# Time Machines

*First published Thu Nov 25, 2004; substantive revision Wed May 22, 2024*

Recent years have seen a growing consensus in the philosophical community that the grandfather paradox and similar logical puzzles do not preclude the possibility of time travel scenarios that utilize spacetimes containing closed timelike curves. At the same time, physicists, who for half a century acknowledged that the general theory of relativity is compatible with such spacetimes, have intensely studied the question whether the operation of a time machine would be admissible in the context of the same theory and of its quantum cousins. A time machine is a device which brings about closed timelike curves—and thus enables time travel—where none would have existed otherwise. The physics literature contains various no-go theorems for time machines, i.e., theorems which purport to establish that, under physically plausible assumptions, the operation of a time machine is impossible. We conclude that for the time being there exists no conclusive no-go theorem against time machines. The character of the material covered in this article makes it inevitable that its content is of a rather technical nature. We contend, however, that philosophers should nevertheless be interested in this literature for at least two reasons. First, the topic of time machines leads to a number of interesting foundations issues in classical and quantum theories of gravity; and second, philosophers can contribute to the topic by clarifying what it means for a device to count as a time machine, by relating the debate to other concerns such as Penrose’s cosmic censorship conjecture and the fate of determinism in general relativity theory, and by eliminating a number of confusions regarding the status of the paradoxes of time travel. The present article addresses these ambitions in as non-technical a manner as possible, and the reader is referred to the relevant physics literature for details.

- 1. Introduction: time travel vs. time machine
- 2. What is a (Thornian) time machine? Preliminaries
- 3. When can a would-be time machine be held responsible for the emergence of CTCs?
- 4. No-go results for (Thornian) time machines in classical general relativity theory
- 5. No-go results in quantum gravity
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction: time travel vs. time machine

The topic of time machines is the subject of a sizable and growing
physics literature, some of which has filtered down to popular and
semi-popular
presentations.^{[1]}
The issues raised by this topic are largely oblique, if not
orthogonal, to those treated in the philosophical literature on time
travel.^{[2]}
Most significantly, the so-called paradoxes of time travel do not
play a substantial role in the physics literature on time machines.
This literature equates the possibility of time travel with the
existence of closed timelike curves (CTCs) or worldlines for material
particles that are smooth, future-directed timelike curves with
self-intersections.^{[3]}
Since time machines designate devices which bring about the existence
of CTCs and thus enable time travel, the paradoxes of time travel are
irrelevant for attempted “no-go” results for time machines
because these results concern what happens before the emergence of
CTCs.^{[4]}
This, in our opinion, is fortunate since the paradoxes of time travel
are nothing more than a crude way of bringing out the fact that the
application of familiar local laws of relativistic physics to a
spacetime background which contains CTCs typically requires that
consistency constraints on initial data must be met in order for a
local solution of the laws to be extendable to a global solution. The
nature and status of these constraints is the subject of ongoing
discussion. We will not try to advance the discussion of this issue
here;^{[5]}
rather, our aim is to acquaint the reader with the issues addressed
in the physics literature on time machines and to connect them with
issues in the philosophy of space and time and, more generally, with
issues in the foundations of physics.

Paradox mongers can be reassured in that if a paradox is lost in shifting the focus from time travel itself to time machines, then a paradox is also gained: if it is possible to operate a time machine device that produces CTCs, then it is possible to alter the structure of spacetime such that determinism fails; but by undercutting determinism, the time machine undercuts the claim that it is responsible for producing CTCs. But just as the grandfather paradox is a crude way of making a point, so this new paradox is a crude way of indicating that it is going to be difficult to specify what it means to be a time machine. This is a task that calls not for paradox mongering but for scientifically informed philosophizing. The present article will provide the initial steps of this task and will indicate what remains to be done. But aside from paradoxes, the main payoff of the topic of time machines is that it provides a quick route to the heart of a number of foundations problems in classical general relativity theory and in attempts to produce a quantum theory of gravity by combining general relativity and quantum mechanics. We will indicate the shape of some of these problems here, but will refer the interested reader elsewhere for technical details.

There are at least two distinct general notions of time machines,
which we will call *Wellsian* and *Thornian* for short.
In *The Time Machine*, H. G. Wells (1931) described what has
become science fiction’s paradigmatic conception of a time
machine: the intrepid operator fastens her seat belt, dials the target
date—past or future—into the counter, throws a lever, and
sits back while time rewinds or fast forwards until the target date is
reached. We will not broach the issue of whether or not a Wellsian
time machine can be implemented within a relativistic spacetime
framework. For, as will soon become clear, the time machines which
have recently come into prominence in the physics literature are of an
utterly different kind. This second kind of time machine was
originally proposed by Kip Thorne and his collaborators (see Morris
and Thorne 1988; Morris, Thorne, and Yurtsever 1988). These articles
considered the possibility that, without violating the laws of general
relativistic physics, an advanced civilization might manipulate
concentrations of matter-energy so as to produce CTCs where none would
have existed otherwise. In their example, the production of
“wormholes” was used to generate the required spacetime
structure. But this is only one of the ways in which a time machine
might operate, and in what follows any device which affects the
spacetime structure in such a way that CTCs result will be dubbed a
*Thornian time machine*. We will only be concerned with this
variety of time machine, leaving the Wellsian variety to science
fiction writers. This will disappoint the aficionados of science
fiction since Thornian time machines do not have the magical ability
to transport the would-be time traveler to the past of the events that
constitute the operation of the time machine. For those more
interested in science than in science fiction, this loss is balanced
by the gain in realism and the connection to contemporary research in
physics.

In Sections 2 and 3 we investigate the circumstances under which it is plausible to see a Thornian time machine at work. The main difficulty lies in specifying the conditions needed to make sense of the notion that the time machine “produces” or is “responsible for” the appearances of CTCs. We argue that at present there is no satisfactory resolution of this difficulty and, thus, that the topic of time machines in a general relativistic setting is somewhat ill-defined. This fact does not prevent progress from being made on the topic; for if one’s aim is to establish no-go results for time machines it suffices to identify necessary conditions for the operation of a time machine and then to prove, under suitable hypotheses about what is physically possible, that it is not physically possible to satisfy said necessary conditions. In Section 4 we review various no-go results which depend only on classical general relativity theory. Section 5 surveys results that appeal to quantum effects. Conclusions are presented in Section 6.

## 2. What is a (Thornian) time machine? Preliminaries

The setting for the discussion is a *general relativistic
spacetime* \((\mathcal{M},g_{ab})\) where \(\mathcal{M}\) is a
differentiable manifold and \(g_{ab}\) is a Lorentz signature metric
defined on all of \(\mathcal{M}\). The central issue addressed in the
physics literature on time machines is whether in this general setting
it is physically possible to operate a Thornian time machine. This
issue is to be settled by proving theorems about the solutions to the
equations that represent what are taken to be physical laws operating
in the general relativistic setting—or at least this is so once
the notion of a Thornian time machine has been explicated.
Unfortunately, no adequate and generally accepted explication that
lends itself to the required mathematical proofs is to be found in the
literature. This is neither surprising nor deplorable. Mathematical
physicists do not wait until some concept has received its final
explication before trying to prove theorems about it; indeed, the
process of theorem proving is often an essential part of conceptual
clarification. The moral is well illustrated by the history of the
concept of a spacetime singularity in general relativity where this
concept received its now canonical definition only in the process of
proving the Penrose-Hawking-Geroch singularity theorems, which came at
the end of a decades long dispute over the issue of whether spacetime
singularities are a generic feature of solutions to Einstein’s
gravitational field
equations.^{[6]}
However, this is not to say that philosophers interested in time
machines should simply wait until the dust has settled in the physics
literature; indeed, the physics literature could benefit from
deployment of the analytical skills that are the stock in trade of
philosophy. For example, the paradoxes of time travel and the fate of
time machines are not infrequently confused in the physics literature,
and as will become evident below, subtler confusions abound as
well.

The question of whether a Thornian time machine—a device that
produces CTCs—can be seen to be at work only makes sense if the
spacetime has at least three features: temporal orientability, a
definite time orientation, and a causally innocuous past. In order to
make the notion of a CTC meaningful, the spacetime must be
*temporally orientable* (i.e., must admit a consistent time
directionality), and one of the two possible time orientations has to
be singled out as giving *the* direction of
time.^{[7]}
Non-temporal orientability is not really an obstacle since if a given
general relativistic spacetime is not temporally orientable, a
spacetime that is everywhere locally the same as the given spacetime
and is itself temporally orientable can be obtained by passing to a
covering
spacetime.^{[8]}
How to justify the singling out of one of the two possible
orientations as future pointing requires a solution to the problem of
the direction of time, a problem which is still subject to lively
debate (see Callender 2001, 2017). But for present purposes we simply
assume that a temporal orientation has been provided. A CTC is then
(by definition) a parameterized closed spacetime curve whose tangent
is everywhere a future-pointing timelike vector. A CTC can be thought
of as the world line of some possible observer whose life history is
linearly ordered in the small but not in the large: the observer has a
consistent experience of the “next moment,” and the
“next,” etc., but eventually the “next moment”
brings her back to whatever event she regards as the starting
point.

As for the third condition—a causally innocuous past—the
question of the possibility of operating a device that produces CTCs
presupposes that there is a time before which no CTCs existed. Thus,
Gödel spacetime, so beloved of the time travel literature, is not
a candidate for hosting a Thornian time machine since through every
point in this spacetime there is a CTC. We make this third condition
precise by requiring that the spacetime admits a *global time
slice* \(\Sigma\) (i.e., a spacelike hypersurface without
edges);^{[9]}
that \(\Sigma\) is two-sided and partitions \(\mathcal{M}\) into
three parts—\(\Sigma\) itself, the part of \(\mathcal{M}\) on
the past side of \(\Sigma\) and the part of \(\mathcal{M}\) on the
future side of \(\Sigma\)—and that there are no CTCs that lie on
the past side of \(\Sigma\). The first two clauses of this requirement
together entail that the time slice \(\Sigma\) is a *partial Cauchy
surface*, i.e., \(\Sigma\) is a time slice that is not intersected
more than once by any future-directed timelike
curve.^{[10]}

Now suppose that the state on a partial Cauchy surface \(\Sigma_0\)
with no CTCs to its past is to be thought of as giving a snapshot of
the universe at a moment before the machine is turned on. The
subsequent realization of a Thornian time machine scenario requires
that the *chronology violating region* \(V \subseteq
\mathcal{M}\), the region of spacetime traced out by
CTCs,^{[11]}
is non-null and lies to the future of \(\Sigma_0\). The fact that \(V
\ne \varnothing\) does not lead to any consistency constraints on
initial data on \(\Sigma_0\) since, by hypothesis, \(\Sigma_0\) is not
intersected more than once by any timelike curve, and thus, insofar as
the so-called paradoxes of time travel are concerned with such
constraints, the paradoxes do not arise with respect to \(\Sigma_0\).
But by the same token, the option of traveling back into the past of
\(\Sigma_0\) is ruled out by the set up as it has been sketched so
far, since otherwise \(\Sigma_0\) would not be a partial Cauchy
surface. This just goes to underscore the point made above that the
fans of science fiction stories of time machines will not find the
present context of discussion broad enough to encompass their vision
of how time machines should operate; they may now stop reading this
article and return to their novels.

Figure 1. Misner spacetime

As a concrete example of these concepts, consider the \((1 + 1)\)-dimensional Misner spacetime (see Figure 1) which exhibits some of the causal features of Taub-NUT spacetime, a vacuum solution to Einstein’s gravitational field equations. It satisfies all three of the conditions discussed above. It is temporally orientable, and a time orientation has been singled out—the shading in the figure indicates the future lobes of the light cones. To the past of the partial Cauchy surface \(\Sigma_0\) lies the Taub region where the causal structure of spacetime is as bland as can be desired. But to the future of \(\Sigma_0\) the light cones begin to “tip over,” and eventually the tipping results in CTCs in the NUT region.

The issue that must be faced now is what further conditions must be imposed in order that the appearance of CTCs to the future of \(\Sigma_0\) can be attributed to the operation of a time machine. Not surprisingly, the answer depends not just on the structure of the spacetime at issue but also on the physical laws that govern the evolution of the spacetime structure. If one adopts the attitude that the label “time machine” is to be reserved for devices that operate within a finite spatial range for a finite stretch of time, then one will want to impose requirements to assure that what happens in a compact region of spacetime lying on or to the future of \(\Sigma_0\) is responsible for the CTCs. Or one could be more liberal and allow the would-be time machine to be spread over an infinite space. We will adopt the more liberal stance since it avoids various complications while still sufficing to elicit key points. Again, one could reserve the label “time machine” for devices that manipulate concentrations of mass-energy in some specified ways. For example, based on Gödel spacetime—where matter is everywhere rotating and a CTC passes through every spacetime point—one might conjecture that setting into sufficiently rapid rotation a finite mass concentration of appropriate shape will eventuate in CTCs (Earman 1995, Manchak 2016). A similar possibility presents itself in Kerr spacetime (Andréka et al. 2008, Doboszewski 2022). But with the goal in mind of proving negative general results, it is better to proceed in a more abstract fashion. Think of the conditions on the partial Cauchy surface \(\Sigma_0\) as encoding the instructions for the operation of the time machine. The details of the operation of the device—whether it operates in a finite region of spacetime, whether it operates by setting matter into rotation, etc.—can be left to the side. What must be addressed, however, is whether the processes that evolve from the state on \(\Sigma_0\) can be deemed to be responsible for the subsequent appearance of CTCs.

## 3. When can a would-be time machine be held responsible for the emergence of CTCs?

The most obvious move is to construe “responsible for” in
the sense of causal determinism. But in the present setting this move
quickly runs into a dead end. For if CTCs exist to the future of
\(\Sigma_0\) they are not causally determined by the state on
\(\Sigma_0\) since the time travel region \(V\), if it is non-null,
lies outside the *future domain of dependence* \(D^+
(\Sigma_0)\) of \(\Sigma_0\), the portion of spacetime where the field
equations of relativistic physics uniquely determine the state of
things from the state on
\(\Sigma_0\).^{[12]}
The point is illustrated by the toy model of
Figure 1.
The surface labeled \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is called the *future
Cauchy horizon* of \(\Sigma_0\). It is the future boundary of
\(D^+
(\Sigma_0)\),^{[13]}
and it separates the portion of spacetime where conditions are
causally determined by the state on \(\Sigma_0\) from the portion
where conditions are not so determined. And, as advertised, the CTCs
in the model of
Figure 1
lie beyond \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\).

Figure 2. Deutsch-Politzer spacetime

Thus, if the operation of a Thornian time machine is to be a live
possibility, some condition weaker than causal determinism must be
used to capture the sense in which the state on \(\Sigma_0\) can be
deemed to be responsible for the subsequent development of CTCs. Given
the failure of causal determinism, it seems the next best thing to
demand that the region \(V\) is “adjacent” to the future
domain of dependence \(D^+ (\Sigma_0)\). Here is an initial stab at
such an adjacency condition. Consider causal curves which have a
future endpoint in the time travel region \(V\) and no past endpoint.
Such a curve may never leave \(V\); but if it does, require that it
intersects \(\Sigma_0\). But this requirement is too strong because it
rules out Thornian time machines altogether. For a curve of the type
in question to reach \(\Sigma_0\) it must intersect \(H^+
(\Sigma_0)\), but once it reaches \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) it can be
continued endlessly into the past without meeting \(\Sigma_0\) because
the generators of \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) are past endless null geodesics
that never meet
\(\Sigma_0\).^{[14]}
This difficulty can be overcome by weakening the requirement at issue
by rephrasing it in terms of timelike curves rather than causal
curves. Now the set of candidate time machine spacetimes satisfying
the weakened requirement is non-empty—as illustrated, once
again, by the spacetime of
Figure 1.
But the weakened requirement is too weak, as illustrated by the \((1
+ 1)\)-dimensional version of Deutsch-Politzer
spacetime^{[15]}
(see
Figure 2),
which is constructed from two-dimensional Minkowski spacetime by
deleting the points \(p_1\)–\(p_4\) and then gluing together the
strips as shown. Every past endless timelike curve that emerges from
the time travel region \(V\) of Deutsch-Politzer spacetime does meet
\(\Sigma_0\). But this spacetime is not a plausible candidate for a
time machine spacetime. Up to and including the time \(\Sigma_0\)
(which can be placed as close to \(V\) as desired) this spacetime is
identical with empty Minkowski spacetime. If the state of the
corresponding portion of Minkowski spacetime is not responsible for
the development of CTCs—and it certainly is not since there are
no CTCs in Minkowski spacetime—how can the state on the portion
of Deutsch-Politzer spacetime up to and including the time
\(\Sigma_0\) be held responsible for the CTCs that appear in the
future?

The deletion of the points \(p_1\)–\(p_4\) means that the
Deutsch-Politzer spacetime is singular in the sense that it is
*geodesically
incomplete*.^{[16]}
It would be too drastic to require of a time-machine hosting
spacetime that it be geodesically complete. And in any case the
offending feature of Deutsch-Politzer can be gotten rid of by the
following trick. Multiplying the flat Lorentzian metric \(\eta_{ab}\)
of Deutsch-Politzer spacetime by a scalar function \(j(x, t) \gt\)
produces a new metric \(\eta '_{ab} :=\) *j \(\eta_{ab}\)*
which is conformal to the original metric and, thus, has exactly the
same causal features as the original metric. But if the conformal
factor \(j\) is chosen to “blow up” as the missing points
\(p_1\)–\(p_4\) are approached, the resulting spacetime is
geodesically complete—intuitively, the singularities have been
pushed off to infinity.

A more subtle way to exclude Deutsch-Politzer spacetime focuses on the
generators of \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\). The stipulations laid down so far
for Thornian time machines imply that the generators of \(H^+
(\Sigma_0)\) cannot intersect \(\Sigma_0\). But in addition it can be
required that these generators do not “emerge from a
singularity” and do not “come from infinity,” and
this would suffice to rule out Deutsch-Politzer spacetime and its
conformal cousins as legitimate candidates for time machine
spacetimes. More precisely, we can impose what Stephen Hawking
(1992a,b) calls the requirement that \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) be
*compactly generated*; namely, the past endless null geodesics
that generate \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) must, if extended far enough into
past, fall into and remain in a compact subset of spacetime. Obviously
the spacetime of
Figure 1
fulfills Hawking’s requirement—since in this case \(H^+
(\Sigma_0)\) is itself compact—but just as obviously the
spacetime of
Figure 2
(conformally doctored or not) does not.

Imposing the requirement of a compactly generated future Cauchy
horizon has not only the negative virtue of excluding some unsuited
candidate time machine spacetimes but a positive virtue as well. It is
easily proved that if \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is compactly generated then
the condition of *strong causality* is violated on \(H^+
(\Sigma_0)\), which means, intuitively, there are almost closed causal
curves near \(H^+
(\Sigma_0)\).^{[17]}
This violation can be taken as an indication that the seeds of CTCs
have been planted on \(\Sigma_0\) and that by the time \(H^+
(\Sigma_0)\) is reached they are ready to bloom.

However, we still have no guarantee that if CTCs do bloom to the
future of \(\Sigma_0\), then the state on \(\Sigma_0\) is responsible
for the blooming. Of course, we have already learned that we cannot
have the iron clad guarantee of causal determinism that the state on
\(\Sigma_0\) is responsible for the actual blooming in all of its
particularity. But we might hope for a guarantee that the state on
\(\Sigma_0\) is responsible for the blooming of *some*
CTCs—the actual ones or others. The difference takes a bit of
explaining. The failure of causal determinism is aptly pictured by the
image of a future “branching” of world histories, with the
different branches representing different alternative possible futures
of (the domain of dependence of) \(\Sigma_0\) that are compatible with
the actual past and the laws of physics. And so it is in the present
setting: if \(H^+ (\Sigma_0) \ne \varnothing\), then there will
generally be different ways to extend \(D^+ (\Sigma_0)\), all
compatible with the laws of general relativistic physics. But if CTCs
are present in all of these extensions, even through the details of
the CTCs may vary from one extension to another, then the state on
\(\Sigma_0\) can rightly be deemed to be responsible for the fact that
subsequently CTCs did develop.

A theorem due to Krasnikov (2002, 2003 [Other Internet Resources],
2014a, 2018) might seem to demonstrate that no relativistic spacetime
can count as embodying a Thornian time machine so understood.
Following Krasnikov, let us say that a spacetime condition \(C\) is
*local* just in case, for any open covering \(\{V_{\alpha}\}\)
of an arbitrary spacetime \((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab}), C\) holds in
\((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) iff it holds in \((V_{\alpha},
g_{ab}|_{V_{\alpha}})\) for all \(\alpha\). Examples of local
conditions one might want to impose on physically reasonable
spacetimes are Einstein’s gravitational field equations and
so-called energy conditions that restrict the form of the
stress-energy tensor \(T_{ab}\). An example of the latter that will
come into play below is the *weak energy condition* that says
that the energy density is
non-negative.^{[18]}
Einstein’s field equations (sans cosmological constant) require
that \(T_{ab}\) is proportional to the Einstein tensor which is a
functional of the metric and its derivatives. Call a \(C\)-spacetime
\((\mathcal{M}', g'_{ab})\) a \(C\)-*extension* of a
\(C\)-spacetime \((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) spacetime if the latter is
isometric to an open proper subset of the former; and call
\((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab}) C\)-*extensible* if it admits a
\(C\)-extension and \(C\)-*maximal* otherwise. (Of course,
\(C\) might be the empty condition.) Krasnikov’s theorem shows
that every \(C\)-spacetime \((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) admits a
\(C\)-maximal extension \((\mathcal{M}^{max}, g^{max}_{ab})\) such
that all CTCs in \((\mathcal{M}^{max}, g^{max}_{ab})\) are to the
chronological past of the image of \(\mathcal{M}\) in
\((\mathcal{M}^{max}, g^{max}_{ab})\). So start with some candidate
spacetime \((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) for a Thornian time machine, and
apply the theorem to \((D^+ (\Sigma_0), g_{ab}|_{D^+ (\Sigma_0)})\).
Conclude that no matter what local conditions the candidate spacetime
is required to satisfy, \(D^+ (\Sigma_0)\) has extensions that also
satisfies said local conditions but does not contain CTCs to the
future of \(\Sigma_0\). Thus, the candidate spacetime fails to exhibit
the crucial feature identified above necessary for underwriting the
contention that the conditions on \(\Sigma_0\) are responsible for the
development of CTCs. Hence, it appears as if Krasnikov’s theorem
effectively prohibits time machines.

The would-be time machine operator need not capitulate in the face of
Krasnikov’s theorem. Recall that the main difficulty in
specifying the conditions for the successful operation of Thornian
time machines traces to the fact that the standard form of causal
determinism does not apply to the production of CTCs. But causal
determinism can fail for reasons that have nothing to do with CTCs or
other acausal features of relativistic spacetimes, and it seems only
fair to ensure that these modes of failure have been removed before
proceeding to discuss the prospects for time machines. To zero in on
the modes of failure at issue, consider vacuum solutions \((T_{ab}
\equiv 0)\) to Einstein’s field equations. Let \((\mathcal{M},
g_{ab})\) and \((\mathcal{M}', g'_{ab})\) be two such solutions, and
let \(\Sigma \subset \mathcal{M}\) and \(\Sigma ' \subset
\mathcal{M}'\) be spacelike hypersurfaces of their respective
spacetimes. Suppose that there is an isometry \(\Psi\) from some
neighborhood \(N(\Sigma)\) of \(\Sigma\) onto a neighborhood
\(N'(\Sigma ')\) of \(\Sigma '\). Does it follow, as we would want
determinism to guarantee, that \(\Psi\) is extendible to an isometry
from \(D^+ (\Sigma)\) onto \(D^+ (\Sigma ')\)? To see why the answer
is negative, start with any solution \((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) of the
vacuum Einstein equations, and cut out a closed set of points lying to
the future of \(N(\Sigma)\) and in \(D^+ (\Sigma)\). Denote the
surgically altered manifold by \(\mathcal{M}^*\) and the restriction
of \(g_{ab}\) to \(\mathcal{M}^*\) by \(g^*_{ab}\). Then
\((\mathcal{M}^*, g^*_{ab})\) is also a solution of the vacuum
Einstein equations. But obviously the pair of solutions
\((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) and \((\mathcal{M}^*, g^*_{ab})\) violates
the condition that determinism was supposed to guarantee as \(\Psi\)
is not extendible to an isometry from \(D^+ (\Sigma)\) onto \(D^+
(\Sigma^*)\). It might seem that the requirement, contemplated above,
that the spacetimes under consideration be maximal, already rules out
spacetimes that have “holes” in them. But while maximality
does rule out the surgically mutilated spacetime just constructed, it
does not guarantee hole freeness in the sense needed to make sure that
determinism does not stumble before it gets to the starting gate. That
\((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) is hole free in the relevant sense requires
that if \(\Sigma \subset \mathcal{M}\) is a spacelike hypersurface,
there does not exist a spacetime \((\mathcal{M}', g'_{ab})\) and an
isometric embedding \(\Phi\) of \(D^+ (\Sigma)\) into \(\mathcal{M}'\)
such that \(\Phi(D^+ (\Sigma))\) is a proper subset of \(D^+
(\Phi(\Sigma))\). A theorem due to Robert Geroch (1977, 87), who is
responsible for this definition, asserts that if \(\Sigma \subset
\mathcal{M}\) and \(\Sigma ' \subset \mathcal{M}'\) are spacelike
hypersurfaces in hole-free spacetimes \((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) and
\((\mathcal{M}', g'_{ab})\), respectively, and if there exists an
isometry \(\Psi : \mathcal{M} \rightarrow \mathcal{M}'\), then
\(\Psi\) is indeed extendible to an isometry between \(D^+ (\Sigma)\)
and \(D^+ (\Sigma ')\). Thus, hole freeness precludes an important
mode of failure of determinism which we wish to exclude in our
discussion of time machines. It can be shown that hole freeness is not
entailed by
maximality.^{[19]}
And it is just this gap that gives the would-be time machine operator
some hope, for the maximal CTC-free extensions produced by
Krasnikov’s construction are not always hole free (Manchak
2009b). But Krasnikov (2009) has shown that the Geroch (1977)
definition is too strong: Minkowski spacetime fails to satisfy it! For
this reason, alternative formulations of the hole-freeness definition
have been constructed which are more appropriate (Manchak 2009a,
Minguzzi 2012).

Thus, we propose that one clear sense of what it would mean for a Thornian time machine to operate in the setting of general relativity theory is given by the following assertion: the laws of general relativistic physics allow solutions containing a partial Cauchy surface \(\Sigma_0\) such that no CTCs lie to the past of \(\Sigma_0\) but every extension of \(D^+ (\Sigma_0)\) satisfying ________ contains CTCs (where the blank is filled with some “no hole” condition). Correspondingly, a proof of the physical impossibility of time machines would take the form of showing that this assertion is false for the actual laws of physics, consisting, presumably, of Einstein’s field equations plus energy conditions and, perhaps, some additional restrictions as well. And a proof of the emptiness of the associated concept of a Thornian time machine would take the form of showing that the assertion is false independently of the details of the laws of physics, as long as they take the form of local conditions on \(T_{ab}\) and \(g_{ab}\).

Are there “no hole” conditions which show the proposed concept of a
time machine is not empty? Let \(J^+(p)\) designate the *causal
future* of \(p\), defined as the set of all points in
\(\mathcal{M}\) which can be reached from \(p\) by a future-directed
causal curve in \(\mathcal{M}\). The *causal past* \(J^-(p)\)
is defined analogously. Now, we say a spacetime
\((\mathcal{M},g_{ab})\) is *J closed* if, for each \(p\) in
\(\mathcal{M}\), the sets \(J^+(p)\) and \(J^-(p)\) are topologically
closed. One can verify that J closedness fails in many artificially
mutilated examples (e.g. Minkowski spacetime with one point removed
from the manifold). For some time, it was thought that a time machine
existed under this no-hole condition (Manchak 2011a). But this turns
out to be incorrect; indeed a recent result shows that any J closed
spacetime \((\mathcal{M},g_{ab})\) of three dimensions or more with
chronology violating region \(V \neq \mathcal{M}\) must be strongly
causal and therefore fail to have CTCs (Hounnonkpe and Minguzzi 2019).
Stepping back, perhaps there are other no-hole conditions which can be
used instead to show that the proposed concept of a time machine is
not empty. But even if such a project were successful, Manchak (2014a,
2019) has shown that the time machine existence results can be
naturally reinterpreted as “hole machine” existence
results if one is so inclined. Instead of assuming that spacetime is
free of holes and then showing that certain initial conditions are
responsible for the production of CTCs, one could just as well start
with the assumption of no CTCs and then show that certain initial
conditions are responsible for the production of holes. Given the
importance of these no hole assumptions to the time machine advocate,
much recent work has focused on whether such assumptions are
physically reasonable in some sense (Manchak 2011b, 2014b). This is
still an open question.

Another open question is whether physically more realistic spacetimes than Misner also permit the operation of time machines and how generic time-machine spacetimes are in particular spacetime theories, such as general relativity. If time-machine spacetimes turn out to be highly non-generic, the fan of time machines can retreat to a weaker concept of Thornian time machine by taking a page from probabilistic accounts of causation, the idea being that a time machine can be seen to be at work if its operation increases the probability of the appearance of CTCs. Since general relativity theory itself is innocent of probabilities, they have to be introduced by hand, either by inserting them into the models of the theory, i.e., by modifying the theory at the level of the object-language, or by defining measures on sets of models, i.e., by modifying the theory at the level of the meta-language. Since the former would change the character of the theory, only the latter will be considered. The project for making sense of the notion that a time machine as a probabilistic cause of the appearance of CTCs would then take the following form. First define a normalized measure on the set of models having a partial Cauchy surface to the past of which there are no CTCs. Then show that the subset of models that have CTCs to the future of the partial Cauchy surface has non-zero measure. Next, identify a range of conditions on or near the partial Cauchy surface that are naturally construed as settings of a device that is a would-be probabilistic cause of CTCs, and show that the subset of models satisfying these conditions has non-zero measure. Finally, show that conditionalizing on the latter subset increases the measure of the former subset. Assuming that this formal exercise can be successfully carried out, there remains the task of justifying these as measures of objective chance. This task is especially daunting in the cosmological setting since neither of the leading interpretations of objective chance seems applicable. The frequency interpretation is strained since the development of CTCs may be a non-repeated phenomenon; and the propensity interpretation is equally strained since, barring just-so stories about the Creator throwing darts at the Cosmic Dart Board, there is no chance mechanism for producing cosmological models.

We conclude that, even apart from general doubts about a probabilistic account of causation, the resort to a probabilistic conception of time machines is a desperate stretch, at least in the context of classical general relativity theory. In a quantum theory of gravity, a probabilistic conception of time machines may be appropriate if the theory itself provides the transition probabilities between the relevant states. But an evaluation of this prospect must wait until the theory of quantum gravity is available.

## 4. No-go results for (Thornian) time machines in classical general relativity theory

In order to appreciate the physics literature aimed at proving no-go
results for time machines it is helpful to view these efforts as part
of the broader project of proving *chronology protections
theorems*, which in turn is part of a still larger project of
proving *cosmic censorship theorems*. To explain, we start with
cosmic censorship and work backwards.

Figure 3. A bad choice of initial value surface

For sake of simplicity, concentrate on the initial value problem for
vacuum solutions \((T_{ab} \equiv 0)\) to Einstein’s field
equations. Start with a three-manifold \(\Sigma\) equipped with
quantities which, when \(\Sigma\) is embedded as a spacelike
submanifold of spacetime, become initial data for the vacuum field
equations. Corresponding to the initial data there exists a
unique^{[20]}
maximal development \((\mathcal{M}, g_{ab})\) for which (the image of
the embedded) \(\Sigma\) is a Cauchy
surface.^{[21]}
This solution, however, may not be maximal simpliciter, i.e., it may
be possible to isometrically embed it as a proper part of a larger
spacetime, which itself may be a vacuum solution to the field
equations; if so \(\Sigma\) will not be a Cauchy surface for the
extended spacetime, which fails to be a globally hyperbolic
spacetime.^{[22]}
This situation can arise because of a poor choice of initial value
hypersurface, as illustrated in
Figure 3
by taking \(\Sigma\) to be the indicated spacelike hyperboloid of
\((1 + 1)\)-dimensional Minkowski spacetime. But, more interestingly,
the situation can arise because the Einstein equations allow various
pathologies, collectively referred to as “naked
singularities,” to develop from regular initial data. The strong
form of Penrose’s celebrated *cosmic censorship
conjecture* proposes that, consistent with Einstein’s field
equations, such pathologies do not arise under physically reasonable
conditions or else that the conditions leading to the pathologies are
highly non-generic within the space of all solutions to the field
equations. A small amount of progress has been made on stating and
proving precise versions of this
conjecture.^{[23]}

One way in which strong cosmic censorship can be violated is through
the emergence of acausal features. Returning to the example of Misner
spacetime
(Figure 1),
the spacetime up to \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is the unique maximal
development of the vacuum Einstein equations for which \(\Sigma_0\) is
a Cauchy surface. But this development is extendible, and in the
extension illustrated in
Figure 1
global hyperbolicity of the development is lost because of the
presence of CTCs. The *chronology protection conjecture* then
can be construed as a subconjecture of the cosmic censorship
conjecture, saying, roughly, that consistent with Einstein field
equations, CTCs do not arise under physically reasonable conditions or
else that the conditions are highly non-generic within the space of
all solutions to the field equations. No-go results for time machines
are then special forms of chronology protection theorems that deal
with cases where the CTCs are manufactured by time machines. In the
other direction, a very general chronology protection theorem will
automatically provide a no-go result for time machines, however that
notion is understood, and a theorem establishing strong cosmic
censorship will automatically impose chronology protection.

The most widely discussed chronology protection theorem/no-go result for time machines in the context of classical general relativity theory is due to Hawking (1992a). Before stating the result, note first that, independently of the Einstein field equations and energy conditions, a partial Cauchy surface \(\Sigma\) must be compact if its future Cauchy horizon \(H^+ (\Sigma)\) is compact (see Hawking 1992a and Chrusciel and Isenberg 1993). However, it is geometrically allowed that \(\Sigma\) is non-compact if \(H^+ (\Sigma)\) is required only to be compactly generated rather than compact. But what Hawking showed is that this geometrical possibility is ruled out by imposing Einstein’s field equations and the weak energy condition. Thus, if \(\Sigma_0\) is a partial Cauchy surface representing the situation just before or just as the would-be Thornian time machine is switched on, and if a necessary condition for seeing a Thornian time machine at work is that \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is compactly generated, then consistently with Einstein’s field equations and the weak energy condition, a Thornian time machine cannot operate in a spatially open universe since \(\Sigma_0\) must be compact.

This no-go result does not touch the situation illustrated in Figure 1. Taub-NUT spacetime is a vacuum solution to Einstein’s field equations so the weak energy condition is automatically satisfied, and \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is compact and, a fortiori, compactly generated. Hawking’s theorem is not contradicted since \(\Sigma_0\) is compact. By the same token the theorem does not speak to the possibility of operating a Thornian time machine in a spatially closed universe. To help fill the gap, Hawking proved that when \(\Sigma_0\) is compact and \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is compactly generated, the Einstein field equations and the weak energy condition together guarantee that both the convergence and shear of the null geodesic generators of \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) must vanish, which he interpreted to imply that no observers can cross over \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) to enter the chronology violating region \(V\). But rather than showing that it is physically impossible to operate a Thornian time machine in a closed universe, this result shows only that, given the correctness of Hawking’s interpretation, the observers who operate the time machine cannot take advantage of the CTCs it produces.

There are two sources of doubt about the effectiveness of
Hawking’s no-go result even for open universes. The first stems
from possible violations of the weak energy condition by stress-energy
tensors arising from classical relativistic matter fields (see Vollick
1997 and Visser and Barcelo
2000).^{[24]}
The second stems from the fact that Hawking’s theorem functions
as a chronology protection theorem only by way of serving as a
potential no-go result for Thornian time machines since the crucial
condition that \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is compactly generated is supposedly
justified by being a necessary condition for the operation of such
machine. But in retrospect, the motivation for this condition seems
frayed. As argued in the previous section, if the Einstein field
equations and energy conditions entail that all hole free extensions
of \(D^+ (\Sigma_0)\) contain CTCs, then it is plausible to see a
Thornian time machine at work, quite regardless ofwhether or not \(H^+
(\Sigma_0)\) is compactly generated or not. Of course, it remains to
establish the existence of cases where this entailment holds. If it
should turn out that there are no such cases, then the prospects of
Thornian time machines are dealt a severe blow, but the reasons are
independent of Hawking’s theorem. On the other hand, if such
cases do exist then our conjecture would be that they exist even when
some of the generators of \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) come from singularities
or infinity and, thus, \(H^+ (\Sigma_0)\) is not compactly
generated.^{[25]}

## 5. No-go results in quantum gravity

Three degrees of quantum involvement in gravity can be distinguished.
The first degree, referred to as quantum field theory on curved
spacetimes, simply takes off the shelf a spacetime provided by general
relativity theory and then proceeds to study the behavior of quantum
fields on this background spacetime. The Unruh effect, which predicts
the thermalization of a free scalar quantum field near the horizon of
a black hole, lies within this ambit. The second degree of
involvement, referred to as semi-classical quantum gravity, attempts
to calculate the backreaction of the quantum fields on spacetime
metric by computing the expectation value \(\langle \Psi \mid T_{ab}
\mid \Psi \rangle\) of the stress-energy tensor in some appropriate
quantum state \(\lvert\Psi\rangle\) and then inserting the value into
Einstein’s field equations in place of
\(T_{ab}\).^{[26]}
Hawking’s celebrated prediction of black hole radiation belongs
to this
ambit.^{[27]}
The third degree of involvement attempts to produce a genuine quantum
theory of gravity in the sense that the gravitational degrees of
freedom are quantized. Currently loop quantum gravity and string
theory are the main research programs aimed at this
goal.^{[28]}

The first degree of quantum involvement, if not opening the door to
Thornian time machines, at least seemed to remove some obstacles since
quantum fields are known to lead to violations of the energy
conditions used in the setting of classical general relativity theory
to prove chronology protection theorems and no-go results for time
machines. However, the second degree of quantum involvement seemed, at
least initially, to slam the door shut. The intuitive idea was this.
Start with a general relativistic spacetime where CTCs develop to the
future of \(H^+ (\Sigma)\) (often referred to as the “chronology
horizon”) for some suitable partial Cauchy surface \(\Sigma\).
Find that the propagation of a quantum field on this spacetime
background is such that \(\langle \Psi \mid T_{ab} \mid\Psi \rangle\)
“blows up” as \(H^+ (\Sigma)\) is approached from the
past. Conclude that the backreaction on the spacetime metric creates
unbounded curvature, which effectively cuts off the future development
that would otherwise eventuate in CTCs. These intuitions were partly
vindicated by detailed calculations in several models. But eventually
a number of exceptions were found in which the backreaction remains
arbitrarily small near \(H^+
(\Sigma)\).^{[29]}
This seemed to leave the door ajar for Thornian time machines.

But fortunes were reversed once again by a result of Kay, Radzikowski,
and Wald (1997). The details of their theorem are too technical to
review here, but the structure of the argument is easy to grasp. The
naïve calculation of \(\langle \Psi \mid T_{ab}\mid\Psi \rangle\)
results in infinities which have to be subtracted off to produce a
renormalized expectation value \(\langle \Psi \mid T_{ab}\mid\Psi
\rangle_R\) with a finite value. The standard renormalization
procedure uses a limiting procedure that is mathematically
well-defined if, and only if, a certain condition
obtains.^{[30]}
The KRW theorem shows that this condition is violated for points on
\(H^+ (\Sigma)\) and, thus, that the expectation value of the
stress-energy tensor is not well-defined at the chronology
horizon.

While the KRW theorem is undoubtedly of fundamental importance for
semi-classical quantum gravity, it does not serve as an effective
no-go result for Thornian time machines. In the first place, the
theorem assumes, in concert with Hawking’s chronology protection
theorem, that \(H^+ (\Sigma)\) is compactly generated, and we repeat
that it is far from clear that this assumption is necessary for seeing
a Thornian time machine in operation. A second, and more fundamental,
reservation applies even if a compactly generated \(H^+ (\Sigma)\) is
accepted as a necessary condition for time machines. The KRW theorem
functions as a no-go result by providing a *reductio ad
absurdum* with a dubious absurdity: roughly, if you try to operate
a Thornian time machine, you will end up invalidating semi-classical
quantum gravity. But semi-classical quantum gravity was never viewed
as anything more than a stepping stone to a genuine quantum theory of
gravity, and its breakdown is expected to be manifested when
Planck-scale physics comes into play. This worry is underscored by
Visser’s (1997, 2003) findings that in chronology violating
models trans-Planckian physics can be expected to come into play
before \(H^+ (\Sigma)\) is reached.

It thus seems that if some quantum mechanism is to serve as the basis
for chronology protection, it must be found in the third degree of
quantum involvement in gravity. Both loop quantum gravity and string
theory have demonstrated the ability to cure some of the curvature
singularities of classical general relativity theory. But as far as we
are aware there are no demonstrations that either of these approaches
to quantum gravity can get rid of the acausal features exhibited in
various solutions to Einstein’s field equations. An alternative
approach to formulate a fully-fledged quantum theory of gravity
attempts to capture the Planck-scale structure of spacetime by
constructing it from causal
sets.^{[31]}
Since these sets must be acyclic, i.e., no element in a causal set
can causally precede itself, CTCs are ruled out a priori. Actually, a
theorem due to Malament (1977) suggests that any Planck-scale approach
encoding only the causal structure of a spacetime cannot permit CTCs
either in the smooth classical spacetimes or a corresponding
phenomenon in their quantum
counterparts.^{[32]}

In sum, the existing no-go results that use the first two degrees of quantum involvement are not very convincing, and the third degree of involvement is not mature enough to allow useful pronouncements. There is, however, a rapidly growing literature on the possibility of time travel in lower-dimensional supersymmetric cousins of string theory. For a review of these recent results and a discussion of the fate of a time-traveller’s ambition in loop quantum gravity, see Smeenk and Wüthrich (2010).

## 6. Conclusion

Hawking opined that “[i]t seems there is a chronology protection agency, which prevents the appearance of closed timelike curves and so makes the universe safe for historians” (1992a, 603). He may be right, but to date there are no convincing arguments that such an Agency is housed in either classical general relativity theory or in semi-classical quantum gravity. And it is too early to tell whether this Agency is housed in loop quantum gravity or string theory. But even if it should turn out that Hawking is wrong in that the laws of physics do not support a Chronology Protection Agency, it could still be the case that the laws support an Anti-Time Machine Agency. For it could turn out that while the laws do not prevent the development of CTCs, they also do not make it possible to attribute the appearance of CTCs to the workings of any would-be time machine. We argued that a strong presumption in favor of the latter would be created in classical general relativity theory by the demonstration that for any model satisfying Einstein’s field equations and energy conditions as well as possessing a partial Cauchy surface \(\Sigma_0\) to the future of which there are CTCs, there are hole free extensions of \(D^+ (\Sigma_0)\) satisfying Einstein’s field equations and energy conditions but containing no CTCs to the future of \(\Sigma_0\). There are no doubt alternative approaches to understanding what it means for a device to be “responsible for” the development of CTCs. Exploring these alternatives is one place that philosophers can hope to make a contribution to an ongoing discussion that, to date, has been carried mainly by the physics community. Participating in this discussion means that philosophers have to forsake the activity of logical gymnastics with the paradoxes of time travel for the more arduous but (we believe) rewarding activity of digging into the foundations of physics.

Time machines may never see daylight, and perhaps so for principled reasons that stem from basic physical laws. But even if mathematical theorems in the various theories concerned succeed in establishing the impossibility of time machines, understanding why time machines cannot be constructed will shed light on central problems in the foundations of physics. As we have argued in Section 4, for instance, the hunt for time machines in general relativity theory should be interpreted as a core issue in studying the fortunes of Penrose’s cosmic censorship conjecture. This conjecture arguably constitutes the most important open problem in general relativity theory. Similarly, as discussed in Section 5, mathematical theorems related to various aspects of time machines offer results relevant for the search of a quantum theory of gravity. In sum, studying the possibilities for operating a time machine turns out to be not a scientifically peripheral or frivolous weekend activity but a useful way of probing the foundations of classical and quantum theories of gravity.

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### Acknowledgments

We thank Carlo Rovelli for discussions and John Norton for comments on an earlier draft. C.W. acknowledges support by the Swiss National Science Foundation (grant PBSK1-102693).