in his first publication, in 1506 of Lucian Dialogues and Declamations (EW 17–59; CW 3.1]).
In choosing the content of this first publication, as R. R. McCutcheon observed, “Thomas More began his career as a dialogist … by collaborating with Erasmus as a translator of Lucian” (1993: 357). The three Lucian dialogues that More translated all humorously satirize supposed philosophers’ “arrogant pronouncements” and “fruitless contentions” (1510 EW 20.10, 56). For the same publication, More also challenged Erasmus to write responses to a declamation on tyrannicide—a surprising topic for a first original publication, revealing, as Erasmus would later point out, his friend’s “special hatred of tyranny” (1519 letter to von Hutten [EW 1371.17]). More’s declamation set forth a theory about tyranny and how the tyrant differs from other criminal leaders. The declamation also speaks of civic liberty and the type of civic virtues needed to maintain liberty, that “most precious” gift willed by the gods (1506 EW 59.13–41).
More’s choice to translate three comic depictions of philosophic confusion calls to mind The City of God’s lengthy expositions of the perennial disagreements among philosophers. Augustine cites, for example, the failure of philosophers to agree on any “universal” guide to life (10.41); the ongoing “wars” between schools of thought, resulting in its own Babel (18.41); Varro’s distinguishing 288 different sects of philosophy (19.1); and Cicero’s admission that only a very few achieve “true philosophy”—and that by a gift from God (22.22). Throughout his life More quoted Augustine more than any other author (see Concordances in Other Internet Resources), but nonetheless he early on wrote:
Being a man, [Augustine] could make a mistake. I take his word as seriously as anyone’s, but I take no man’s word unconditionally. (21 October <1515> letter to Martin Dorp [EW 405. 5–7; CW 15: 69.4–6])
More affirmed this independence of mind dramatically at the end of his life, in prison:
I never intend (God being my good lord) to pin my soul at another man’s back, not even the best man that I know this day living, for I know not wither he may hap to carry it. There is no man living of whom, while he liveth, I may make myself sure. (<August 1534> letter of Margaret Roper to Alice Alington [EW 1314.52–57])
For his own children, More insisted on an education ordered to “good judgment” and the ability to listen to popular opinion without being overly swayed by it (<1521> letter to Margaret Roper [EW 314.79–80]; 22 May <1518> letter to William Gonell [EW 289.80–83]). A main reason for his decision to translate Lucian’s comic dialogues was the Greek satirist’s “first rate” ability to probe deeply without disturbing the reader’s “equanimity [aequo animo]” (1506 letter to Ruthall [EW 20 n.1]). Like Socrates, More’s major philosophic interest was the properly ordered soul equipped to seek truth and virtue not victory and applause (c. 1518 letter to Gonell [EW 288–90]). But unlike Socrates, More’s final Socratic dialogues make clear that truth and virtue can be found—with the assistance of revelation—and not merely sought.
5. Towards a “Civil” Philosophy: Life of Pico, Epigrams, Richard III
In 1510, More found an occasion to publish a work he had begun years earlier, having undoubtedly been introduced to Giovanni Pico della Mirandola by his friends and teachers who had studied in Italy, where the “Prince of Concord” was well known (Sylvester 1967: 35). Pico’s nephew and heir, Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola, published in 1496 a 496–page biography of his uncle and anthology of his works. More’s highly edited 34–page biography and anthology radically re-envisioned Pico’s life and philosophic project. As the historian James McConica has pointed out, everything
foreign to More’s thoroughly orthodox outlook is eliminated; of all the sources for Pico’s thought in the original version, only Thomas Aquinas is singled out for mention. (1981: 65; see also Koterski 2010: 61).
In his version of The Life of John Pico, More modified the texts he translated to register his disagreement with Pico’s understanding of philosophy. Contrary to Pico’s own aristocratic view that the “princely practice” of philosophy should never be “mercenary” or “servile” (EW 77.79–82, 78.45, 86.33), More adds repeatedly, with comic irony, that philosophy brings “profit” (EW 63.37, 46; 68.27; 78.14), especially by providing “instruction … in moral virtue” (see More’s addition at EW 77.84–85). As the editor of the Yale edition of The Life of Pico observes, More’s many omissions, selections, and additions are “concerned to emphasize the necessity of the active life” and to show the insufficiency of “the reclusive life of the solitary scholar” (CW 1: xlviii). In this way, More adds a Ciceronian and Senecan perspective, casting philosophy as a most useful art while deftly criticizing Pico for not fulfilling important duties of the “civil and active life” (EW 77.89–90), and for insisting that “philosophers love liberty; … they cannot serve” (EW 78.56, 58)—thus neglecting the ordinary duties of everyday life, as will Raphael Hythloday in Utopia.
The dangers of an active civic life as well as the consequences of neglect by civic leaders are seen in More’s History of King Richard III (ca. 1513), a work never published during his own lifetime despite the much revised and differing versions he drafted in Latin and English. In both versions More dramatized how human beings use their reason to decide not to follow reason. King Edward IV, for example, ends up tragically “taking counsel of … desire” rather than of reason (EW 124.51). Queen Elizabeth Woodville (Edward’s wife), despite the powerful reasons she gave for not abandoning her young and sick son to the “wolf” Richard, goes against those reasons and freely hands him over. This same foolish propensity to follow passion rather than reason is a major topic of More’s many satirical epigrams (e.g., Epigrams 199, 210, and 214). His satires point to the importance of self-knowledge and of a well-ordered and peaceful state of soul so that reason is unhindered from making a “good judgment” (<1521> letter to Margaret Roper [EW 314.79–80]); these are the educational goals More set for his children and for himself (<1518> letter to Gonell [EW 288–90]).
The 102 of More’s Latin poems that are translations from the Greek, combined with his own 179 original epigrams, show his interest in the full scope of human life. As the editors of the Yale edition put it, More’s “refreshing new range of subjects” makes us
feel we are leaving the study of a scholar or a cleric and entering the world of merchants, lawyers, and courtiers…. It is this vivid interest in life in all its aspects that makes More’s Epigrammata incomparably the best book of Latin epigrams in the sixteenth century. (CW 3.2: 62, 63)
A large number of these witty poems highlight the ridiculous, but many of the most distinctive ones are political and address the question of tyranny versus good rule. To quote the Yale editors again: More’s
favorite concern is for the difference between a good king and a tyrant, but it is evident from a reading of this group of epigrams that, whereas the existence of good kings is a theoretical possibility, the existence of tyrants is a present danger. (CW 3.2: 62)
In fact, his criticisms of King Henry VII in Epigram 19 were so severe that soon after More published these poems the French humanist Germanus Brixius (Germain de Brie) accused him of defaming the monarch (c. 1519 Antimorus [CW 3.2: 493, 495])—an accusation so serious that More was advised to fight to protect himself (<March– April 1520> letter to Erasmus [EW 302.14–18]).
In 1516, More’s collection of epigrams was to be published with Utopia (CW 3.1: lxi–lxii; CWE 3: 316.89–90; CWE 4: 67.22–24; CWE 4: 281), but because of printing difficulties it was instead first published with the 1518 edition of Utopia; this added yet another element of dialectical engagement since the epigrams contain terms and themes present in the already provocative Utopia. As David Baker points out, for example, several of the epigrams portray the character of the true princeps, a term used throughout Utopia and one which was fraught with historical and cultural controversy (33–45). Significantly, More uses “citizens” and “people” rather than “subjects” in his literary works and explicitly criticizes kings who treat “subjects” as “slaves” (31 October <1516> letter to Erasmus [EW 278.63–65]).
6. Socratic Dialogue on Philosophy and the City: Utopia
Utopia, undoubtedly More’s most famous and most controversial dialogue, combines elements from the dialogue forms of Plato and Cicero, with dozens of allusions to each author, starting with the very title:
DE OPTIMO REIPUBLICAE STATU DEQUE, nova insula UTOPIA libellus vere aureus nec minus salutaris quam festivus, clarissimi disertissimique viri THOMAE MORI inclutae civitatis Londinensis civis et Vicecomitis
(first published in English in 1551 as On the Best State of a Commonwealth and on the new Island of Utopia A Truly Golden Handbook, No Less Beneficial than Entertaining by the Most Distinguished and Eloquent Author Thomas More Citizen and Undersheriff of the Famous City of London).
It was Cicero who translated Plato’s title Politeia as Res Publicae and who established, in his own Republic and Laws, the conversation with Plato that More continues in Utopia. More, however, adds comic elements from Lucian’s dialogues, and to miss the humor in Utopia is to miss his characteristic comic irony.
Book 1 of Utopia raises the large question of philosophy’s relation to the city. Raphael Hythloday argues that philosophy will never have a place in any city unless that city imitates Utopia. The character “Thomas Morus” maintains an opposing view: that a philosophy “more civil [civilior] than Hythloday’s “academic [scholasticae]” philosophy not only has a place, but even poses a challenge and a duty not to desert “the ship in a storm because you cannot control the winds”—while making things “as little bad as you can” (EW 172.19–27). This debate goes back to Plato and Cicero; More continues it, but adds many issues raised by biblical revelation and by Church Fathers, especially Augustine (Wegemer 1996: 128–49).
Because Hythloday does not convince Morus and his friend Peter Giles by the end of Book 1, Morus invites both him and Giles to lunch, urging Raphael to tell all he can about Utopia, especially everything that it can teach about educating citizens well, so that they become capable of self-rule (EW 158.82–83, 159.2–3). Book 2 of Utopia follows, an afternoon-long monologue by Hythloday, who presents a highly selective description of life in Utopia. Afterwards, Morus observes that Hythloday is tired and not in the mood to be questioned, so he invites Hythloday and Giles to dinner, complimenting Raphael on his story-telling and saying that they will have to find another time for a deeper investigation. Utopia ends with Morus commenting to the reader that “quite a few of the institutions” of Utopia were “quite absurd” (EW 211.18). In a letter written a year later and included at the end of the 1517 edition of Utopia, Morus recommended that future readers ask questions in order to “ferret … out” the truth of what Hythloday had said (EW 215.85).
The setting and many plot details of Utopia provide thought-provoking contrasts to both Plato’s Republic and Cicero’s. For example, Plato’s Republic begins as Socrates is walking (with Glaucon) away from the Piraeus (a port six miles from Athens), having attended the new festival for a foreign goddess. On his way to Athens, he is accosted by Polemarchus and his friends, who “force” him to speak about justice—and though promised dinner, Socrates and his interlocutors by the end of their long dialogue have not yet dined. Utopia begins with Morus leaving a church in the middle of Antwerp, and this busy public official welcomes Giles and Hythloday to the garden of his home where he treats them to lunch and then dinner. Cicero’s Republic, like Utopia, also takes place in the garden of a busy public official—Scipio Aemilianus—in the middle of Rome. Given the dramatic character of classical dialogues, these comparisons of settings are an important part of Utopia’s literary and philosophic design, as Dominic Baker-Smith has indicated (1991 [2000: 94]).
The dialectical challenge posed by the conversation between Hythloday and Morus is playfully but seriously seen even in the names chosen, as Morus himself says at EW 215.50–61: Utopia is Greek for “no place”, and other Greek names negate what they express: the river Anyder means “no water”; the ruler ademos means “no people”. This kind of intellectual play is also seen in Utopia’s more than 140 uses of litotes “in which a thing is affirmed by stating the negative of its opposite” (E. McCutcheon 1971: 107). This dialectical game-playing is especially pointed in the oxymoron that is formed by Hythloday’s full name: Raphael is Hebrew for “healer from God”, and Hythloday is Greek for “speaker of nonsense”—but if so, which is he really, and when? And since morus is Greek for “fool”, what are we to make of one fool talking to another?
These kinds of playful puzzles fill the Utopia, requiring the reader’s constant attention and probing engagement in light of a long and complex philosophic tradition. These competing elements are seen most clearly in the core debate occupying the middle of Book 2 about the central Utopian philosophic controversy regarding the nature of virtue. Utopia’s philosophic position is a strange mixture of an Epicurean emphasis on pleasure and the Stoic definition of virtue, while alluding throughout to Cicero’s criticisms of both positions as well as to elements characteristic of Christianity’s distinctive perspectives.
Although the scholarship on Utopia far surpasses any other of More’s works, no consensus has emerged regarding the intricate intellectual puzzle More has created.
7. “True dialectic and true philosophy, especially Aristotelian”
In his 1515 controversy with Martin Dorp and the scholastic theologians at the University of Louvain, More defended “true dialectic and true philosophy, especially Aristotelian” (21 October <1515> letter to Dorp [EW 395.73–74]). In 1518 he again publicly defended philosophy, specifically Greek philosophy, in the curriculum at Oxford University (29 March <1518> letter to Oxford University [EW 419.59–62]). Around 1518, More also included philosophy in the curriculum for his children (<1518> letter to Gonell [EW 289.6]), and his daughters went on to dispute philosophy before Henry VIII in 1526 (<1526> letter from John Palsgrave [Corr 405.76–77]). His daughter Margaret devoted herself “diligently to philosophy”, a course of studies that More encouraged along with “medical science and sacred literature” but without neglecting “humane letters and so-called liberal studies” because in these latter studies in particular “a good judgment is formed or perfected” (<1521> letter to Margaret Roper [EW 314.50–80]).
In the letter to his children’s tutor William Gonell (c. 1518), More pointed out that the “most learned” of the philosophers serve usefully as “guides of human life” (EW 289.4–6), and that wisdom is an important objective of education, depending, as he believed, “on the inner knowledge of what is right [recti conscientia]”—or, in a more accurate translation, “on a right conscience” (EW 288.75–77). Another major objective of education is an inward “calm and … peace” allowing a person to be
neither stirred by praise of flatterers nor stung by the follies of unlearned mockers of learning [neque ridentium literas illiteratorum mordeantur ineptiis]. (EW 289.78–83)
Towards these ends, More gave a special place to the classical authors but also to the Bible and the Church Fathers (EW 290.65–77).
Later, More would again emphasize the special importance that should be given to Greek writings—classical, biblical, and patristic (<1518> letter to Oxford [EW 419–20]—while also recognizing the important contributions of Cicero, Seneca, the Latin Church Fathers (EW 419.13–14, 60), as well as Thomas Aquinas, “that most learned and also most holy man” (Response to Luther, Book 1 [CW 5: 355.23–4]), “the very flower of theology, and a man of that true perfect faith and Christian living” (The Confutation of Tyndale’s Answer [CW 8: 713.21, 14]).
8. Free Speech, Conscience, and Dialectical Inquiry
In 1523 as Speaker of the House of Commons, More delivered an oration requesting freedom of speech in the House of Commons (c. 1556 Roper’s Life of More [EW 1387.80–86, 1393–94]). He argued that though the king and his prudent advisors had, with “due diligence”, called upon “the most discreet persons out of every quarter” to give “right substantial counsel”, yet since a person’s “mind is often so occupied with the matter” being discussed, it might happen that the person “rather studieth what to say than how” to say it—or another person might be “so fervent in a matter” that he might “speak in such a wise as he would afterward wish to have uttered otherwise”. So, to be
utterly discharged of all doubt and fear how anything that it should happen them to speak, should happen of your Highness to be taken,
More requested that
our most benign and godly King … give to all your Commons here assembled your most gracious licence and pardon, freely, without doubt of your dreadful displeasure, every man to discharge his conscience, and boldly in everything incident among us to declare his advice. (EW 1394.19–71)
Here, and consistently throughout his writings, this “discharge” of one’s conscience was ordered “to declar[ing] … the very truth” as one saw it after “the matter [had been] thoroughly debated … using diligence and troth” (1 February 1533/4 letter to Thomas Cromwell [EW 376.12, 62]; The Debellation of Salem and Bizance [CW 10: 162.14–15, 26]; also c. 1513 History of King Richard III [EW 125.65], 1533 Answer to a Poisoned Book [EW 918.40–43], <August 1534> letter of Margaret Roper to Alice Alington [EW 1318.52], 1535 Paris Newsletter [EW 1385.10 and 25], 1548 Hall’s Chronical [EW 1389.50]; see esp. More’s two 1534 letters to Wilson [EW 1320–23]).
More’s case for free deliberation “using diligence and troth”—i.e., for genuine dialectical inquiry—in Parliament and legal matters was similar to the case he made for deliberating political and theological matters. For example, “Epigram 198: What Is the Best Form of Government?” opens as a debate regarding which is better, a hereditary monarchy or a senate. After giving arguments on both sides and after presenting the choice as between one person who by “blind chance” is “ruler of his advisers” and a group of persons “elected by the people to rule” by “reasonable agreement [certum consilium]” (EW 249), the poem’s narrator abruptly ends the debate, leaving the reader to ponder the issue.
This concern for genuine dialectical inquiry free from self-interest was expressed by More most dramatically to Henry VIII after the king first asked his support in 1527 for his divorce from Queen Catherine. More studied all the materials he was given, discussing them with the advisors Henry identified. After doing so, he suggested to Henry that More himself and Henry’s other advisors might not give the king the best advice because “being all your Grace’s own servants” and because of “your manifold benefits daily bestowed on us”, they could be “inclined to deceive you”. Therefore, More advised Henry to consult the counselors most fit to help “understand the truth” of his case: “Saint Jerome, Saint Augustine, and diverse other old holy doctors, both Greeks and Latins” (Roper’s Life of More [EW 1399]). One of More’s objectives as a young man in studying Greek had been to read the Greek Church Fathers, and throughout his life, he studied both the Latin and Greek “old holy doctors and fathers” to determine the “consent of the common Catholic Church” regarding contested matters (7 December <1532> letter against John Frith [EW 361.59, 368.36], 1529 Dialogue of Sir Thomas More, Knight [EW 607.28–55]). Even at his trial, More emphasized the importance of international councils to study matters, aware of the influence exerted by national or historical interests. At his trial, for example, he said:
For one bishop who agrees with you, I have easily a hundred, including some who are among the saints. And for your one council, Parliament, and your statute—what it is worth the great good God knows—on my side are all the general councils celebrated during the last thousand years. (1535 Guildhall Report 10 [EW 1361])
At that trial, he went on to argue that England’s unilateral action was “contrary to the unity and concord” of “the whole Christian world” (EW 1361.47–50, Guildhall Report 12)—a determination More made after his “study during the whole of the last seven years”; he finally made public this determination (after years of silence) “for the exoneration of my conscience” (1535 Guildhall Report 8 [EW 1361.16–19]).
9. Judgments “in conscience”
“Right conscience”, for More, is a judgment of the practical intellect about some particular matter, in light of principles discovered to be true—and if doubt arose about a fundamental principle, he held it to be the duty of a properly convened international General Counsel to clarify the principle involved, judged in light of the entire received tradition (<August 1534> letter of Margaret Roper to Alice Alington [EW 1316–17]). More explained this to his daughter Margaret when she came for the third time to convince her father to leave prison and to sign the oath, as she and their friends had all done. More pointed out the danger of “framing oneself a conscience” to gratify one’s desire rather than to determine what is true. Accused of being a “foolish scrupulous ass”, More told one of his most famous “merry tales” about “a poor honest man of the country that was called Company” who refused to perjure himself as a jury member. When pressed to go along with the others, Company says:
[N]ow when we shall hence and come before God, and that he shall send you to heaven for doing according to your conscience, and me to the devil for doing against mine, … if I shall then say to all you again, ‘Masters, I went once for good company with you, which is the cause that I go now to hell, play you the good fellows now again with me; as I went then for good company with you, so some of you now for good company with me. (EW 1314–15)
“Conscience” became a word More used with great frequency towards the end of his life. But even in his earliest education letter, he twice identified a “right conscience [recti conscientia]” as one of the main goals of education (<1518> letter to Gonell [EW 288.76–77, 289.80]), and, in his earliest poetry, as we have seen, he wrote that: “Of virtue more joy the conscience hath within / Than outward the body of all his filthy sin” (c. 1510 Life of Pico [EW 87.139–41]), and that there is “no pleasure comparable … / To th’inward gladness of a virtuous mind” (c. 1510 Life of Pico [EW 89.74–75]). He expressed this same thought in prison, writing that “the clearness of my conscience hath made my heart hop for joy”, knowing that he had searched for seven years and was “very sure … in refusing to swear against mine own conscience” (1534 letter to Margaret Roper [EW 1324.68–69]).
Judgments made “in conscience” were so central to More that he discussed this issue with Henry VIII before agreeing to enter the king’s service in 1518; he had a similar conversation regarding his service as Lord Chancellor of England in 1529. Both times, More reported, Henry gave the “most virtuous lesson that ever prince taught his servant”:
that I should perceive mine own conscience should serve me, and that I should first look unto God and after God unto him. (5 March <1534> letter to Thomas Cromwell [EW 384.70–75], 1534 letter to Wilson [EW 1321.35–41], <3 June 1535> letter to Margaret Roper [EW 1332.67–73])
10. Polemical Works: Status of Reason, Liberty, Law
As Stephen Greenblatt indicated in his influential 1980 study of Renaissance self-fashioning, the “principle of intelligibility” is a major topic in More studies (63; 24–25, 59). More posed serious epistemological issues in questioning how we know—early on, for example, he questioned how Luther knows what he knows. In his first polemical work, “request[ed] by the king and court” (1523 Response to Luther [CW 5: 791]), More created the persona of an easily-angered, common-sense English lawyer who questions Luther in the following way.
… [W]e ask of him: “By what reason, Father, do you prove that you alone must be believed?”
To this he returns this cause: “Because I am certain”, he says, “that I have my teachings from heaven”.
Again we ask: “By what reason are you certain that you have your teachings from heaven?”
“Because God has seized me unawares”, he says, “and carried me into the midst of these turmoils”.
Again therefore we demand: “How do you know that God has seized you?”
“Because I am certain”, he says, “that my teaching is from God”.
“How do you know that?”
“Because God has seized me”.
“How do you know this?”
“Because I am certain”.
“How are you certain?”
“Because I know”.
“But how do you know?”
“Because I am certain”.
I ask you, reader, whether that form of disputing does not find a place here…. (1523 Response to Luther [EW 517.31–53])
Here in this 1523 text, as he would do later in all of his polemical works, More regularly addresses his readers and asks them to judge for themselves—in light of reason and in light of an international agreement achieved through 1500 years of conciliar and scholarly deliberation.
More also addressed directly Luther’s early claims that “reason hindereth us in our faith, and is unto faith an enemy” (1529 Dialogue of Sir Thomas More, Knight [EW 698.23–24]) and that a spiritual elect had independence from all governors and from all civil and ecclesiastical laws (1523 Response to Luther [EW 510–11, 522–23], 1529 Dialogue [EW 698–99]). More saw these claims as undermining what he, Erasmus, and others saw as the path to lasting reform of both church and state: improved education resulting in better laws. More pointed out the danger of denying free will and teaching that it is “vain” to resist “sinful appetites” (1529 Dialogue [EW 703.42])—advice that countered the view of virtue that both the classical and the biblical traditions shared. If human beings are not responsible for their actions, then Luther’s “liberty of the gospel” is, for More, “unbridled license” (Response to Luther, Book 1 [CW 5: 271.4–5]) and a sure path to lawlessness and violence (Response to Luther, Book 2 [CW 5: 689–91]).
For More, law was itself the product of collective reason over time. He gives one of his clearest explanations of law after quoting a long defense of law by Henry VIII, who invoked Scripture, the Church Fathers, and history to prove that “the people without law drifts to and fro like a ship without a rudder” (1523 Response to Luther [EW 508–9], quoting Henry’s Defense of the Seven Sacraments). More then compares the biblical law against stealing with human laws about private property. If no one owned anything, there would be no theft, he observed. But “reason alone prescribe[s] the forms of determining property” together with “an agreement, and this a public agreement … taking root in usage or expressed in writing [which] is public law” (EW 510.39–44). Luther’s undermining the status of law—biblical and civic—is, More insists,
in opposition to the judgment of all learned men, in opposition to the judgment of all good men, in opposition to the public agreement of the whole world. (EW 511.15–18)
Yet realist that he was, More cites Plutarch, “the great moral philosopher” (EW 501.23), in recognizing that laws can
be much like … cobwebs, in which the little gnats and flies stick still and hang fast, but the great [bumble]-bees break them and fly quite through. (1534 Dialogue of Comfort [EW 1209.41–44]; see Plutarch, Life of Solon 5)
In his second major polemical work, published in 1529 in response to the bishop of London’s request (7 March 1527/8 letter from Bishop Tunstall [EW 351]), More countered Luther’s and Tyndale’s criticisms of philosophy and the role of reason by arguing that reason plays an essential role, but it must be a well-trained reason within a well-tempered body and soul (1534 Dialogue of Comfort [EW 1238.34], 1535 Sadness of Christ [EW 1260.31ff]). Without a proper order or “good temper” of the soul, More maintained that reason “will not fail to fall in rebellion”. Elsewhere he regularly used the classical image of training the powerful horses of the soul with bridle and bit if they are ever to be happy and serviceable (EW 15.271, 26.15–36, 577.1–2, 580.83, 581.54, 584.69–71, 1101.56, 1232.71–72, 1350.46–47). The bodily appetites must be tempered so that the spiritual appetites can flourish (EW 1242–43).
Arguing further for the essential role of reason, More goes on to show its role in the interpretation of Scripture:
“Now, in the study of Scripture—in devising upon the sentence, in considering what ye read, in pondering the purpose of diverse comments, in comparing together diverse texts that seem contrary and be not—albeit I deny not but that grace and God’s especial help is the great thing therein, yet useth he for an instrument man’s reason thereto. God helpeth us to eat, also, but yet not without our mouth. Now as the hand is the more nimble by the use of some feats, and the legs and feet more swift and sure by custom of going and running, and the whole body the more wieldy and lusty by some kind of exercise, so is it no doubt but that reason is by study, labor, and exercise of logic, philosophy, and other liberal arts, corroborated and quickened, and the judgment—both in them and also in orators, laws, and stories—much riped. And albeit poets be with many men taken but for painted words, yet do they much help the judgment, and make a man, among other things, well furnished of one special thing, without which all learning is half lame.”
“What is that?” quoth he.
“Marry”, quoth I, “a good mother wit. And therefore are, in mine opinion, these Lutherans in a mad mind, that would now have all learning save Scripture only clean cast away, which things (if the time will serve) be as methinketh to be taken and had, and with reason brought, as I said before, into the service of divinity”. (1529 Dialogue [EW 581.4–33])
As shown in this passage, More considered a mind that does not recognize the necessary role of a well-trained reason in human life to be mad.
He was consistent throughout his life in presenting the complementarity of reason and revelation:
[R]eason hath no full and perfect instruction without help of revelation. For not only in things only to be believed, but in many things also that are to be done [or] left undone, for anything that reason can tell either them or us, we be fain [i.e., glad] to seek the certainty of revelation. (The Confutation of Tyndale’s Answer [CW 8: 996.3–8])
As the More scholar Joanne Paul has argued, the problem as More saw it was that Luther removes “the authority of judging doctrines from the people and delivers it to anyone whatever”, that is, “from the people, as a corporate whole, to single individuals”. This is
especially problematic in that it encourages pride in others, telling them that they too have the power to interpret scripture according to their own judgement…. As More says, now “every prattling fool, every smatterer in scripture, shall be judge over all the general councils, and over the whole corps of Christendom, to tell them all that himself understandeth the scripture better than they all”. (98–99; see also Guy 2017: 41; Duffy 2017: 36–37)
In his longest polemical work, More satirizes what Tyndale calls his “feeling faith” by contrasting it with the consent and agreement achieved by international “synods and counsels” that “represent the whole Church” (Confutation [CW 8: 146, 8, 16]). Over 170 times More shows how the “feeling faith” of
Luther, Tyndale, and Zwingli, … and his fellows, goes against the interpretation of all holy doctors and saints, and the common faith of all true Christian people, fifteen hundred years before them. (CW 8: 157.11–14)
Here More continues to use his favorite technique of irony in a manner reminiscent of his calling the murderous Richard the “Protector” almost 100 times in his History of King Richard III.
11. “Reason ought to reign like a king”
How can reason pilot a soul suffering the greatest of interior storms while being attacked by the most terrifying external forces? How can a charioteer guide powerful horses spooked by fear? More, in broken health, addressed these questions (<August 1534> letter of Margaret Roper to Alice Alington [EW 1311.17–20]), in the last years of his life, even as he himself faced the prospect of torture (16 January 1534/5 letter to Master Leder [EW 1329.20–21]) as well as the most painful and shameful death that England had devised (1535 Bag of Secrets [EW 1360.76–86]). Prior to his imprisonment, when counting the costs, More confessed to being scandalized by his own resistance to suffering (1534 letter 210 to Margaret Roper [EW 1325.59–62]), yet he also confessed that despite “such fear and heavy pensiveness … I never in my mind intended to consent” to do anything that would go against “mine own conscience” (1534 letter 211 to Margaret Roper [EW 1327.77–81]). But he saw close friends—under fears and pressures similar to those he faced—consent to what earlier they had strongly rejected in conscience (August 1534 letter of Margaret Roper to Alice Alington [EW 1311–20], 1534 letters to Wilson [EW 1320–23]).
Against this background, More wrote his last Socratic dialogue, A Dialogue of Comfort against Tribulation (1534). It focuses on the role of reason in preparing the soul to be guided in a time of great trial by a reason enlightened by faith and strengthened by grace. As More explained later in his final work, The Sadness of Christ, “in a human being, reason ought to reign like a king” (1535 [EW 1289.30]). But if this ought to be the case, why does it rarely turn out that way? Even Christ’s human nature rebelled to the point that he sweated blood and pleaded that the cup of suffering might pass; even angels and the first human beings with all of their special gifts failed (EW 1027–37). In response to this challenge, More argued that human beings are created to be responsible for learning how to govern freely their own God-given faculties of memory, intellect, and will—and he warned that they will fail “all for … negligence” in using their freedom properly (EW 1035.75, 87.141; 1153.62; 1182.26; 1259.79–82, 1260.23, 1273.64).
In A Dialogue of Comfort, terrified young Vincent comes seeking advice from wise old Antony. Vincent is obsessed with fears for himself, his family, and his country as the Turks prepare to return to Hungary after having killed and tortured many Hungarians just one year before.
Vincent is so distraught that it takes Antony two and a half books to calm him down enough to address the first and most important of his concerns. In those books, Antony exhibits a skillful Socratic strategy, leading Vincent to sufficient self-knowledge so that he can begin the work of self-government. Antony confirms, for example, that essential seeds are planted in the garden of Vincent’s soul (EW 1116.5, 9; 1232.59–63; also EW 4.120, 479.53–69) and reveals to him those seeds that are missing or insufficiently cultivated (EW 1126.48ff, 1185.39–42, 1237.49–86). Antony even has Vincent play the part of a rich man as a way of leading him to deeper self-knowledge (EW 1211–14), since a thorough knowledge of self is foundational to enable the active cultivation of his own soul that Vincent will promise to undertake at the end of this Dialogue.
After two and a half books of conversation, Antony judges that Vincent has achieved sufficient “comfort and courage” that he can now help Vincent “more quietly consider” the “sorest part” of his fears, the fears he brought up early in Book 1 (EW 1219.64–71). Antony deliberately postponed this consideration (EW 1125.57) until Vincent’s soul was sufficiently calm, recognizing that it is not possible to “examine the weight and substance” of his greatest terrors “when the heart is … taken up and oppressed with the troublous affection of heavy sorrowful fear” (EW 1219.67–71). For reason to reign, the soul must have a certain level of equanimity—an insight reinforced in More by Lucian and Seneca among others (EW 20.16n2 1164.42–43, 1219.66, 1224.25, 1380.45–50; EW 1221.30 for Seneca), and by his own experience.
What More does in A Dialogue of Comfort is to show how difficult it is to achieve enough self-knowledge to begin the training needed for self-government, because true self-government requires understanding reason’s essential but insufficient role—hence the dialogue’s insistence on the need for God’s grace and revelation. Antony explains that, created with reason and free will, every human being is obliged to undertake this most important and most difficult project of self-government (EW 1255.29–31).
Vincent began Book 1 with images of tempestuous storms, cruel torture, and tyrannical oppression—images that obsessed and deeply disturbed his soul and the souls of his friends (EW 1112.36, 50–51, 56–57; EW 1112.53, 70–7; 1113.3–7, 21–2). Appropriately then, Antony repeatedly uses the images of sailing in storms or of riding spirited and powerful horses. Part of sailing is knowing when and how to lower the sails in a storm (EW 1123.7–9) and training oneself to deal with fear in the face of losing the ship when it is buffeted by winds (EW 1135.60–3, 1163.70–79, 1175.6–12). Part of guiding powerful horses is learning how to use bridle and bit (EW 1232.71–4), just as one learns to discipline the temperament of one’s own soul (EW 1168.24–30, 1175.71–1176.13).
Ultimately Antony helps Vincent see and appreciate the indispensable roles played by reason in tempering the soul by coming to learn and maintain those habits necessary for reason to rule. But self-knowledge also reveals the limits of fallible reason and therefore the need for it to be supported by prayer and grace—a topic treated again in More’s final book, The Sadness and Weariness and Fear and Prayer of Christ.
Vincent (whose name means “he who conquers”) ends A Dialogue of Comfort by resolving to transform his affections from love of earthly goods to spiritual goods. To do so, he not only writes down Antony’s counsels in Hungarian but also translates them into multiple languages to imprint them in his mind and imagination, working to fulfill Antony’s requirement of “sufficient minding” (EW 1241.60).
More was imprisoned for the last sixteen months of his life and was executed for high treason on 6 July 1535. His last works and days put to the test his earlier theory of philosophy as a preparation for death. How theory and practice aligned in his life and thought is part of the intrigue of studying this Renaissance figure whom Erasmus described as a “man for all seasons”.
A. Primary Sources
Most citations are to The Essential Works of Thomas More [EW], which is cross-referenced to the fifteen volumes of The Complete Works of St. Thomas More [CW].
More’s execution discouraged publication of his work; in the Catholic interim under Mary I, however, his nephew William Rastell edited the vernacular writings, The Works of Sir Thomas More in the Englysh tonge, London, 1557 (reprinted with an introduction by K. J. Wilson, Menston: Scolar Press, 1978). His Latin works, Opera omnia, were printed at Louvain in 1565 and 1566, and at Frankfurt in 1689. Except for his complete correspondence, More’s extant works are now available in the Yale edition, which provides authoritative texts with comprehensive introductory material and annotation. Many of More’s letters were edited by Elizabeth F. Rogers in 1947, but she did not include his exchanges with Erasmus; for these the reader must consult Opus epistolarum Des. Erasmi Roterodami, ed. P.S. Allen et al., 12 vols., Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1906–58, or the correspondence volumes in the Toronto Collected Works of Erasmus. Rogers published in 1960 (revised in 1967) More’s Selected Letters—all these and fifty others by More are in EW. A critical edition of More’s correspondence (some 280 letters) was planned for Yale University’s Complete Works, but has not yet been completed.
Abbreviated citations used in the entry are given below.
- [CW] The Complete Works of St. Thomas More, 15
vols., New Haven, CT/London: Yale University Press, 1963–97:
- Volume 1: English Poems, Life of Pico, The Last Things. Edited by Anthony S.G. Edwards, Clarence H. Miller and Katherine Gardiner Rodgers. 1997.
- Volume 2: The History of King Richard III. Edited by R.S. Sylvester. 1963.
- Volume 3, Part 1: Translations of Lucian. Edited by Craig R. Thompson. 1974.
- Volume 3, Part 2: Latin Poems. Edited by Clarence H. Miller, Leicester Bradner, Charles A. Lynch and Revilo P. Oliver. 1984.
- Volume 4: Utopia. Edited by Edward Surtz, S.J., and J.H. Hexter. 1965.
- Volume 5: Responsio ad Lutherum. Edited by John Headley. 1969. Selections from this are available online: A Response to Luther, Book 1 (pdf) and A Response to Luther, Book 2 (pdf)
- Volume 6: Parts I & II, A Dialogue Concerning Heresies. Edited by Thomas M.C. Lawler, G. Marc’hadour and R.C. Marius. 1981.
- Volume 7: Letter to Bugenhagen, Supplication of Souls, Letter against Frith. Edited by Frank Manley, Clarence H. Miller, and R.C. Marius. 1990.
- Volume 8, Parts I–III: The Confutation of Tyndale’s Answer. Edited by Louis A. Schuster, R.C. Marius, and James P. Lusardi. 1973. A selection from this is available online: The Confutations of Tyndale’s Answer: Books 5–9 (pdf)
- Volume 9: The Apology. Edited by J.B. Trapp. 1979.
- Volume 10: The Debellation of Salem and Bizance. Edited by John Guy, Clarence H. Miller, and Ralph Keen. 1988. A selection from this is available online: The Debellation of Salem and Bizance (pdf)
- Volume 11: The Answer to a Poisoned Book. Edited by Clarence H. Miller and Stephen M. Foley. 1985.
- Volume 12: A Dialogue of Comfort against Tribulation. Edited by Louis L. Martz and Frank Manley. 1976.
- Volume 13: Treatise on the Passion, Treatise on the Blessed Body, Instructions and Prayers. Edited by Garry E. Haupt. 1976.
- Volume 14: De tristitia Christi. Edited by Clarence H. Miller. 1976.
- Volume 15: In Defense of Humanism: Letters to Dorp, Oxford, Lee, and a Monk; Historia Richardi Tertii. Edited by Daniel Kinney. 1986.
- [Corr.] The Correspondence of Sir Thomas More. Edited by E. F. Rogers, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press. 1947; contains or lists 218 of More’s 280 letters.
- [EW] The Essential Works of Thomas More. Edited by Gerard B. Wegemer and Stephen W. Smith. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 2020; contains 20 of More’s books in full, 106 of his letters in English, and his 291 poems. doi:10.12987/9780300249415
- [SL] St. Thomas More: Selected Letters. Edited by E.F. Rogers, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1961, 1967 (revised edition); contains 66 letters, including English translations of the Latin letters.
- [CWE] Collected Works of Erasmus, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1974–.
B. Selected Editions of More’s Works
- The History of King Richard the Third. Edited by George M. Logan, Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2005.
- Sir Thomas More: Neue Briefe. Edited by Hubertus Schulte Herbrüggen, Münster: Aschendorff, 1966. 22 letters, most not contained in Rogers’ 1947 Correspondence, some newly discovered.
- The Last Letters of Thomas More. Edited by Alvaro de Silva, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 2000.
- L’Utopie de Thomas More. Edited by André Prevost, Paris: Mame, 1978. Latin and French texts, with extensive commentary.
- Utopia: Latin Text and English Translation. Edited by George M. Logan, Robert M. Adams, and Clarence Miller, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995. Cited here as the most reliable bilingual text in print.
- Utopia. Translation and introduction by Dominic Baker-Smith, London: Penguin Books, 2012.
C. Contemporary Biographies
- Erasmus, Desiderius, Letters 999, 1233, 2750 in EW 1369-1380 and CWE volumes 7, 8, 19.
- Harpsfield, Nicholas, The Life of and Death of Sir Thomas More (c. 1559). Edited by E.V. Hitchcock, London: Oxford University Press, 1932.
- More, Cresacre, The Life and Death of Sir Thomas More (c. 1631). Edited by J. Hunter, London: William Pickering, 1828.
- Pace, Richard, De fructu qui ex doctrina percipitur (The Benefit of a Liberal Education) (1517). Edited by Frank Manley and Richard S. Sylvester, New York: Frederick Unger Publishing, 1967.
- Roper, William, The Lyfe of Sir Thomas More (c. 1557). Edited by E.V. Hitchcock, London: Oxford University Press, 1935.
- Stapleton, Thomas, The Life of Sir Thomas More (Part 3 of Tres Thomae, 1588). Translated by Philip E. Hallett, London: Burns Oates and Washbourne, 1928.
D. Biographical Studies
- Ackroyd, Peter, 1998, The Life of Thomas More, London: Chatto and Windus.
- Baker House, Seymour, 2008, “More, Sir Thomas (1478–1535)”, in Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Chambers, R. W., 1935, Thomas More, London: Jonathan Cape.
- Fox, Alastair, 1982, Thomas More: History and Providence, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
- Guy, J. A., 1980, The Public Career of Sir Thomas More, Brighton: Harvester Press.
- –––, 2000, Thomas More, London: Arnold.
- –––, 2008, A Daughter’s Love: Thomas More and Margaret More, London: Fourth Estate.
- –––, 2017, Thomas More: A Very Brief History, London: SPCK Publishing.
- Marius, Richard, 1984, Thomas More: A Biography, New York: Knopf.
- Martz, Louis L., 1990, Thomas More: The Search for the Inner Man, New Haven, CT/London: Yale University Press.
- Phélippeau, Marie-Claire, 2016, Thomas More, Paris: Gallimard. In French.
- Paul, Joanne, 2017, Thomas More, Cambridge: Polity.
E. Greek and Latin Writers Cited
- Augustine, The City of God, edited and translated by R. W. Dyson, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013.
- –––, The Trinity, translated by Edmund Hill, New York: New City Press, 1991.
- Henry VIII, Assertio Septem Sacramentorum or Defence of the Seven Sacrament, edited by Louis O’Donovan, New York: Benziger Brothers, 1908.
- Plato, The Collected Dialogues of Plato, edited by Edith
Hamilon and Huntington Cairns, Princeton, NJ: Princton University
Press, 1985. Includes:
- Phaedo, 40–98,
- Philebus, 1086–1150.
- Plutarch, “Life of Solon”, in Plutarch’s Lives, volume 1, translated by John Dryden, New York: Modern Library, 2001, 106–28.
F. Selected Secondary Studies
- Adams, Robert P., 1962, The Better Part of Valor: More, Erasmus, Colet, and Vives on Humanism, War, and Peace, 1496–1535, Seattle, WA: University of Washington Press.
- Baker, David, 1993, “First Among Equals: The Utopian Princeps”, Moreana, 30(115–116/3–4): 33–45. doi:10.3366/more.1993.30.3-4.6
- Baker, David Weil, 1999, Divulging Utopia: Radical Humanism in Sixteenth-Century England, Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts Press.
- Baker-Smith, Dominic, 1991 , More’s “Utopia”, London/New York: Harper Collins; reprint Toronto/Buffalo, NY: University of Toronto Press, 2000.
- –––, 1994, “Uses of Plato by Erasmus and More”, in Platonism and the English Imagination, Anna Baldwin and Sarah Hutton (eds.), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 86–99. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511553806.010
- Barron, Caroline M., 2011, “The Making of a London Citizen”, in Logan 2011: 1–21. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521888622.002
- Betteridge, Thomas, 2013, Writing Faith and Telling Tales: Literature, Politics, and Religion in the Work of Thomas More, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Bolchazy, Ladislaus J., Gregory Gichan, and Frederick Theobald, 1978, A Concordance to the “Utopia” of St. Thomas More, Hildesheim/New York: G. Olms.
- Bradshaw, Brendan, 1991, “Transalpine Humanism”, in The Cambridge History of Political Thought 1450–1700, J. H. Burns (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 95–131. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521247160.006
- Brooks, Veronica, 2021, “The Political Theory of Thomas More’s Epigrammata”, Moreana, 58(2): 188–205. doi:10.3366/more.2021.0103
- Cave, Terence (ed.), 2008, Thomas More’s “Utopia” in Early Modern Europe: Paratexts and Contexts, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
- Cormack, Bradin, 2007, A Power to Do Justice: Jurisdiction, English Literature, and the Rise of Common Law, 1509–1625, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Cousins, A. D. and Damian Grace (eds.), 2009, A Companion to Thomas More, Madison, NJ: Fairleigh Dickinson University Press.
- Curtis, Catherine, 2006a, “’The Best State of the Commonwealth’: Thomas More and Quentin Skinner”, in Rethinking the Foundations of Modern Political Thought, Annabel Brett and James Tully (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 93–112.
- –––, 2006b, “From Sir Thomas More to Robert Burton: The Laughing Philosopher in the Early Modern Period”, in The Philosopher in Early Modern Europe, Conal Condren, Stephen Gaukroger, and Ian Hunter (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 90–112. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511490460.005
- –––, 2011, “More’s Public Life”, in Logan 2011: 69–92. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521888622.005
- Curtright, Travis, 2012, The One Thomas More, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
- Duffy, Eamon, 2017, Reformation Divided: Catholics, Protestants and the Conversion of England, London/New York: Bloomsbury.
- Duncan, Douglas, 1979, “More”, in Ben Jonson and the Lucianic Tradition, London: Cambridge University Press, 52–76.
- Fleisher, Martin, 1973, Radical Reform and Political Persuasion in the Life and Writings of Thomas More, Geneva: Droz.
- Gardiner Rodgers, Katherine, 2011, “The Lessons Of Gethsemane: De Tristitia Christi”, in Logan 2011: 239–262. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521888622.013
- Gentrup, William and Elizabeth McCutcheon (eds.), 2022, A Companion to Margaret More Studies: Life Records, Essential Texts, and Critical Essays, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
- Gogan, Brian, 1982, The Common Corps of Christendom: Ecclesiological Themes in the Writings of Sir Thomas More, Leiden: Brill.
- Goldhill, Simon, 2002, Who Needs Greek? Contests in the Cultural History of Hellenism, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Greenblatt, Stephen, 1980, Renaissance Self-Fashioning: From More to Shakespeare, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
- Hexter, J. H., 1952, More’s “Utopia”: The Biography of an Idea, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Jones, Sarah Rees, 2001, “Thomas More’s Utopia and Medieval London”, in Pragmatic Utopias: Ideals and Communities, 1200–1630, Rosemary Horrox and Sarah Rees Jones (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 117–135.
- Kaufman, Peter Iver, 2007, Incorrectly Political: Augustine and Thomas More, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Kelly, Henry Ansgar, Louis W. Karlin, and Gerard Wegemer (eds.), 2011, Thomas More’s Trial by Jury: A Procedural and Legal Review with a Collection of Documents, Woodbridge, Suffolk/Rochester, NY: Boydell Press.
- Kinney, Daniel, 1981, “More’s Letter to Dorp: Remapping the Trivium”, Renaissance Quarterly, 34(2): 179–210. doi:10.2307/2860780
- Koterski, Joseph W., 2010, “Circe’s Beasts and the Image of God: More’s Creative Appropriation of Pico’s Humanist Spirituality”, Moreana, 47(179–180/1–2): 45–62. doi:10.3366/more.2010.47.1-2.5
- Lehman, Jeffrey S., 2013, “Seeing Tyranny in More’s History of King Richard III”, Moreana, 50(191–192/1–2): 131–157. doi:10.3366/more.2013.50.1-2.8
- Logan, George M., 1983, The Meaning of More’s “Utopia”, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- ––– (ed.), 2011, The Cambridge Companion to
Thomas More, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
[This includes valuable bibliographical information.]
- McConica, James, 2011, “Thomas More as Humanist”, in Logan 2011: 22–45. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521888622.003
- –––, 1981, “The Patrimony of Thomas More”, in History & Imagination: Essays in Honor of H.R. Trevor-Roper, Hugh Lloyd-Jones, Valerie Pearl, and Blair Worden (eds), New York: Holmes & Meier Publishers, 56–71.
- McCutcheon, Elizabeth, 1971, “Denying the Contrary: More’s Use of Litotes in the Utopia”, Moreana, 8(31–32/3–4): 106–121. doi:10.3366/more.1971.8.3-4.14
- –––, 1983, My Dear Peter: The “Ars Poetica” and Hermeneutics for More’s “Utopia”, Angers: Moreanum.
- –––, 2011, “More’s Rhetoric”, in Logan 2011: 46–68. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521888622.004
- –––, 2022, “‘A Young, Virtuous, and Well-Learned Gentlewoman’: Margaret More Roper in the Republic of Letters”, in Gentrup and McCutcheon 2022: 123–157.
- McCutcheon, R. R., 1993, “Heresy and Dialogue: The Humanist Approaches of Erasmus and More”, Viator, 24: 357–384. doi:10.1484/J.VIATOR.2.301254
- Majeske, Andrew J., 2006, Equity in English Renaissance Literature: Thomas More and Edmund Spenser, (Literary Criticism and Cultural Theory), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203959985
- Marc’hadour, Germain, 1969, The Bible in the Works of Thomas More, 5 volumes, Nieuwkoop, Netherlands: B. De Graaf
- Mehan, Matthew, 2018, “Senecan Sententiae in Sir Thomas More”, Moreana, 55(210/2): 127–149. doi:10.3366/more.2018.0039
- Mitjans, Frank, 2023, Thomas More’s Vocation, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
- Mock, Carle, 2011, “The Structure, Design, and Argument of Thomas More’s Fortune Verses”, Moreana, 48(185–186/3–4): 69–120. doi:10.3366/more.2011.48.3-4.6
- Nelson, Eric, 2004, The Greek Tradition in Republican Thought, (Ideas in Context 69), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511490644
- Renner, Bernd, 2018, “‘Real versus ideal’: Utopia and the Early Modern Satirical Tradition”, Renaissance and Reformation, 42(3): 47–66.
- Schön, Katharina-Maria, 2022, “Tamquam alter Lucianus: The Lucianic Legacy in Thomas More’s Utopia”, Moreana, 59(2): 165–192. doi:10.3366/more.2022.0124
- Skinner, Quentin, 1987, “Sir Thomas More’s Utopia and the Language of Renaissance Humanism”, in The Languages of Political Theory in Early-Modern Europe, Anthony Pagden (ed.), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 123–158. Reprinted as “Thomas More’s Vision of True Nobility”, in his Visions of Politics, 3 vols, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, vol. 2, pp. 213–44. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511521447.008
- –––, 1988, “Political Philosophy”, in The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy, C. B. Schmitt, Quentin Skinner, Eckhard Kessler, and Jill Kraye (eds), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 387–452. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521251044.014
- Sowards, J. K., 1989, “On Education: More’s Debt to Erasmus”, Moreana, 26(100/1): 103–123. doi:10.3366/more.1918.104.22.168
- Sylvester, Richard S., 1967, “A Part of His Own: Thomas More’s Literary Personality in His Early Works”, Moreana, 4(15–16/3–4): 29–42. doi:10.3366/more.1967.4.3-4.7
- Sylvester, R. S. and G. P. Marc’hadour (eds.), 1977, Essential Articles for the Study of Thomas More, Hamden, CT: Archon Books.
- Wegemer, Gerard B., 1996, Thomas More on Statesmanship, Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
- –––, 2011, Young Thomas More and the Arts of Liberty, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511921834
The journal Moreana (1963– ) is published biannually by the Association Amici Thomae Mori and contains much important material.
G. Bibliographic Studies
- Boswell, Jackson Campbell, 1994, Sir Thomas More in the English Renaissance: An Annotated Catalogue, Binghampton, NY: Medieval and Renaissance Texts and Studies
- Geritz, Albert J., 2000, Thomas More: An Annotated Bibliography of Criticism, 1935–1997, Westport, CT: Greenwood Press
- Gibson, R. W., 1961, St. Thomas More: A Preliminary Bibliography of His Works and of Moreana to the Year 1750, New Have, CT: Yale University Press
- Smith, Constance, 1981, An Updating of R. W. Gibson’s St. Thomas More: A Preliminary Bibliography, St. Louis, MO: Center for Reformation Research
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Baker-Smith, Dominic, “Thomas More”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2023 Edition), Edward N. Zalta & Uri Nodelman (eds.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2023/entries/thomas-more/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy – see the version history.]
- Center for Thomas More Studies at the University of Dallas. This site includes online texts, documents, and concordances to More’s writings.
- Lakowski, R.I. “A Bibliography of Thomas More’s Utopia”, Early Modern Literary Studies, 1.2 (1995)
- National Portrait Gallery, London, Portraits of Thomas More