Thomas More (1478–1535) was an English lawyer, humanist, statesman, and Catholic martyr, whose paradoxical life is reflected in his contrasting titles: he was knighted by King Henry VIII in 1521 and canonized by Pope Pius XI in 1935. Born to an affluent mercantile and professional family, he was representative of the lively intellectual culture which had evolved in fifteenth century London and which provided a platform for the early manifestations of humanism. More's outlook was shaped by his legal role in the affairs of the city, then by far the largest in England with a population of about 50,000, and it was as a representative of city interests that he was first drawn into service of the Crown. This involvement with London's civic life also played its part in the conception of Utopia, his best known work, completed in 1516. His friendship with the Dutch scholar Desiderius Erasmus lasted over thirty years and was crucial to the development of his own ideas on literary studies, in particular the revival of Greek, and on the social possibilities of education. It was thanks to Erasmus that he was drawn into the literary networks of Northern humanism. While More cannot be classified in any formal sense as a philosopher, it is in his writings in defence of humanism and in Utopia that he can best be seen as an exponent of ideas. In the early years of their association More and Erasmus shared a critical interest in exposing the follies and abuses of contemporary life, not least in matters of religious practice; but once More was drawn into the savage polemics of the early Reformation he defended Catholic orthodoxy with all the weapons at his disposal. However, his efforts were compromised by a shift in government policy. His conscientious refusal to support King Henry's campaign to repudiate his marriage to Katherine of Aragon led to his retirement from public life and, ultimately, to imprisonment. During fourteen months in the Tower he wrote a number of devotional works which are in contrast to the severity of his polemical writings. Tried for treason, More was beheaded on 6 July 1535. His death caused widespread indignation on the Continent, where he was initially seen as a model of integrity, a Seneca-like counsellor who resisted a tyrannical ruler. His status as a Catholic martyr emerged later under the influence of the English Counter-Reformation.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. The Theatre of Politics
- 3. The Defence of Humanism
- 4. Utopia
- 5. Reformation Polemics
- 6. Prison Writings
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Life and Works
On the title-page of Utopia Thomas More identifies himself as a citizen of the renowned city of London. The city, with its privileges and corporate procedures, was central to his formation and to the style of his political thought. Born in Milk Street, Cripplegate, in February 1478, he was the son of a successful barrister, John More. Thomas began his education at St Anthony's, the outstanding grammar school in the city, but around 1490 he was placed as a page in the household of Cardinal John Morton, Archbishop of Canterbury and Lord Chancellor. Morton was evidently struck by More's talents since after two years he was sent on to Oxford, perhaps to Canterbury College. It was probably never intended that he should take a degree, but he must have received some grounding in the subjects of the trivium (grammar, dialectic, rhetoric). Morton, who died in 1500, would remain a figure of personal significance to More, appearing both in Richard III (in his earlier office as bishop of Ely) and in Utopia, where he serves as the figure of a wise and flexible statesman.
An important source for More's biography is the letter that Erasmus wrote to Ulrich von Hutten in 1519 (CWE 7: Ep. 999), but it needs to be treated with caution. Erasmus had his own agenda, and he is largely responsible for the idea that John More dragged his reluctant son into a legal career. In fact, there is a marked consistency about Thomas's early career, and it seems that he successfully balanced his humanist interests with commitment to the law. After two years at Oxford, he returned to London, initially studying at New Inn, before he was admitted to Lincoln's Inn in 1496. When Erasmus arrived on his first visit to England in 1499, he reacted with enthusiasm to the intellectual atmosphere he encountered and lists four new acquaintances, John Colet, William Grocyn, Thomas Linacre, and Thomas More (CWE 1: Ep. 118). A common feature of this group is their interest in Greek studies; moreover, all of them, apart from More, had travelled in Italy. It is possible that More had picked up some Greek in Oxford: Grocyn returned there in 1491 after a period of study in Florence and had given the first Greek lectures in the university, but he moved in 1496 to London, where More would have had easy access to his teaching. In any case, Thomas Linacre, who had shared Grocyn's studies in Florence, returned to England in 1499, and More mentions reading Aristotle's Meteorologica under his guidance. The acquisition of competence in Greek was of profound importance in More's intellectual development, and it provided the basis for his collaboration with Erasmus. It was in the course of the latter's visit to England in 1505 that they agreed to translate works by the Greek satirist Lucian of Samosata into Latin, and their combined efforts were printed at Paris in the following year. More was an instinctive ironist and clearly responded to Lucian's exposure of human self-deception; this works not only on the level of private delusion but also on the broader level of cultural convention. More even invokes Lucian as an antidote to the superstitious fables which so easily distort Christian belief and might even mislead such an authoritative figure as St Augustine (CWM 3:1,5).
In 1501 More completed his legal studies and qualified as a barrister. It was also the year in which he delivered a course of lectures on Augustine's City of God in Grocyn's church of St Lawrence Jewry. We have no record of what these contained, though Thomas Stapleton in Tres Thomae (1588) claims that he treated the work more from the standpoint of history and philosophy than theology. Augustine would remain central to More's thinking, yet, in his 1515 letter to Martin Dorp, he takes the opportunity to criticize the saint's view on the corporeality of demons:
Being a man, he could make a mistake. I take his word as seriously as anyone's, but I take no man's word unconditionally. (CWM 15: 69)
Such an approach to religious authority is evidence of More's adherence to the critical standards of humanism. His ability to combine an interest in the academic study of law (he was acting as Lent Reader at Lincoln's Inn as late as 1514), together with Greek and patristic studies, while pursuing an increasingly busy legal career, is remarkable. In his prefatory letter to Utopia, he gives a humorous account of the pressures that have hindered completion of the work, but it seems that this demanding routine must have been his normal pattern of life. Prior to his marriage in 1505, More reportedly lived in the Charterhouse, presumably in the guest lodgings, an association that has led to conjectures about his attraction to the monastic life, or at least to the priesthood. Erasmus has not helped here since he uses More as an example of one who, having tested himself for a religious vocation, could not shake off the idea of marriage: “And so he chose to be a god-fearing husband rather than an immoral priest” (CWE 7: Ep. 999, p. 21). Modern scholarship has sometimes seen More as a “spoiled monk”, yet there is a striking unity of purpose about More's early life; he could find a rationale for the combination of private study and prayer with public business in the ideal presented in the Epistle on Mixed Life by the Augustinian canon Walter Hilton (d. 1396), whose writings he recommends. Describing a life which balances spiritual culture with action in the world, Hilton applies it to those laymen who possess both material wealth and authority over others, “to govern and sustain them”. The New Building which More would later erect on his Chelsea estate contained a chapel, a library and a gallery and, according to William Roper, More's son-in-law, he would withdraw to it regularly, “to be solitary, and sequester himself from worldly company” (Roper 1935: 25). This sounds more like Hilton's ideal than some form of monastic nostalgia.
Meanwhile, More's legal career in the city flourished, and in 1504 he was returned as a Member of Parliament. It was in the course of this Parliament that Henry VII's demand for a retrospective subsidy to cover the expenses of his daughter's marriage to James IV of Scotland was rejected, and Roper attributes this substantially to More's intervention. It is unlikely that the affair reached quite the pitch of drama that Roper suggests, but it does fit with the hostile view of Henry VII's fiscal policies which More reveals both in his Latin poem celebrating Henry VIII's coronation (CWM 3:2, no. 19), and implicitly in Utopia. Early in the following year, he married Jane Colt and moved into the Old Barge, Bucklersbury, a residence large enough to permit a flow of guests; among them was Erasmus, who arrived in August 1509, full of anticipation of patronage under the new king and carrying in his head the initial idea for The Praise of Folly. Under its Latin title Encomium Moriae, this punned on More's name, “which is as close in form to Moria (Folly) as you are in fact remote from folly itself” (CWE 2: Ep. 222, p. 161); and once Erasmus had completed it under More's roof, he dedicated it to his friend, whom he compares to Democritus, the laughing philosopher. Certainly More's sardonic laughter found its way into his Latin epigrams, many of which must date from these years; but a more solemn undertaking was the translation of the biography of the syncretist philosopher Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494) by his nephew Gianfrancesco, which would seem to date from about this time. Stapleton suggests that More settled on Pico as a model of the lay intellectual, though Pico's retired life might seem the obverse of More's public engagement. More's aim in the Life of Pico was not simply to provide an English translation of Gianfrancesco's text but to modify it for his own ends; so a substantial part of the original is cut, most notably the parts dealing with Pico's more exotic intellectual interests and controversies, and out of forty-seven letters printed by Gianfrancesco only three are retained. Rather than justifying Pico's highly individual career, More is concerned to sketch the outline of an edifying life: in effect, Pico's conversion from the early arrogance with which he had proposed to defend his nine hundred Conclusiones against all comers to a career of selfless scholarship, dedicated to “the love of God and the profit of his church”. To this end Pico disposed of his patrimony and lands to his nephew so cheaply that “it seemed rather a gift than a sale”, and also distanced himself from the distractions of public life in order to preserve his independence (CWM 1, 63–4). These are the very characteristics that will later reappear in the figure of Raphael, the wandering philosopher who is our guide to the island of Utopia. Of the three letters which More translates, that to Andrea Corneo is the most important, dealing as it does with the social role of philosophy. Corneo has urged Pico to put his studies to use in “the civil and active life”, but to Pico this compromises the integrity of the philosopher; he is prepared to tolerate something tantamount to the mixed life in which contemplation and action are reconciled, but he maintains the superiority of a life free of any dependence on external recognition. Philosophers, he concludes, cannot serve: “They dwell with them self, and be content with the tranquillity of their own mind” (CWM 1, 87). We can see More here putting down markers that will later shape the dispute about philosophy and the public sphere which surfaces in Utopia.
However the year 1510, which saw the Life of Pico in print, offered More little scope for tranquil retirement. He was heavily engaged in London affairs, representing the city in Henry VIII's first Parliament, and in September he became one of its two Undersheriffs, the office by which he identifies himself on the title-page of Utopia. As Undersheriff, he was responsible for providing legal advice to senior officers of the corporation, but in particular for presiding over the Sheriff's court; it was, in fact, a key post that placed him at the heart of the city's life and at the same time gave him a vivid sense of the social problems played out before the courts. The urgency of his obligations may well explain the haste of his remarriage: his wife Jane, who had borne him four children, died in June 1511, and allegedly within a month he had married Alice Middleton, the widow of a fellow member of the Mercers' Company. More had to consider not only his children but also the management of his substantial household: among its occasional lodgers were counted Erasmus and also Andrea Ammonio, who became Latin secretary to the king in 1511. The evidence points to some intellectual intimacy between these friends, and this takes on special interest in light of the new king's warlike conduct. Fired by the example of his illustrious predecessor Henry V, the victor of Agincourt, Henry VIII had entered into the Holy League, instigated by Pope Julius II against France, and prepared to attack England's traditional enemy. When Henry invaded France in 1513 Ammonio accompanied him and sent back accounts of the campaign which are echoed in Erasmus's own exposure of martial glory in the adage “Dulce bellum inexpertis”, one of the most widely circulated anti-war tracts ever written (CWE 35: 399–440). More's immediate response was limited to a handful of epigrams, the most effective being a cluster (CWM 3:2, nos. 188–195) which ridicule the Chordigera, a pretentious mini-epic by the French humanist Germain de Brie that celebrates the deeds of a French naval commander. More objects to the way epic convention is used to mask the brutal realities of war (the commander was incinerated in his burning ship); like Erasmus, he aims to discredit those cultural idols which promote militarism. The full impact of his response to the events of 1513 only emerges later in the war practices of the Utopians, whose objective approach to conflict leaves no room for spurious concepts of glory. When Erasmus left England in July 1514, he took with him the thoughts, and probably the drafts, that would provide major additions to the 1515 Adagia, the so-called “Utopian edition”. These dealt not only with war but equally with the dangers of absolute rule: the Lucianic discussions at the Old Barge had stimulated a radical critique of established social forms.
Ironically, it was in that year of 1515 that More was first drawn into the service of the Crown. According to Roper, his talents had been spotted, probably by Cardinal Wolsey, when he appeared in Star Chamber as counsel for the papal ambassador in a case of an impounded cargo. In May he was dispatched to Bruges, along with Cuthbert Tunstall and others, to renegotiate English trading agreements with the Netherlands, then under threat. More would have been included not only for his competence in mercantile law but also as a representative of London interests. It was to prove an extended visit, and he did not return to England until the end of October. Since the negotiations were temporarily suspended in July, this gave him ample leisure to travel and to embark on two of his most important writings, the Utopia and the letter addressed to Martin Dorp in defence of literary studies. His travels took him to Mechelen, where he enjoyed the hospitality of Jerôme de Busleyden and wrote complimentary epigrams on his house and his collection of antique coins, and also to Tournai, then under English occupation; but the most significant encounter was with Pieter Gillis at Antwerp. Gillis (c. 1486–1533), a valued friend of Erasmus, was secretary to the corporation of Antwerp: as a lawyer-humanist holding office in a largely independent mercantile city, he had a natural affinity with More, and it was while visiting him that More's most famous work began. Utopia, or to give it its full title De optimo reipublicae statu deque nova insula Utopia (“On the Best State of a Commonwealth and on the New Island of Utopia”), begins with a chance encounter after divine service in the cathedral, a device that may be intended to recall the opening of Plato's Republic. More and Gillis, together with the wandering philosopher, Raphael Hythlodaeus, agree to retire to the garden of More's lodging in order to pursue their conversation. While this is initially concerned with Raphael's travels, it soon switches to the issue of political engagement. Raphael justifies his refusal to enter the service of a prince by a scathing exposure of European institutions and customs. In justifying this stance, he appeals to the wise and effective institutions of the Utopians, grounded as these are on community of possessions. Pressed by his companions, Raphael then provides a detailed description of the island and its social arrangements, concluding with a withering attack on the injustices of Europe and its money-driven society. As the book ends and the fictional More leads his guests into supper, he shares with the reader a mixed response to the challenging features of Utopian life.
Erasmus, in his letter to von Hutten, asserts that More wrote Utopia in two stages: “The second book he had written earlier, when at leisure; at a later opportunity he added the first in the heat of the moment.” Quite what prompted the genesis of the book is unknown, but the fact that Gillis appears as one of the fictional speakers suggests that it may have been initiated by conversations at his house. It also makes sense to suppose that the actual description of an imaginary island came first, when More had leisure to explore the possibilities of a society exempt from the inherited pressures and distortions of the European world. This accounts for Raphael's extensive description of Utopian life which takes up most of Book 2, and yet this solo performance is set within the context of conversational exchange in an Antwerp garden. It seems likely that this containing dialogue, which forms Book 1 and the closing paragraphs of Book 2, was written later, probably after More's return to London. J. H. Hexter, who has offered the most persuasive account of the composition of the work, even argues for two distinct intentions within it: the original intention of projecting a society based on community of goods; and a secondary one concerned with the reception of philosophical ideals within the political community. The latter issue had been raised by Plato, notably at Republic 592A–B where a crucial distinction is drawn between the city of the philosopher's birth and that other city “whose home is in words, for I think it can be found nowhere on earth”. Up until its actual publication, More referred to his book as Nusquama, the Latin for “nowhere”; the Greek title Utopia, “no place”, was a late intervention, perhaps by Erasmus, who saw the book through the press.
More returned to England at the end of October, but not before writing his lengthy epistle to the Louvain theologian Martin Dorp. Ostensibly a defence of Erasmus and his philological approach to the biblical text, this offers an important statement of humanist ideals, highly critical of the artificial linguistic universe generated by scholastic dialectic and insistent on the priority of Greek, “since it is from Greek that the rest of mankind has received every variety of knowledge”. Evidently the months More spent in the Netherlands had been stimulating and productive: he had established his credentials among the Northern humanists and, as he departed for England, he took with him the draft description of Utopia. Yet, as his prefatory letter to Gillis indicates, he had little leisure in which to continue with it: while heavily engaged with city commitments he was also drawn into court business—as Andrea Ammonio reported: “None bids my lord of York [Wolsey] good morrow earlier than he” (CWE 3: Ep. 389, p.239). This makes it all the more significant that the opening book of Utopia is concerned with issues of political practice within the identifiable world of Europe. The whole framework which encloses Raphael's account of the extraordinary island, the conversation of friends in an Antwerp garden, is focused on the tension between the received order and political idealism. Should one stand aloof like Raphael, rejecting the city of one's birth, or try to modify it in light of the ideal as More's fictional-self attempts to argue? In the late summer of 1516 Erasmus visited London, and this may well have prompted More to complete the book; in any case, More sent the final text to him in the autumn, and it was printed at Louvain in December, with minor additions by Erasmus and Gillis.
The one other work of a specifically political character which More wrote was The History of King Richard the Third, alternatively the Historia Richardi Tertii since it was written in both English and Latin versions. Indeed, More appears to have worked on the two concurrently, and neither is a simple translation of the other. The Historia concludes with the coronation of the usurper Richard, while the History continues with the murder of his nephews and breaks off in mid-flight as Bishop Morton, later More's own mentor, tries to turn the Duke of Buckingham against the king. No part of the work was published in More's lifetime, and even the period of its composition is obscure. It seems likely that More worked at it, on and off, over a period of years, conceivably between 1513 and 1520, when his humanist interests were dominant. While he had access to first-hand informants, it is clear that the intention is rather to enact a moral point than to provide an exact chronicle, and this gives it a certain affinity with Utopia. Both works show a concern with social pathology: by what means can a state be corrupted? Although the period of Richard III covers the years of More's early childhood, the most important influences on his writing are the Roman historians Tacitus and Sallust. The latter, in particular, would have interested More, not least because Augustine in the City of God praises his analysis of the moral collapse of the Roman Republic. Sallusts's account of the conduct of the Roman patriciate reveals a comparable process of institutional subversion to that described in More's history, where the driving forces are divisive faction and the “pestilent serpent ambition”. In the Latin text the words used, “execrabilis belua superbia”, match those of Raphael in the Utopia: as he concludes his catalogue of the injustices of European society, it is pride, superbia, “the origin and begetter of all plagues”, which Raphael sees as the ultimate obstacle to social justice. Flattery and deception pervade the action and erode all forms of social trust. At the end of the English text, even Morton, in so many ways More's model prelate, shows moral ambivalence as he incites the Duke of Buckingham to rebel against Richard. Various explanations have been proffered as to why More left the work unfinished—it seems unlikely that pressure of work would have been the sole cause. Clearly such a recent history would be liable to offend certain of his contemporaries, and its negative exposure of public affairs would jar with his own increasing involvement in government business. It offers little scope for the kind of ameliorative participation in the political order that More's fictional self tries to defend in Utopia.
Nonetheless, More was drawn into the royal service, and his membership of the Council was confirmed by March 1518. Apart from his practical abilities, he seems to have appealed to the king as a prestigious figure, a court intellectual: even as he entered the Council, the third edition of Utopia was printed by Johann Froben at Basel, along with his Epigrams, in a volume which confirmed More's continental reputation. At the same time, he made a series of interventions in favour of Greek and of Erasmus's educational innovations. The “Letter to the University of Oxford” is addressed from Abingdon, where the itinerant court was resident; its aim is to discredit the self-styled Trojans who are resisting the introduction of liberal studies (CWM 15, 133). The “Letter to Edward Lee” was part of a wider, and unsuccessful, effort to persuade Lee, who later became archbishop of York, from publishing his hostile criticisms of Erasmus' New Testament, and it contains More's most vehement endorsement of his friend's efforts which, he asserts, have done more for secular and sacred learning “than virtually anyone else's exertions for the last several centuries” (CWM 15, 161). The most vitriolic of the letters is that addressed “to a monk”, tentatively identified by modern scholarship as John Batmanson, later prior of the London Charterhouse. In it More comes close to the spirit of the Praise of Folly, mocking at the presumption of cloistered religious who, “perched on a sunbeam, look down from the heights on the general populace creeping like ants on the ground…” (CWM 15, 279). It certainly shows him at his most anti-clerical, but the underlying theme is the importance of Greek, and consequently of Erasmus' contribution, to the renewal of theology. As things turned out, it would prove to be his last statement on the humanist curriculum.
Predictably, there has been some debate about More's reluctance to enter the court world—Erasmus insists that he was “dragged” into it—but there is a forward impetus in More's career which suggests that, while well aware of the dangers, he could also see it as an opportunity to realize the active element of Hilton's “mixed life”. It may have been on just such terms that he entered a world which he had previously satirized. Once in the Council, his duties were multifarious. As royal secretary up to 1525, he was the intermediary between the king and his chief minister Cardinal Wolsey, with whom he had close, though not cordial, relations. There were aspects of Wolsey's administration which he could endorse, among them the cardinal's efforts to improve access to justice, especially for the poor, and he was heavily engaged in the judicial functions of the Council, sitting in the Court of Requests and Star Chamber. Beyond his judicial duties, More was also employed as an “orator” in both of the current senses, delivering addresses of welcome to visiting dignitaries and serving as an ambassador. Given the mocking account of treaties in Utopia (CU: 197–201), it is unlikely that he was over-optimistic about their lasting effect, but he played a significant diplomatic role in the 1520s, participating in a number of important negotiations. He derived particular satisfaction from his part in the “Ladies' Peace” of Cambrai in 1529 which restored “a long-desired peace to the world”, since he mentions it in the inscription he devised for his own tomb (SL: p.181). His skills as a negotiator were clearly appreciated, and they found domestic applications as well: in 1523, after his election as Speaker of the Commons, he delivered a memorable plea to the king for the privilege of free speech in the House, while during the same session he obtained for the Crown a subsidy which the Commons had initially resisted. When Wolsey fell from favour in 1529 and More succeeded him as Lord Chancellor, he had presided over both Houses of Parliament.
Roper reports a conversation with his father-in-law in which More declared that he would gladly be thrown into the Thames in a sack if only three things could realized: that there should be peace between Christian princes, that turmoil in the church might be settled “in a perfect uniformity of religion”, and that the matter of the king's marriage might come to a good conclusion (Roper 1935: 24–5). If the peace of Cambrai might satisfy his first requirement, the two other issues would prove more problematic. In 1521, as Luther's challenge to the Catholic church gained momentum, King Henry published his Assertio septem sacramentorum, a statement of orthodoxy which won him the title Defender of the Faith from a grateful pope. More appears to have had some editorial role in this, and it marks the beginning of a new phase in his intellectual career, as an apologist for the Catholic faith. Thirteen years later, writing in his own defence to Thomas Cromwell, More would bitingly observe that his early doubts about the divine institution of papal primacy had been put at rest by the king himself (SL: p.212). Luther's response to the royal book was predictably offensive, and More was put forward to retaliate in kind; his Responsio ad Lutherum (1523) is a vigorous presentation of familiar arguments, without much evidence of engaging with Luther's thought. Basic to his argument is the appeal to tradition, understood as the unwritten deposit of teaching which precedes the Gospel texts and provides the matrix within which they must be interpreted. After his appointment as Chancellor of the Duchy of Lancaster in 1525, he was drawn directly into the campaign against the circulation of heretical books, and in 1528 his old colleague Tunstall, now bishop of London, commissioned him to respond to heretical books. This resulted in a daunting body of writings in the vernacular which extends from A Dialogue Concerning Heresies in 1529 to The Answer to a Poisoned Book in 1534, and some of its aspects are discussed below.
More succeeded Wolsey as Chancellor in October 1529, but he took on a less ambitious portfolio of duties, conceivably because of his inability in conscience to support the king's efforts to annul his marriage to Catherine of Aragon. Largely excluded from foreign affairs, he built instead on his predecessor's policy of legal reform, aiming for greater reliance on equity in the application of common law. Roper describes his confrontation with the common law judges in which he upheld his use of injunctions to modify verdicts in the common law courts and urged the judges to mitigate the rigid application of precedent through their own discretion, according to conscience. Though the judges were unresponsive, More's brief tenure of office has been described as a “magisterial performance” (Guy 1980: 93), and it naturally invites comparison with Utopian legal practice where the most obvious interpretation is the most equitable one (CU: 197). In addition, he assumed responsibility for assisting the ecclesiastical authorities in the suppression of heresy, a direct consequence of the oath imposed on secular judges, requiring them to investigate and extirpate heresy, a survival of Henry V's anti-Lollard legislation (CWM 6:1, 409; 8:1, 28). Six heretics were executed during his tenure of office, three with his personal involvement; in this respect recent scholarship has concluded that while More acted with severity, in a deliberate counter to Wolsey's “gentle and courteous” approach which was evidently failing, he did so within the law. However, his position as Chancellor swiftly became untenable. Within days of taking office he had opened the “Reformation” Parliament, which soon established its anticlerical credentials; and, in view of the growing unlikelihood of a favourable decision from Rome over the king's marriage, royal policy shifted towards an alliance with the Commons' attack on clerical privileges. One irony was that More had ex officio to convey to Parliament the opinions of various European universities on the validity of the royal marriage, most of them favourable to the king. On 15 May 1532, a depleted Convocation enacted the Submission by which the clerical estate surrendered their independent power to legislate, effectively bringing spiritual jurisdiction under secular control. More resigned his office the following day. While it has been suggested that he acted as leader of a disaffected faction, there is little evidence for this; it seems more likely that he withdrew from an alien political landscape and focused on writing, in particular his dispute with Christopher St German over the discrepancy between common law practice and the inquisitorial procedures of church courts. Unwilling to take the oath to the Act of Succession on account of its anti-papal preamble, he was sent to the Tower of London on 17 April 1534, where he remained in confinement, though free to write. In November of that year the Act of Supremacy made the king Supreme Head of the Church in England, and a related Act made it treason to deny that title “by writing or words”. After a series of interrogations, which make it clear that More did not actively seek martyrdom, he was tried at Westminster Hall on 1 July 1535, found guilty of treason, and executed five days later. As his reported words to the court make clear, he considered himself to be dying for the sake of the unity of Christendom.
2. The Theatre of Politics
One of the best known anecdotes about More concerns a visit paid by the king to his house at Chelsea: when Roper congratulated him on this favour, More—ever the realist—remarked that if his head could win the king a castle in France it would not fail to go (Roper 1935: 21). In Richard III a major theme is this discrepancy between public performance and hidden motive, and More conveys it figuratively through the image of the theatre: “these matters be kings' games, as it were stage plays, and for the more part played upon scaffolds” (CWM 2, 81). This moderate pessimism can be associated with his early study of St Augustine, the Church Father whom he knew most intimately. When preparing his 1501 lectures on the City of God, he must have been struck by Augustine's words on the role of the wise judge: given the darkness that surrounds social life,
will the wise man take his seat on the judge's bench, or will he not venture to do so? Clearly, he will take his seat; for the claims of human society, which he thinks it wicked to abandon, constrain him and draw him to this duty. (City of God, 19:6)
More's own career can be interpreted as just such a measured response to the claims of human society; as his fictional self puts it in Utopia, “what you cannot turn to good, you may at least make as little bad as possible” (CU: 97). His political instincts are corporate, something that would have been reinforced by his involvement in the civic government of London, and he is radically opposed to any form of absolutism. There are signs of this as early as his 1505 translation of Lucian's Tyrannicida, and it provides a major theme in his Epigrams, which were printed with Utopia in 1518. Several of the poems deal with the tyrant, whose character is to exploit his subjects (CWM 3:2, nos. 80, 109, 110, 114, 115, 142), while others define the true king who is dedicated to their good (nos. 111, 112, 120). In one oddly apposite example, More compares a courtier who enjoys a prince's favour to someone playing with tamed lions—“suddenly the fun becomes fatal” (no. 162). More's political beliefs are most clearly shown in an epigram which echoes the title of Utopia: “What is the best form of the commonwealth” (no. 198); here his preference for a senate over a king is based on its restraining power: a senator is chosen by the people, and any erratic tendencies on his part will be held in check by his fellow senators. This is not so much a paean for representative government as a tentative proposal to curb the darker passions which underlie the political world. It is just these passions which More dramatizes in Richard III, where the stately narrative is persistently qualified by the ironic perspective of the narrator. This creates a world of dissimulation and distrust: the only person to act “upon the surety of his own conscience” is Lord Rivers, and it simply precipitates his death (CWM 2, 18). Underlying the action is the same “ambition and desire of vainglory” (CWM 2, 12) which More had encountered in the Roman historians and which he now transferred to the England of living memory; from the political perspective, Richard III is a work of almost unrelieved gloom, and this may well explain its unfinished state. In practice, More's pessimism was qualified by his Augustinian sense of social obligation.
3. The Defence of Humanism
Humanism was founded on the philological ambition to recapture the legacy of classical literature, both by the retrieval of texts and by the imitation of classical style; but, equally, it implied the recognition of language as a persuasive medium, the province of rhetoric. The revival of rhetoric is at the core of humanism: in its persuasive role, language is directed out to the social community in the effort to stimulate moral or political response. More's most direct statements on the cultural issue of the age occur in four letters which he wrote between 1515 and 1519 to Martin Dorp, to Oxford, to Edward Lee and “to a monk” (all now in CWM 15). Dorp, a theologian with humanist interests, had expressed uneasiness with Erasmus's scurrilous treatment of scholastic theology, as well as his presumption in correcting Jerome's Vulgate New Testament in light of the Greek text. He also protests at his apparent subordination of the higher faculties, such as theology, to the rule of grammarians; for Erasmus, he implies, the worst heresy is linguistic barbarism. More had seen the exchange of letters between Dorp and Erasmus during his 1515 stay in the Netherlands and intervened in defence of his friend. While Dorp's view of humanism is essentially cosmetic, a matter of vocabulary and style, More takes the argument to a deeper level. His complaint is about the way dialectic has usurped control of the arts course, the trivium, allowing scant attention to grammar and rhetoric. The later scholastics, in their quest for a meta-language purified of subjective reference, had reinvented Latin as a wholly artificial construction closed to outsiders. It had ceased to be communicative speech. This tendency is then passed on to theology, where the Scriptures and the Fathers are fragmented into proof texts: More describes how his clash with an aged theologian about St Augustine's view on demons arose because he is citing the original work, while the theologian has picked up scraps of Augustine second-hand from Peter Lombard's Sentences (CWM 15, 68–9). One work which attracts More's venom is the Parva logicalia (“Little Logicals”), so-called, More suggests, because it has so little logic in it. This is the section of Peter of Spain's Summulae logicales devoted to supposition theory and, as such, it formed an integral part of most university courses on dialectic. In Utopia, on the other hand, where More again refers to it, we learn that the natives, for all their intelligence, fail to grasp these “elaborate rules about restrictions, amplifications and suppositions” (CU: 157). This is because in their reasoning they use customary speech, the language of the community, and can make no sense of a technical language which deviates from the order of nature. More is not opposed to dialectic, and he probably had experience of the trivium during his stay in Oxford, but he wants a return to the dialectic of Aristotle, especially as now made available by humanist scholarship. Both grammar and dialectic have their part in communication, grammar by clarifying established usage and dialectic by clarifying the structure of nature (CWM 15, 34–35); they must be integrated with rhetoric in speech comprehensible to all who participate in the language community. The quibbles of the logicians, by contrast, exclude those who, like the Utopians, have not been initiated into their artificial procedures.
All this has implications for theology. Taken up with their abstruse questions and writing in a language which More characterizes as Latino-Gothic, scholastic theologians have increasingly forfeited their pastoral relevance. Against this he advocates a “positive” theology founded on study of the Scriptures and the Church Fathers; it is a typically humanist return to the sources, and it fits with More's conception of the church as a community embedded in history and process. As he observes, the church flourished for more than a thousand years until “the Trojan Horse” of Peter Lombard's Sentences released its army of arcane problems, and this he sees as the era of the Fathers (among whom he would probably wish to include Thomas Aquinas). In his “Letter to Oxford” he describes the true theologian as one who has gained a preliminary understanding of human affairs from his study of poets, orators and historians, and can add to this a proficiency in Latin, Greek and possibly Hebrew. The letter is an endorsement of Erasmus' efforts to revive classical eloquence and patristic exegesis in the service of a theology which can both instruct and inspire. At the centre of this shift lies the issue of Greek studies, which is much more than a curricular option. When More introduces Raphael, his witness to Utopia, he is described as more at home in Greek than Latin: being primarily interested in philosophy he finds little of value in Latin apart from some works by Cicero and Seneca. The Utopians themselves become passionate students of Greek, and for the very same reason. As More reiterates in his aggressive championing of the humanist curriculum, Greek is the essential source both for secular wisdom and for the New Testament. While he admits translation as an aid, it cannot equal the impact of reading—say Aristotle—in the original (CWM 15,101). As for those critics of Erasmus who allow the Latin Vulgate a sacrosanct status and regard his corrections from the Greek as unwarranted and even blasphemous, More counters with a pragmatic view of textual reception. The church, whose sense of the Gospels precedes any written text, accepts the Greek original as the true Gospel and may extend its approval to Latin translations, but never to the extent of ruling out the human fallibility of the translator. Even one of the Fathers like Jerome can err (CWM 15, 87, 217), so there is a vital need for philological engagement with the sources. From More's perspective, Greek is the key element in a major cultural shift.
One consequence of More's humanism was his advocacy of female education. In Utopian schools all children are introduced to literary studies, and in later life both sexes are free to attend the public lectures and pursue intellectual interests. Something of this sort was a feature in his own household: he established a “school” for his own children and others where the majority may well have been girls. Writing in 1518 to William Gonnell, a protégé of Erasmus who was then in charge of the school, More justifies the idea of educating women on the grounds of a common human rationality which invites cultivation (SL: no. 20). As in Utopia, the basic aim of education is not to prepare for some specific activity or profession but to enhance the possibilities of being human, regardless of gender. More envisages a curriculum based on literary studies which will develop moral awareness, and he further recommends reading of the Church Fathers and of the Roman historians, specifically Sallust. Erasmus, an admiring witness of this novelty, reports that the girls all had Livy in their hands (CWE 8: Ep. 1233, p. 296), and More's eldest daughter Margaret has been tentatively identified with the Magdalia who champions female education in the colloquy “The Abbot and the Learned Lady” (CWE 39: 499–519).
The opening of Utopia at once raises a fundamental issue: the relationship between imagination and experience. We encounter real, that is to say historic, persons such as More (or at least his fictional self), Tunstall, the Habsburg delegation, and Pieter Gillis; but then we are introduced to Raphael Hythloday, whose fictional nature is conveyed by his name (Hythlodaeus, “purveyor of nonsense”). This merging of worlds, real and imaginary, prepares the reader for the Platonic tension between two cities—that of the philosopher's birth and the one which he creates with words (Republic 592A–B). As Raphael describes his travels, Gillis is prompted to suggest that he serve some prince. However, this would entail swapping cities, moving from the ideal to the actual, a compromise which Raphael rejects. As it is, he can live as he wishes (CU: 51). There is a deliberate echo here of Cicero's discussion of the retired life in his De officiis (I.20.70), and, for that matter, of the argument of Pico della Mirandola which More had earlier translated. On the one hand, there is the option of intellectual liberty, free of external constraints and, on the other, the career of public service, which inevitably demands a degree of accommodation to the status quo. At this point, “More” intervenes to urge the latter course: Raphael owes it to himself to use his talents for public benefit, even at some personal inconvenience. The stage is set for the debate that follows.
To make his point that by participation in the political world the intellectual risks either irrelevance or contamination, Raphael appeals to a series of models: first, there is the flashback to Cardinal Morton's household in 1497, and this is followed by fly-on-the-wall accounts of the French Council as it debates foreign policy, and of another, which remains unidentified but is probably the English Council under Henry VII, as it reviews fiscal policy. The odd one out is the Morton episode which may well date from the final stage of More's composition. In essence, it is about value: the setting of human life against property. Raphael's intervention raises two key issues: one asks what could be an appropriate penalty for theft, while the other looks—with astonishing originality—at the unjust conditions which encourage theft. To steal may be a personal moral failing, but social pressures which drive the malefactor to crime must share some of the guilt. More would, in any case, have been familiar with the tradition in canon law which argued that in dire necessity to take what was required to support life was not theft. Raphael lists various causes for the prevalence of theft, among them discharged soldiers and cast-off retainers, but his most startling suggestion is sheep, which now seem to swallow up people and lay the country waste (CU: 63). More is pointing obliquely at the evil of enclosures by which peasants are driven from the land to make way for the more profitable returns of sheep farming, a clear instance of vested interests acting against the common good. Uprooted and deprived of work, these people have little choice but to steal and to hang as a result.
In each of the illustrative episodes which More includes in Book 1, Raphael appeals to some imaginary land which can provide an alternative to the established order. In a sense, these episodes prepare us for his account of Utopia. For the Morton sequence, it is the land of the Polylerites (CU: 71), whose ingenious system of penal servitude, which may well owe something to Plato's Laws (862D), aims to destroy the vices but save the persons, providing in the process reparation for their crimes. In discussing the French Council, with its focus on aggressive territorial expansion, Raphael appeals to the Achorians, who compel their prince to confine himself to a single kingdom. Similarly, the English Council is taken up with dubious schemes to help the prince augment his wealth, and the counter-example is that of the Macarians, who bind their ruler by oath to restrict the sums held in his treasury to a thousand pounds in gold, enough to contain rebels or to resist invaders. The two royal councils are presented with satiric intent, though the policies proposed are all too real. However, if we take all three episodes together, one feature they share is the presence of courtiers. The role of courtiers should be to counsel the prince, but in each episode they are presented as amoral opportunists whose sole aim is to flatter him. Raphael, who seems to overlook the fact that Morton had entertained his proposal for penal reform, declares that there is no place for philosophy at court, a claim which leads to one of the most important exchanges in the book (CU: 95–97). While Raphael simply refers to philosophy, “More” chooses to distinguish between two modes, scholastica and civilior: the first, which he associates with Raphael, is best understood as geared to academic disputation; the second, by contrast, relates to public affairs and civil life. As “More” observes, the first may be valid in formal debate but will fall on deaf ears in the public arena; the point about his civil philosophy is that it is informed by rhetorical values—adapted to its specific context and designed to persuade. Hence, his telling comparison with a stage play: you cannot mix comedy with tragedy; Raphael, he implies, is confusing his genres. The counsellor must not abandon ship because he cannot control the winds; instead, he must work obliquely, “by indirect means”, to handle matters tactfully and minimize the effects of unsound policy. It is significant that the case for this rhetorical approach is linked in with a passing reference to human imperfection: it is inconceivable that all should turn out well, says “More”, unless all men become good, “and that I don't expect to see for quite a few years yet” (CU: 96). In a perfect world, it seems, rhetoric would be redundant. The argument from expediency is rejected by Raphael, but his dismissal of all compromise leads him to make the first allusion to the Utopians and their holding of property in common, a practice he associates with Plato. However, his account of the benefits it brings is interrupted by “More”, who presents the standard Aristotelian-scholastic case for private property as both an incentive for productivity and a basis for public authority, an argument which he raises again at the close of Book 2. Yet, meanwhile, so intriguing are Raphael's references to the Utopians that he is persuaded to give a full account of the island.
For much of its reception-history, Utopia has been treated as if it consisted exclusively of Book 2, and this impression was supported by some printed versions which omitted the first book. It was this that gave rise to the misleading adjective “Utopian” with its negative connotations of unreal and unattainable aspiration. In Book 2 More sets out to project a society which is radically different from European society, and he does this by drawing on the idea of a state of nature. This idea, sometimes presented as the Golden Age, was familiar from classical sources, and it also coloured reports of those who had witnessed the native cultures of the New World. Essentially, it imagined a primeval state of human association, prior to the invention of property and the laws which protect it, when all could have access to nature's fruits as their needs dictated. Cicero, in De officiis (1.16.51), writes of the bond of rationality which unites humanity and gives a common right to all that nature has produced. However, confronted by the Roman reality, he adds rather lamely that everything identified by statutes and civil law as private property must remain such; it seems that the primitive rights of the state of nature are now reduced to a kind of universal benevolence. More was well aware, too, of Plato's doubts about ownership, and he applies to the whole population of Utopia the communality of possessions which Plato reserves for his Guardians (Republic 416D-417B). In the Laws, too, Plato's “first-best society” attempts to remove all forms of ownership from life (739C). The novelty of More's account is that it gives us a society which has evolved from a rough and primitive manner of life to “a perfection of culture and humanity as makes them now superior to almost all other mortals” (CU: 111), but it has done so without developing a system of private ownership and the inevitable legal safeguards that go with it. It is precisely private property which defines European society, and along with it goes the legal code governing ownership, largely inherited from ancient Rome. By making his Utopians adopt a communality of possessions More liberates them from the passions generated by acquisition and loss; by the same token, they are relieved of the whole ideological burden which distorts European society.
It seems an obvious corollary that in a society where all is common money should be redundant, since it opens up a gap between conventional value, which is socially created, and the worth which derives from nature. In Europe this leads to the sort of injustice by which those in essential tasks are cruelly exploited, while those luxury trades which cater to artificial desires flourish. It is this divorce of value from worth in Europe which prompts Raphael to condemn what he sees as “a conspiracy of the rich, who are advancing their own interests under the name and title of the commonwealth” (CU: 245). There is a striking contrast between the oligopoly of those sheep traders who profit from enclosures in England and the Utopians' belief that they are the cultivators (agricolae) of their land rather than proprietors (domini); it echoes the scholastic distinction between usus, simple use, and dominium, the right of disposal which underlies European ideas of property. In Utopia all share in the fruits of the land, and these are distributed freely through the community; “though no one owns anything, everyone is rich” (CU: 241). Whatever is gathered or produced is cycled through the city markets to meet the requirements of each residential group, or syphograncy, of thirty households. While the household is the basic unit, each with its own residence, the syphograncy binds them to the wider community; in its spacious hall, the household members meet daily to have their meals in common and annually to elect one of their number as syphogrant. This officer represents their interests in the wider affairs of the city and participates in the election of its governor; although the latter may serve for life, the constitution itself is carefully devised to block any shift towards tyranny or factional interest. Thus, physical and political needs are well catered for.
However, the central principle underlying the Utopians' way of life is that as much time as possible should be reserved for the cultivation of the mind, as it is in this that they consider true happiness can be found (CU: 135). This requirement is met by their extraordinary system of work in which all citizens, of either sex, (and that could amount to about 60,000 in each city) must labour at some essential trade, but only for six hours a day; this more than meets their needs, but still leaves ample leisure for intellectual pursuits. Every child is grounded in the liberal arts, and most of the adult population, “men and women alike”, devote themselves to further study in their spare time. While there is an elite class of scholars, carefully selected by the priests and approved by the syphogrants, who dedicate themselves to full-time study and are available to hold the higher offices, the lectures provided for them are equally open to all comers. There is a vital cultural life, a direct consequence of their economic arrangements. One of the most vivid episodes in Utopia is the account of the Anemolian ambassadors: these dignitaries, determined to impress the Utopians, deck themselves out in conventional finery—cloth of gold, gold chains and rings, jewelled badges—only to find that the Utopians regard them as slaves or fools. This is because of the Utopian value system, which uses such impractical metals for shackles or chamber pots: it is an essential part of their humanist education to recognize authentic values, not the pseudo-values imposed by social conspiracy but those deriving from nature itself. The fact that they need very few laws comes from the effectiveness of this early formation (CU: 195).
While the Utopians are baffled by scholastic logic, like good humanists they are keenly interested in moral philosophy and the nature of the happy life, which is one reason why they are so dedicated to learning Greek. Raphael provides an extended account of their views on pleasure (CU: 159–79), in their view, the most important ingredient of human happiness. What he describes is, in effect, a classical synthesis: while their definition of virtue as a life in accord with nature has Stoic overtones, the emphasis which they lay on pleasure echoes Epicurean teachings. However, seeing that the theory of pleasure they adopt is based on the supremacy of spiritual pleasure, there is little in the discussion which might not have originated with Plato. Certainly, the key to their thinking lies in the soul and its destiny; and to the rational arguments of philosophy they join certain religious axioms—that the soul is immortal and that after death it will receive reward for virtues and punishment for sins (CU: 161). Suicide is condemned, but their commitment to pleasure means that euthanasia is practised: there is no Christian concept of value in suffering, though those strange religious groups, the Buthrescas, put up with hardship now to win happiness after death (CU: 229). The psychic focus of their beliefs is one of the factors which makes the monotheistic religion of the Utopians into a prisca theologia or primitive anticipation of Christianity; and we learn that when they have been introduced to Christ's teachings by Raphael and his companions, many of them embrace these eagerly. But, as Raphael points out, conversion is made easier for them by the discovery that Christ had endorsed the communal life led by his disciples and that this is still observed in monasteries (CU: 221; cf. Mark 6:8–9). The irony needs no comment.
What is the reader to make of this newly discovered island and its strange institutions? Raphael's closing peroration places the focus back on the social injustices of Europe: he concludes that it is pride or “self-pleasing”, identified by Augustine as the root of sin (City of God, 14:13), which prevents the adoption of a fairer system. And, as “More” had implied in Book 1, pride is unlikely to disappear soon; his conclusion is ambivalent. For a start, he rejects Utopian communalism, as it subverts the
nobility, magnificence, splendour and majesty which (in the popular view) are the true ornaments and glory of any commonwealth. (CU: 247)
This confronts us again with the Aristotelian-scholastic view of private property as a resource to be used for public benefit, which is a legitimate argument, but the reference to popular opinion, with its echo of Plato's cave, is less reassuring. As he leads his guest into dinner, “More” does confide that he would be glad to see some Utopian features in his own society, but he is not hopeful—his closing verbs, optarim (“I might wish for”) and sperarim (“I might hope for”), are subjunctive. Raphael “s encounter with the ideal has alienated him from the familiar world, while “More” remains within it but somehow changed. How far can Utopia be imitated? One feature which is often overlooked is its foundation: the entire polity, from social organization and street plans to its benign religious toleration, is due to one man, Utopus, whose military conquest of the country enabled him, in Plato's terms, to wipe the slate clean (CU: 111; Republic 501A). He represents the ideal philosopher-king who reconciles wisdom with power, and this scarcely makes his precedent an easy one to follow. In spite of the common tendency to interpret Utopia as a social blue-print, it seems more helpful to view it as a “spiritual exercise”: the imaginative engagement with a model which can modify our attitudes and even qualify our conduct. This would explain why in his prefatory letters to Pieter Gillis and elsewhere, the author More plays with the interface between fiction and reality. It also fits with More's own practice of political engagement, while preserving his intellectual independence.
5. Reformation Polemics
Writing to Erasmus in 1533, More expressed his wish to be grievous to heretics, “my increasing experience with these men frightens me with the thought of what the world will suffer at their hands” (SL: p.180). His writings in defence of Catholic orthodoxy have limited relevance in a philosophical context, but some observations are in order. More's efforts to counter heresy, whether by writing or legal process, were undertaken as a public duty, and he invariably associates heresy with “malice”, that is with active proselytising, rather than the holding of a belief. His career as a polemicist began when he was drafted, probably by the Council, to answer Luther's assault on Henry's Assertio, and in 1528 he was enlisted by Tunstall to provide a vernacular response to the heretical books illegally shipped in from the Continent. The conventions which he inherited saw the detection of heresy as a means to restore social unity and inclusion (Forrest 2005: 240), and he viewed with dismay what he read as signs of social disintegration in the Peasants' Revolt of 1525 in Germany and the Sack of Rome in 1527 (CWM 6:1, 369–72, 427–28; 8:1, 56). Like many Catholic apologists, he claimed (misguidedly) that Luther's teaching of justification by faith alone was a license for immoral conduct. It is no surprise, then, that the author of Utopia should defend orthodoxy not as a check-list of doctrines but rather as a culture, an all-embracing way of life, along with the attitudes and practices which that generated. It is a constant in his thinking that individual perceptions must be subject to the constraints of collective experience—as with the “old holy doctors and saints” who may err on individual matters but conform themselves, by an act of will, to the consensus of the church as a whole.
When writing in Latin, More could assume a sophisticated and informed readership, able to handle his criticism of contemporary abuses without drawing false conclusions. However, in an age of expanding literacy, vernacular readers were more exposed to misunderstanding, especially when confronted by conflicting voices. More's concern about untutored access to controversial texts is made clear in A Dialogue Concerning Heresies, where he treats the issue of an English Bible: he is in favour of one, provided that both translation and circulation are controlled by the bishops and that it is handed out to those who are “honest, sad and virtuous” and who will read it for purposes of devotion rather than disputation (CWM 6:1, 341). Like Erasmus, More is unhappy at the thought of letting unqualified readers loose on thorny theological issues like free will, or indeed on the biblical texts themselves, “meddling with such parts as least will agree with their capacities”. In the church, God “will have some readers and some hearers, some teachers and some learners”; even Plato, “the great philosopher”, restricted discussion of the laws to “folk meet therefore and in place convenient” (CWM 6:1, 334). Most arresting of all is his declaration in the Confutation of Tyndale that were anyone to translate his earlier Latin writings and Erasmus's Folly into English, he would burn the books with his own hands, “rather than folk should (though through their own fault) take any harm of them”. For More, it is an issue of expediency, and that reference to translation is revealing: in the current state of affairs, when “men by their own default [incapacity] misconstrue and take harm of the very scripture of God”, it is the vulnerability of the vernacular reader that worries him (CWM 8:1, 177–79). If A Dialogue Concerning Heresies is the most successful of the polemical works, this is because it is not written as a direct riposte to an opponent but as a dialogue which enacts the process of persuasion. In this More, again adopting a fictional persona, wins over the youthful Messenger, his interlocutor, whose sincerity is never in doubt but whose anti-intellectual bias and self-reliance makes him representative of an evangelical readership.
The most interesting strand in the polemical works is More's idea of the church, since that connects with an important theme in late medieval thought. Against Luther's sinless church, “imperceptible and mathematical like Platonic Ideas” (CWM 5:1, 167), More presents the church as a mixed community of saints and sinners, both “good corn and cockle”, deeply bound up in historical process. Against Tyndale's “feeling faith”, inspired by the Spirit in the heart of the individual, More argues that the Spirit operates through the medium of the church (CWM 8:2, 752–53). Against the reformers generally, he asserts the material insufficiency of Scripture: before the Gospels were ever written, the Spirit had inscribed Christ's teaching on the hearts of the faithful, and it is within this controlling context that the Gospels must be read. But More's conception of the church is far from being a static appeal to tradition, since he sees the Spirit as actively engaged within the church till the end of time as its founding doctrines evolve and develop (CWM 6:1, 146–47). This “pneumatic” view of the church has implications for its organization. More is acutely aware of the church as “the whole flock of all Christian people”: in a lively image or “suppose”, he pictures a primitive assembly of all Christians drawn together on a “fair plain”. Apart from the effort of getting there, they are running short of food, so it is arranged for the future that representatives should be chosen from each part to form a general council, and this council would have the same credence that “the whole Christian people should have if they were all present there, man, women and child” (CWM 8:2, 937). More prefers to locate the operation of the Spirit in this corporate body rather than in any specified office: in the Responsio he describes how Christ has breathed his Spirit on the Holy Doctors of the Church, each of whom—being human—may be in error at some time, but when there is consensus over a point of doctrine, “in such great numbers through so many ages”, this may be taken as the voice of the Spirit, who “makes those who dwell in a house to be of one mind” (CWM 5:1, 129). He even emphasises the way in which synods and councils are representative of the church as a whole by direct analogy with Parliament, which “representeth the whole realm” (CWM 8:1, 146). More might be called a moderate conciliarist; and though his refusal to swear the oath of succession arose from its implicit repudiation of the pope's power of dispensation, he saw that power as deriving from the church as the whole people of God. In his view, the pope might be admonished and even deposed by a council, and he did not hesitate to declare this view to Thomas Cromwell (CWM 8:2, 590; SL: p.214). Against the more extreme claims of ultra-papal canonists, More's understanding of the pope's office resembles the restrained conception of royal authority expressed by English lawyers like Sir John Fortescue (c. 1395–c. 1477), in which the institution of the body politic is grounded in the intention of the people.
6. Prison Writings
More was confined in the Tower of London from April 1534 until his execution on 6 July 1535, and during this period he wrote several works, notably A Dialogue of Comfort and the unfinished Latin meditation De tristitia Christi (“The Sadness of Christ”). The letters written at this time to his daughter Margaret Roper offer a direct insight into his thoughts, but of particular interest is the letter of Margaret to her step-sister Alice Alington (Corr., Letter 206), in which More's voice is unmistakeably present. Both the Dialogue and De tristitia face the issue of suffering, but they transcend private anxiety and are clearly intended for wider circulation. In the Dialogue More returns to his preferred fictional form, setting it in Hungary, as the elderly Antony and his nephew Vincent anticipate persecution in the aftermath of the Ottoman invasion of their country. The parallel with More's situation is clear: should one accommodate or follow conscience? The older man's serene progress towards acceptance of temporary suffering for a higher good is set against the counterpoint of the younger man's hesitation. Unlike any classical treatment of consolation, More admits the role of grace; but grace still assumes our synergistic response, and this is his primary concern: it is necessary to gather comfort and courage, “and let it sink into the heart” (CWM 12, 296). By right imagining—a form of internalized rhetoric—an abstract argument is transformed into “a habitual, fast, and deep-rooted purpose”. A key motif is that of the prison: in an apparent allusion to Plato's myth of the cave, More distinguishes between actual confinement in a cell, rated as a prison in the opinion of the common people, and the more philosophical view that the whole earth is, in effect, a prison and all its inhabitants under sentence of death (CWM 12, 269–70). The wise prisoner, however narrowly confined, is free as long as he can quiet his mind and is content to be where he is. Though More's wife finds his prison claustrophobic, the only difference between his cell and her chamber is that his lock is outside, while hers is inside (CWM 12, 277). Given More's relatively lonely stand against royal policy, conscience is a crucial term for him, as it touches on the soundness of his own motives, especially when these are criticized as over-scrupulous; and in the beast fable of Mother Maud he playfully navigates a course between the scrupulous conscience and the over-large or elastic conscience (CWM 12, 114–20). In Letter 206 of the Correspondence, attributed to Margaret but clearly based on More's own words, “conscience” occurs more than forty times. Margaret, cast as Eve, conveys the view of Sir Thomas Audley, More's successor as Chancellor, that he is driven by “a right simple scruple”: with the exceptions of More and Bishop Fisher, all others have been content to take the oath. In response, More insists that he acts from an informed conscience, one shaped by many years of study and reflection. Above all, he acts on his own conscience, and he carefully distinguishes his position even from that of Fisher— “I never intend…to pin my soul to another man's back”. The responsibility must be his alone. While he notes that some of the most learned men who have taken the oath had previously affirmed the contrary, he will not impugn their motives or condemn any other man's conscience; but for his own part, he is content “to lose goods, land, and life too, rather than swear against my conscience”. It was on the basis of this meticulous self-examination that More went to the scaffold.
More's execution discouraged publication of his work; but in the Catholic interim under Mary I his nephew William Rastell edited the vernacular writings, The Works of Sir Thomas More in the Englysh tonge, London, 1557; reprinted with an introduction by K. J. Wilson, Menston: Scolar Press, 1978. His complete Latin works, Opera omnia, were printed at Louvain in 1565 and 1566, and at Frankfurt in 1689. All his extant works are now available in the Yale edition, which provides authoritative texts with comprehensive introductory material and annotation. More's letters have been edited by Elizabeth F. Rogers; but she does not include his exchanges with Erasmus, and for these the reader must consult P.S. Allen's Erasmi epistolae, or the correspondence volumes (vols 1–21, 15 so far published) in the Toronto Collected Works of Erasmus. Abbreviated citations used in the entry are given below.
|[CWM]||The Complete Works of St. Thomas More, 15 vols., New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 1963–97:|
- English Poems, Life of Pico, The Last things. Edited by Anthony S.G. Edwards, Clarence H. Miller and Katherine Gardiner Rodgers. 1997.
- The History of King Richard III. Edited by R.S. Sylvester. 1963.
- Part 1: Translations of Lucian. Edited by Craig R. Thompson. 1974.
- Part 2: Latin Poems. Edited by Clarence H. Miller, Leicester Bradner, Charles A. Lynch and Revilo P. Oliver. 1984.
- Utopia. Edited by Edward Surtz, S.J., and J.H. Hexter. 1965.
- Responsio ad Lutherum. Edited by John Headley. 1969.
- A Dialogue Concerning Heresies. Edited by Thomas M.C. Lawler, G. Marc'hadour and R.C. Marius. 1981.
- Letter to Bugenhagen, Supplication of Souls, Letter against Frith. Edited by Frank Manley, Clarence H. Miller and R.C. Marius. 1990.
- The Confutation of Tyndale's Answer. Edited by Louis A. Schuster, R.C. Marius and James P. Lusardi. 1973.
- The Apology. Edited by J.B. Trapp.1979.
- The Debellation of Salem and Bizance. Edited by John Guy, Clarence H. Miller and Ralph Keen. 1988.
- The Answer to a Poisoned Book. Edited by Clarence H. Miller and Stephen M. Foley. 1985.
- A Dialogue of Comfort against Tribulation. Edited by Louis L. Martz and Frank Manley. 1976.
- Treatise on the Passion, Treatise on the Blessed Body, Instructions and Prayers. Edited by Garry E. Haupt. 1976.
- De tristitia Christi. Edited by Clarence H. Miller. 1976.
- Letters to Dorp, Oxford, Lee and a Monk; Historia Richardi Tertii. Edited by Daniel Kinney. 1986.
|[Corr.]||The Correspondence of Sir Thomas More. Edited by E.F. Rogers, Princeton: Princeton University Press. 1947.|
|[SL]||St. Thomas More: Selected Letters. Edited by E.F. Rogers, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1961; this includes English translations of the Latin letters.|
|[CU]||Utopia: Latin Text and English Translation. Edited by George M. Logan, Robert M. Adams and Clarence Miller, Cambridge University Press, 1995. Cited here as the most reliable bilingual text.|
|[CWE]||Collected Works of Erasmus, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1974–.|
Selected Editions of More's Works
- The History of King Richard the Third. Edited by George M. Logan, Bloomington and Indianapolis, Indiana University Press, 2005.
- Sir Thomas More: Neue Briefe. Edited by Hubertus Schulte Herbrüggen, Münster: Aschendorff, 1966.
- The Last Letters of Thomas More. Edited by Alvaro de Silva, Grand Rapids, Mich.: Eerdmans, 2000.
- L'Utopie de Thomas More. Edited by André Prevost, Paris: Mame, 1978. Latin and French texts, with extensive commentary.
- Utopia, with Erasmus's “The Sileni of Alcibiades”. Edited and translated by David Wootton, Indianopolis and Cambridge: Hacket, 1999.
- Utopia. Translation and introduction by Clarence H. Miller, New Haven and Yale: Yale University Press, 2001.
- Utopia. Translation and introduction by Dominic Baker-Smith, London: Penguin Books, 2012.
- Roper, William, The Lyfe of Sir Thomas More (c. 1557). Edited by E.V. Hitchcock, London: Oxford University Press, 1935.
- Harpsfield, Nicholas, The Life of and Death of Sir Thomas More (c. 1559). Edited by E.V. Hitchcock, London: Oxford University Press, 1932.
- Stapleton, Thomas, The Life of Sir Thomas More (Part 3 of Tres Thomae, 1588). Translated by Philip E. Hallett, London: Burns Oates and Washbourne, 1928.
- More, Cresacre, The Life and Death of Sir Thomas More (c. 1631). Edited by J. Hunter, London: William Pickering, 1828.
- Ackroyd, Peter, 1998, The Life of Thomas More, London: Chatto and Windus.
- Baker House, Seymour, 2008, “More, Sir Thomas (1478–1535)”, in Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Chambers, R. W., 1935, Thomas More, London: Jonathan Cape.
- Fox, Alastair, 1982, Thomas More: History and Providence, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Guy, J. A., 1980, The Public Career of Sir Thomas More, Brighton: Harvester Press.
- –––, 2000, Thomas More, London: Arnold.
- –––, 2008, A Daughter's Love: Thomas More and Margaret More, London: Fourth Estate.
- Marius, Richard, 1984, Thomas More: A Biography, New York: Knopf.
- Martz, Louis L., 1990, Thomas More: The Search for the Inner Man, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
Selected Secondary Studies
- Adams, Robert P., 1962, The Better Part of Valour: More, Erasmus, Colet, and Vives on Humanism, War, and Peace, 1496–1535, Seattle: University of Washington Press.
- Baker, David Weil, 1999, Divulging Utopia: Radical Humanism in Sixteenth-Century England, Amherst: University of Massachusetts.
- Baker-Smith, Dominic, 1991, More's “Utopia”, London and New York: Harper Collins; reprint University of Toronto Press, 2000.
- Betteridge, Thomas, 2013, Writing Faith and Telling Tales: Literature, Politics, and Religion in the Work of Thomas More, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Bolchazy, L. J. with G. Gicham and F. Theobald, 1978, A Concordance to the “Utopia” of St. Thomas More, Hildesheim and New York: G. Olms.
- Cave, Terence, 2008, Thomas More's “Utopia” in Early Modern Europe, Manchester: Manchester University Press.
- Cousins, A. D. and Damian Grace (eds.), 2009, A Companion to Thomas More, Madison and Teaneck: Fairleigh Dickinson University Press.
- Curtis, Cathy, 2006, “’The Best State of the Commonwealth’: Thomas More and Quentin Skinner”, in A. Brett and J. Tully (eds.), Rethinking the Foundations of Modern Political Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 93–112.
- Fleisher, Martin, 1973, Radical Reform and Political Persuasion in the Life and Writings of Thomas More, Geneva: Droz.
- Forrest, Ian, 2005, The Detection of Heresy in Late Medieval England, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Garnsey, Peter, 2007, Thinking About Property, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Gogan, Brian, 1982, The Common Corps of Christendom: Ecclesiological Themes in the Writings of Sir Thomas More, Leiden: Brill.
- Goldhill, Simon, 2002, Who Needs Greek? Contests in the Cultural History of Hellenism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Greenblatt, Stephen, 1980, Renaissance Self-Fashioning, Chicago and London: Chicago University Press, chap. 1.
- Hexter, J. H., 1952, More's “Utopia”: The Biography of an Idea, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Jones, Sarah Rees, 2001, “Thomas More's Utopia and Medieval London”, in Rosemary Horrox and Sarah Rees Jones (eds.), Pragmatic Utopias: Ideals and Communities, 1200–1630, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 117–35.
- Kaufman, Peter I., 2007, Incorrectly Political: Augustine and Thomas More, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Logan, George M., 1983, The Meaning of More's “Utopia”, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- ––– (ed.), 2011,The Cambridge Companion to Thomas More, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [This includes valuable bibliographical information.]
- McCutcheon, Elizabeth, 1983, My Dear Peter: The “Ars Poetica” and Hermeneutics for More's “Utopia”, Angers: Moreanum.
- Majeske, Andrew J., 2006, Equity in English Renaissance Literature: Thomas More and Edmund Spenser, New York and London: Routledge.
- Nelson, Eric, 2001, “Greek Nonsense in More's Utopia”, The Historical Journal, 44: 889–917.
- –––, 2004, The Greek Tradition in Republican Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Skinner, Quentin, 1978, The Foundations of Modern Political Thought, 2 vols, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1987, “Sir Thomas More's Utopia and the Language of Renaissance Humanism”, in Anthony Pagden (ed.), The Languages of Political Theory in Early-Modern Europe, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 123–57; reprinted as “Thomas More's Vision of True Nobility”, in his Visions of Politics, 3 vols, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002, vol. 2, pp. 213–44.
- –––, 1988, “Political Philosophy”, in Charles B. Schmitt et al. (eds.), The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 389–452.
- Sylvester, R. S. and G. P. Marc'hadour (eds.), 1977, Essential Articles for the Study of Thomas More, Hamden, Conn.: Archon Books.
- Wegemer, Gerard B., 2011, Young Thomas More and the Arts of Liberty, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Center for Thomas More Studies at the University of Dallas: this site includes online texts, documents and concordances to More's writings.
- Lakowski, R.I. “A Bibliography of Thomas More's Utopia”, Early Modern Literary Studies, 1.2 (1995)