Medieval Theories of Transcendentals
Medieval theories of the transcendentals present an explication of the concept of ‘being’ (ens) in terms of the so-called ‘most common notions’ (communissima), such as ‘one’ (unum), ‘true’ (verum), and ‘good’ (bonum), and explain the inner relations and order between these concepts. In contrast to early modern accounts of the transcendental, these medieval theories regard the transcendental notions as properties of being and deal with the transcendentals within a conception of metaphysics as a ‘real science’ (scientia realis). The introduction of the doctrine of the transcendentals fundamentally transformed the medieval conception of metaphysics: it became the ‘common science’, the ‘transcendental science’, and ‘first philosophy’ in a new sense. Medieval theories of the transcendentals vary with regard to issues like the number and order of transcendental concepts and the systems of conceptual differentiation; the conceptual unity that is granted to them (analogy vs. univocity), and the way the transcendentals relate to the divine.
- 1. General Outline of the Doctrine of the Transcendentals
- 2. Sources of the Doctrine of the Transcendentals
- 3. Transcendentals and Predication
- 4. Three Models of the Transcendentals: Thomas Aquinas, Henry of Ghent and Eckhart, and John Duns Scotus
- 5. Transcendentals as First Objects of the Intellect
- 6. Transcendentals and Metaphysics
- 7. The Transcendental ‘One’
- 8. The Transcendental ‘True’
- 9. The Transcendental ‘Good’
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1. General Outline of the Doctrine of the Transcendentals
Some modern scholars define transcendentality in an extensional sense. Take for instance:
Def: “A transcendental predicate runs through all the categories and extends beyond to their first cause.” (Owens 1963, 111)
Def: “X is a transcendental iff the extension of the term that names X is greater than and includes the combined extensions of the terms that name each and every one of the categories into which being may be divided.” (Gracia 1992, 115)
Other scholars stress the necessity of an intensional account, which leaves more room for the diversity of medieval views on the meaning of the transcendental. A purely extensional definition of transcendentality can perhaps account for Aquinas’ understanding of the transcendental as that which runs through the categories because of its commonness, but it explains neither Scotus’ understanding of the transcendental as that which is not determined to a genus, nor the early Scotists’ conception of degrees of transcendentality. Moreover, it fails to explain why Aristotle and Ibn Sina must not be considered to have formulated a doctrine of transcendentals even though they indeed acknowledged the co-extensionality of transgeneric notions like ‘being’ and ‘one’. What characterized the doctrine of the transcendentals as it was developed in the Latin tradition from 1225 onwards was precisely the systematic account of the differences between transgeneric notions as the inner explications of the concept of ‘being’.
Although the Latin term ‘transcendens’ (i.e. ‘that what surpasses [something]’, pl. ‘transcendentia’) has older roots, indicating the nobility of being which is free from matter, its interpretation as ‘transcategorical’ appears first in logical treatises of the 12th century. In the 15th–16th century, the term ‘transcendentalis’ (pl. ‘transcendentalia’) was framed as a synonym of ‘transcendens’ in the ‘transgeneric’ sense, probably to distinguish it from the earlier sense. If the word ‘transcendental’ was introduced in the 15th–16th century, therefore, to extricate the meaning of the word ‘transcendent’ from the confusion with a different and older meaning of the word indicating the nobility of being, then the use of the term ‘transcendental’ by modern scholars to indicate a metaphysical doctrine formulated in the 13th century entails an anachronism, innocent perhaps, but manifest.
Once the distinction of ‘transcendens’ in the sense of predicative commonness and ‘transcendens’ in the sense of the nobility of being is made, a further distinction arises, articulating different aspects of the ‘surpassing’ (transcensus) expressed by the term ‘transcendens’ in the new meaning of ‘transcendental’: “Scholastic transcendental philosophy intends a threefold ‘transcensus’: ontological, logical and epistemological. The ‘transcensus’ is primarily ontological in nature, insofar as it is directed to the transcendentia, which are so called, because these terms transcend the categories of being. But the ‘transcensus’ also possesses a logical-semantical aspect, insofar as it is directed to the communissima, and an epistemological aspect, insofar as it is directed to the prima, the first conceptions of the intellect. Between these three aspects there exists an inner connection: transcendentals are the ‘firsts’, since they are most common; and because of their commonness they transcend the categories.” (Aertsen 2012, 657) In the following, these three aspects of ‘surpassing’ will guide the historico-systematic elaboration of the new meaning of ‘transcendens’ as ‘transcendental’.
Finally, it has to be noted that this new meaning of ‘transcendens’ as transcendental was itself subject to evolution. The Latin term ‘transcendens’ is translated: ‘that which surpasses [something]’. The term clearly requires a complement, i.e. an indication of what is surpassed in the ‘transcensus’. The history of the ‘transcendental’ can be described in terms of the variety of its complements: “The scholastic concept of ‘transcendental’, which since Albert the Great is the proper subject of metaphysics, is opposed to the concept of the categorical. The transcendental is therefore the transcategorical. From the 15th century onwards the transcendental determination appears frequently in opposition to the so-called ‘super-transcendental’, i.e. the most universal determinations like ‘opinabile’ or ‘intelligibile’ that are common to real beings and beings of reason. With a view to this opposite concept of the ‘super-transcendental’, the transcendental is to be conceived as a most common determination that applies to all real beings, including God (…). This constellation of concepts changes with Kant. The concept of transcendental as the common predicate of a certain type of cognition is opposed to the concept of the empirical.” (See the entry ‘Transzendental’, in Historisches Wörterbuch der Philosophie, Volume 10, pp. 1358–9.) Since especially the Kantian understanding of the transcendental has been influential for modern minds, it must be emphasized at the outset that the medieval understanding of transcendental is not opposed to the empirical, but to the categorical; in fact, all medieval authors acknowledge an empirical origin of the transcendental notions. They articulate this connection between transcendental and empirical in a realist program of metaphysics.
2. Sources of the Doctrine of the Transcendentals
The Summa de bono of Philip the Chancellor (ca. 1225) is considered to be the first systematic formulation of a doctrine of the transcendentals. (Aertsen 2012, 109–127) But there are some main sources that provided essential elements for the doctrine.
Aristotle, e.g., gives an exemplary treatment of the relation between the concepts of ‘being’ and ‘the one’ in the fourth book of his Metaphysics, where he explains that just as being is said in many ways, so also the one; consequently, these notions share the same nature (phusis), while differing qua concept (logos). (Aristotle, Metaph. IV, c. 2, 1003 b 23–4) In the tenth book of the Metaphysics, he explains that the proper meaning of ‘one’ is ‘indivisible’, such that to be one is to be indivisible. (Arist., Metaph. X, c. 1, 1052 b 16.) This model of pairing co-extensionality to intensional difference was to provide the basic framework for a doctrine of the transcendentals. Aristotle’s indications of a focal meaning of being, which reduces the homonymy of the term in such a way as to safeguard the unity of the subject of metaphysics and its possibility as a science (Arist., Metaph. IV, c. 2, 1003 a 32 sqq.), were the starting-point for the medieval reflection on analogy as a mode of predication especially applying to transgeneric terms (cf. the entry on medieval theories of Analogy). Other important texts in the corpus aristotelicum address the question of truth and the question of goodness. Aristotle’s different assertions on the issue of truth confronted the Middle Ages with a tension. On the one hand, Aristotle asserted that each thing is related to truth in the same way as it is to being; on the other hand, Aristotle excluded being-as-true from the consideration of metaphysics, since it is only a kind of intra-mental being. (Arist., Metaph. II, c. 1, 9993 b 30; Metaph. VI, c. 4, 1027 b 17 sqq.) In his critique of Plato’s Idea of the Good, finally, Aristotle asserts that the good is said in as many ways as being, and hence falls short of the univocity proper to a Platonic idea. (Arist., Eth. Nic. I, c. 4, 1096 a 12 sqq.)
Another main source is the Persian thinker Ibn Sina (Lat. Avicenna), who discusses the concepts of ‘being’, ‘thing’, and ‘the one’ as the primary conceptions of the intellect in his Metaphysics I.5. He introduces the idea of primary conceptions by drawing a seminal analogy between first principles in the order of judgment and in the order of conception: just as there are first principles in the order of judgment, at which the reduction or analysis of propositional knowledge comes to an end (e.g. the principle of non-contradiction), so there are also first principles in the order of conception, which are primitive in the sense that they cannot be defined by appealing to some more general notion. Getting knowledge of them is not making an unknown thing known, but bringing something to mind that was always already known, by means of logically derivative ‘trigger’-notions. The relation between the two most important primary conceptions ‘being’ and ‘thing’, which denote an existential resp. an essential aspect of things, takes the form of a priority of ‘thing’ or ‘essence’, to which ‘being’ is necessarily concomitant. An important other innovation, directly related to the foregoing, was Ibn Sina’s rejection of the theological interpretation of the subject of metaphysics. Since the existence of the subject of a science must be demonstrated beforehand, and God’s existence is to be demonstrated in the science of metaphysics, God cannot be the subject of this science. Moreover, since metaphysics is the first science, nothing else can be its subject, except for something that cannot be demonstrated, since it is self-evident. Hence, Ibn Sina’s declarations that (1) being is a primary conception and that (2) being is the subject of metaphysics are correlated.
Other sources of the doctrines of the transcendentals are Augustine, Boethius, and Dionysius the Areopagite, representing the interpretation of the Platonic ideas as divine names in the Christian tradition. In diverse works, Augustine discusses unity, truth, goodness, and being as predicates that are instantiated in a primary and privileged way in God, and instantiated in a derivative way in God’s creation. As a consequence, knowledge of created unity, truth, goodness, and being has to make explicit this relation to its divine origin, which, in Augustine’s work itself and in the Augustinian tradition, frequently takes the form of an ascent to God as a demonstration of God’s existence. In his treatise De divinis nominibus, pseudo-Dionysius Areopagita gives an extensive treatment of the Good, Being, Truth, Beauty, and Unity as the names of God. Itself adherent to Neoplatonic philosophy, in which the Good is proclaimed to be above being, Dionysius’ work was interpreted by 13th century theoreticians of the doctrine of the transcendentals in the frame of a synthesis of Aristotelianism and Platonism that harmonizes the transcendent and the transcendental. Finally, Boethius explicitly discusses the convertibility of ‘being’ and ‘one’, and his treatise De hebdomadibus addresses the relation between being and the good, with a view to safeguard the goodness of reality without infringing upon the substantial goodness of its creator. One can say that De hebdomadibus was a true model for the later elaboration of the doctrine of the transcendentals in the first half of the 13th century, which, in its first phase, had a strong focus on the notion of the good.
3. Transcendentals and Predication
The predication of transcendentals has a logical, ontological, and epistemological sense that can be distinguished as follows. In a logical sense, as predicative expressions, ‘transcendental terms’ are outside the range of the five predicables or universals listed by Porphyry in his Isagoge to Aristotle’s Categories, i.e. they are not a genus, species, difference, property, or accident. Their signification is not bound to the categorical horizon, and they resist ‘infinitatio’ (for this term, cf. infra). In an ontological sense, as properties signified by the predicate of a proposition that are asserted of the object signified by the subject of the proposition, transcendentals are properties that are not restricted to, but run through the classes of things expressed by the highest genera, the categories. In an epistemological sense, finally, as predicative concepts expressed by the predicate of a proposition that are connected with the concept expressed by the subject of the proposition into a thought expressed by the proposition itself, transcendentals are concepts that cannot be analyzed by taking recourse to a still higher genus and are, therefore, first known, self-evident, and primitive.
The predicative context is commonly suggested to be the historical origin of the term ‘transcendens’ in the meaning of ‘transcendental’. (See Jacobi 2003; Valente 2007; Aertsen 2012, 42sqq.) Various 12th century logical texts recognize the distinctive semantical nature of transcategorical terms, which they refer to, among others, as ‘transcendent names’ (nomina transcendentia). Three instances: (i.) Whereas a Vienna Priscian-commentary partially edited by De Rijk (dated ca. 1150) identifies a certain class of names “that are so universal that they run through all categories”, such as ‘being’, ‘thing’, ‘one’, ‘something’, the Ars Meliduna (between 1154/1180) distinguishes transgeneric terms from universals proper. “No name that belongs to every thing, such as ‘thing’, ‘something’, ‘being’, and ‘one’, signifies a universal”. Since universals are bound up to genera, transgeneric terms do not signify a universal. The categories, as the highest genera, determine what a thing is, the transgeneric names signify that it is. (ii.) In the debate on “infinite names” (nomina infinita), which refers to the possibility of ‘making a term infinite’ (infinitatio) by term-negation, a distinction is made in the Introductiones Montane minores (ca. 1130) and the Tractatus Anagnini (ca. 1200), between finite terms and terms that “contain all things”, e.g. ‘thing’ and ‘something’. Since these terms are not finite, they cannot be made infinite: “Terms that contain all things cannot be made infinite, hence this is senseless: ‘a non-something is’, ‘a non-thing is’.” (iii.) In the discussion on the equivocity of names in the Dialectica Monacensis (between 1150–1200), a specific type of equivocation is identified, in which something is signified primarily, everything else secondarily, and this type of equivocation is connected with the nomina transcendentia, i.e. names like ‘thing’, ‘being’, ‘one’, ‘universal’, ‘possible’, ‘contingent’, ‘the same’ and ‘diverse’ as such. (See Jacobi 2003.)
The logical ‘surpassing’ expressed by the nomina transcendentia is the order of the predicables or universals described by Porphyry. If the relation between subject and predicate, Porphyry claims, is such that the predicate belongs to the essence of the subject, then it is either a genus, or species, or difference; if the predicate does not belong to the essence of the subject, it is either convertible with it, and then it is a property (proprium), or if not convertible, then it is an accident. Now the most universal are Aristotle’s ten categories, which Porphyry defines as “that above which there will be no other superordinate genus.” (Porph., Introduction 2.5) In answer to the question whether ‘being’, since it is said of everything, is not a genus common to the highest genera, Porphyry states that the ten categories are primarily diverse, and hence concludes to the equivocity of ‘being’.
The formation of the doctrine of the transcendentals in the 13th century introduces a class of predicates that are not discussed by Porphyry. In reaction to this absence, one can either define the transcendentals in contradistinction to universals, as witnessed in the Ars Meliduna, or extend the list of universals by including a sixth universal predicable. An instance of the first reaction we find in William of Ockham’s Commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge, who explicitly addresses the question whether the classification of the predicables with regard to the concept of being is exhaustive (i.e. the question of the “sufficiency” of Porphyry’s division of the predicables), and distinguishes between terms that are predicates of many, the universals, and terms predicated of all, the common terms. (Ockham, Expositio in librum Porphyrii de Praedicabilibus, prooem. 2) An instance of the second reaction we find in Duns Scotus; as a consequence of his defense of the univocity of being, Scotus is prepared in his Commentary on the Metaphysics to extend the list of predicables with a sixth one, a ‘transcendental universal’ (universale transcendens), as examples of which he names ‘being’ and ‘one’. (Duns Scotus, Quaestiones super libros Metaphysicorum, IV, q. 1)
Porphyry’s list of predicables not only occasioned the question of its relation to transcendental predicates, but also supplied a model to express the relation of ‘being’ to the other transcendentals as the relation between a subject and its properties (propria). Although the transcendentals are co-extensive, they differ conceptually. The privileged model to express this relationship was the predication of a property (proprium) of a subject, which is defined by Porphyry with two characteristics: on the one hand, properties are convertible with the subject, on the other hand, they are outside the essence of the subject. The first characteristic was of great convenience, since it offers the possibility to combine the convertibility of the transcendentals with the basic task of science: to demonstrate the existence of properties that belong per se to its subject and are hence convertible with it. By explaining the relation between ‘being’ and the other transcendental predicates as the relation between a subject and its properties, the doctrine of the transcendentals gives flesh to the science of ‘being’ called metaphysics, the core of which is the demonstration that ‘being’ has convertible properties, like ‘one’, ‘true’, and ‘good’. The second characteristic of a property was more problematic at the transcendental level, for it implies the recognition that the transcendentals, as really distinct from being, are nothing. Most theoreticians of the transcendentals, therefore, denied the application of this second characteristic to the transcendental level and held that a transcendental property differs from being only conceptually (secundum rationem). Duns Scotus and the tradition he established, however, accepted a real distinction in the sense of a formal distinction (for this term, cf. infra) in the relation between ‘being’ and its transcendental properties.
4. Three Models of the Transcendentals: Thomas Aquinas, Henry of Ghent and Eckhart, and John Duns Scotus
From 1225 onwards, a series of medieval doctrines of the transcendentals was formulated by such diverse authors as Philip the Chancellor, the authors of the Summa Halensis, Bonaventure, and Albert the Great that are centered, for historical reasons, on the transcendentality of the good. Between 1250 and 1330, the doctrine reached its maturity in the works of Thomas Aquinas, Henry of Ghent, John Duns Scotus, the early Scotists, and William of Ockham. The whole tradition of reflection on the transcendental properties of being was synthesized in the Disputationes metaphysicae of Francisco Suárez (published 1597), which built the most elaborate account of the transcendentals known in the high and later Middle Ages.
Insight into the variety of medieval doctrines of the transcendentals, however, is better served by the contrast of typical models of a doctrine of the transcendentals than by an overview of the history of the transcendentals tout court. Apart from the differences in the internal connection of the transcendental concepts, one of the most important aspects on which these different models of a doctrine of the transcendentals vary is the relation between the transcendental and the transcendent. According to Thomas Aquinas, transcendental being extends only to created being, whereas Henry of Ghent and Meister Eckhart formulate a doctrine of the transcendentals in which God is the first known; Duns Scotus, finally, makes transcendental being indifferent to finite and infinite being; it is univocally common to God and creature. (See Aertsen 2012, 666.)
4.1 The first model: God as the cause of transcendental being (Thomas Aquinas)
The doctrine of the transcendentals of Thomas Aquinas (1224/5–1274) answers to the question of how an addition to being as ‘first known’ is possible. Aquinas’ solution is that such an addition is possible as the explication of a mode of being that is not yet said by ‘being’ itself: either through a special mode of being, i.e. one of the categories, which contract ‘being’ in their own way, or through a general mode of being, i.e., one of the transcendentals, the addition of which does not yield such a contraction. The basic text De ver. 1.1 explains that the expressed mode of being pertains to every being in itself or in relation to something else. If it pertains to every being in itself, it can either be said positively, i.e. the essence indicated by ‘thing’ (res), or negatively, and that is the ‘indivision’ expressed by ‘one’. If it pertains to every being in relation to something else, it can express either the difference between beings, which is indicated by ‘something’ (aliquid), or their conformity. Since the soul is “in a sense all things”, it is suited to conform to every being. A being either conforms to the soul’s cognitive faculty, which is expressed by ‘true’, or to the appetitive faculty, which is expressed by ‘good’. Aquinas declares ‘being in general’ (ens commune) to be the subject of metaphysics and God to be the principle of this subject (In Metaph., prooem.). Parallel to this restriction of the subject of metaphysics to created being, there is a restriction of the first object of the intellect to the ‘quiddity of material things’ or to ‘being and the true as found in material things’. Reflection on the relation between God and ‘being in general’, which leads Aquinas to present the transcendentals as divine names, and thus to integrate the Platonic and Aristotelian traditions of reflection on ‘being’, ‘one’, ‘true’, and ‘good’, gives rise to the influential doctrine of the analogical predication of the transcendental terms. As stated in the treatise on natural law, the transcendentals ‘being’ (ens) and ‘good’ serve as the foundation of the principles of theoretical and practical reason (S.th. I-II. 94.2).
4.2 The second model: The theological transformation of the first concepts (Henry of Ghent & Eckhart)
Typical of the doctrine of the transcendentals of Henry of Ghent († 1293) is his defense of the doctrine of God as first known, which had been elaborated in the Franciscan tradition by Bonaventure and had been rejected by Aquinas. On account of his different understanding of analogy, not treated as a mode of predication as in Aquinas, but as the property of a concept, Henry achieves an integration of the divine names in his doctrine of the transcendentals as the most general aspects of being that recognizes a priority of the divine over the creaturely within the transcendental concepts as such. What has been called Henry’s “new way to God” starts with the acknowledgement that something finite is good and goes on to purify this content of ‘good’ along different degrees of abstraction, in order to reach the infinite realization of this content in God. The claim is that it can only be understood that something finite is good, if the infinite realization of the good is always already implicitly understood (and the same holds for being and the other transcendentals). Naturally, there is a major difference in the epistemic status of the evidence, on the one hand, that being and the other transcendentals are first known objects in the analysis of cognition, and of the evidence, on the other hand, that God is first known, exerting a natural priority within these transcendental concepts as such. Whereas God is absolutely yet indistinctly the first known, ‘being’ is distinctly known first. Another important shift in comparison to Thomas Aquinas lies in Henry’s identification of the concepts of ‘being’ and ‘thing’, i.e. the essentialist interpretation of being. Henry construes his doctrine of the transcendentals, quoting Aquinas, as a series of conceptual additions to being as first known, but disagrees with Aquinas as regards the meaning of the concept of being: it does not signify the actuality of being, but the aspect of essence, for which Aquinas had reserved the term ‘thing’ (res). Although Henry follows Aquinas in his affirmation that only negations and conceptual relations can add something to being without contracting it – he strongly emphasizes the origin of these conceptual additions in the intellect –, he asserts that the ‘negation of negation’ expressed by ‘the one’ as adding the aspect of indivision is something positive.
Meister Eckhart (ca. 1260–1328) presents the same model of the transcendental as Henry of Ghent. The doctrine of the transcendentals has an unprecedented importance in Eckhart’s project of the Opus tripartitum, where the transcendental metaphysics of the Opus propositionum is foundational both for the systematic theology in the Opus quaestionum and for the exegesis of the Bible in the Opus expositionum et sermonum. The identification of the transcendentals with God, which is Eckhart’s version of the doctrine of God as first known, the doctrine of analogy, and the inclusion of spiritual perfections, such as justice and wisdom, among the transcendentals, all betray the influence of Henry of Ghent.
4.3 The third model: being as univocally common to God and creature (Duns Scotus)
Duns Scotus (ca. 1266–1308) identifies the subject of metaphysics with the first object of the intellect; since “all things naturally knowable of God are transcendental,” metaphysics includes a consideration of the divine. Scotus formulates a new conception of transcendentality, according to which a transcendental has no predicate above it except being. The consequence is that a transcendental is not necessarily common: “Therefore, it belongs to the meaning of ‘transcendental’ to have no predicate above it but ‘being’; however, that it be common to many inferiors, is inessential.” Thus, the range of the transcendental is extended. Apart from the common notions, therefore, that are simply convertible with the concept of ‘being’, like ‘the one’, ‘the true’, and ‘the good’, Duns Scotus admits disjunctive transcendentals, i.e. transcendentals that are disjunctively convertible with the concept of ‘being’, like ‘infinite’-‘finite’, ‘act’-‘potency’, etc. Finally, he also includes ‘pure perfections’, like ‘wisdom’, in the class of transcendentals and even claims that all transcendentals are called ‘pure perfections’ (perfectiones simpliciter). The concept of being is a quidditative notion that indicates the aptitude to exist and that is univocally predicated of God and creature, without – and this is the major innovation here – positing a reality common to them. Between ‘being’ and the convertible transcendentals, like ‘the one’, there is a so-called formal distinction: without being different things from being, ‘the one’, ‘the true’, and ‘the good’ are distinct from being and from each other by a different formality. Between ‘being’ and the disjunctive transcendental properties, there is a modal distinction. Scotus applies the theory of the ‘intension and remission of forms’ to the transcendentals (which introduces degrees of perfection in the transcendentals); hence, the common concept of ‘being’ and the proper concept of ‘infinite being’ are distinguished as a reality and its proper and intrinsic mode. (See Wolter 1946 & Dumont 1992.)
The Scotist school in the early fourteenth century discusses and extends Scotus’ major innovations: the new conception of transcendentality, which separates transcendentality from commonness and leads to the introduction of ‘degrees of transcendentality’, the univocity of being, and the explanation of the non-identity of the transcendentals by a distinction that is not merely conceptual.
5. Transcendentals as First Objects of the Intellect
An important aspect of the transcendentals is that they are the first in a cognitive respect. Medieval authors frequently indicate the whole group of transcendental concepts as first conceptions, although in a strict sense only the concept of ‘being’ is the first known, to which the other transcendental determinations add their proper characteristics. As already Ibn Sina remarked – to whom the theoreticians of the doctrine of the transcendentals owed the very idea of first conceptions – these notions cannot be defined by some higher genus and must, therefore, be self-evident. They are made known by a conceptual analysis (resolutio) that leads to the most common as first known, which the synthetical construction of knowledge takes as its starting point. What is uncovered in this way is something implicitly present in all cognition, as the formal condition of all knowledge.
This aspect was brought to the fore by Thomas Aquinas in what has come to be known as ‘the objective turn’. In his commentary on Boethius’ De trinitate, Aquinas advances the thesis that “to each [cognitive] power, its proper object is first known” (Super Boethium De trinitate, q. 1, art. 3). Since what specifies a cognitive power is its proper object – i.e. the formal aspect under which something is represented by that power –, the identification of the first known with the proper object of the intellect presents a significant claim. What is first in the order of conceptual cognition is most common and self-evident not by accident, for it indicates the formal aspect of intelligibility, which is included in all knowledge and about which the intellect cannot be uncertain. As such, it indicates the horizon of cognition. This promotion of a most common element of knowledge to the very horizon of knowledge, which was broadly acknowledged in the medieval debate on the first known, turned the medieval debate into a critique of knowledge.
In reaction to the early Franciscan doctrine of God as first known (Guibert of Tournai, Bonaventure), Aquinas distinguished between a resolution that leads to what is first and better known in itself (God as the first cause) and a resolution that leads to what is first and better known for us, being in general. In the Summa theologiae, Aquinas even more radically calls the ‘essence of things material’ (quiditas rei materialis) the proper object of the human mind; the point is that man in this life has no knowledge of the essence of immaterial things, which make it impossible that God be known first. Henry of Ghent reinstates the doctrine of God as first known. His theological transformation of the first concepts, i.e. the priority he accords to the divine over the creaturely within the transcendental concepts as such, makes God’s quiddity the first known in natural cognition, only unconsciously and indeterminately conceived. Against both Thomas Aquinas and Henry of Ghent, John Duns Scotus formulated his distribution of the first object of the intellect. He distinguishes three orders of intelligibility, each of which has its own first object: the order of origin, the order of perfection and the order of adequation. The first adequate object of the intellect is commensurate to the intellective power and indicates the scope of human reason. Neither finite (Aquinas: the essence of material things) nor infinite being (Henry of Ghent: God) are the first adequate object of human understanding, but the concept ‘being’ that is indifferent to finite and infinite being and is univocally common to God and creature.
Apart from the thesis that God is first known, the medieval debate presented also other positions that challenged the cognitive primacy of being. On the one hand, the conceptualists: thinkers like Peter of Auriol and William of Ockham denied that what is first by commonness, “being”, would be the adequate “moving object” of the intellect, for something common cannot move the intellect nor cause an intellectual cognition. The adequate moving object is the “proper entity” of a thing (Peter Auriol) or the singular as singular (Ockham). This thesis of the singular as first known was erected upon the important distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition. On the other hand, some authors claimed that something more common than “being” is first known. Here, all early medieval forerunners of the super-transcendental play a role, like the early Scotists (Nicolas Bonetus, Francis of Marchia) and other thinkers like Walter Burley and John Baconthorpe. They object to the primacy of being that the notion is not commensurate to the scope of intelligibility; something else that transcends the realm of real being and that is common to real being and being of reason, e.g. the concept of ‘thing’ or ‘something’, is truly the first adequate object of the intellect.
6. Transcendentals and Metaphysics
We have noticed that, as medieval doctrines of the transcendentals explain the relation between ‘being’ and the other transcendental predicates in the predicative model of subject and property, they obeyed the basic structure of a science and hence gave a concrete elaboration to metaphysics as the science of being as being. We have also noticed that the medieval doctrines of the transcendentals followed Ibn Sina’s rejection of the theological interpretation of the subject of metaphysics and grounded their ontological interpretation of the subject of this science on the identification of being as the subject of metaphysics and being as first known. As a consequence, the medieval conception of metaphysics was transformed. Metaphysics became the ‘common science’, the ‘transcendental science’, and ‘first philosophy’ in a new sense. (See Aertsen 2012, 672–3.) (i.) The science of being as being that is common to all things was founded by Ibn Sina on ‘common being’ as its subject; Thomas Aquinas accordingly takes ‘being in general’ (ens commune) as the subject of metaphysics and makes this science the ‘common science’ (scientia communis). (ii.) Already in the Metaphysics-commentary of Albert the Great, the science of metaphysics is said to deal with the ‘first and transcendental (determinations)’ (prima et transcendentia). Duns Scotus completes this interpretation of metaphysics, by declaring it the ‘transcendental science’ (scientia transcendens). (iii) Whereas Aristotle founded the primacy of metaphysics as first philosophy on the nobility of the objects it was concerned with, i.e. the highest causes, the medieval foundation of being as the subject of metaphysics on being as the first known generated an entirely new interpretation of the primacy of metaphysics: this science is first, because it deals with the first conceptions of the mind. Whereas Aristotle’s first philosophy was the most difficult science to learn, metaphysics as the medieval first philosophy is the easiest of sciences, since it deals with the self-evident. (cf. Bonetus, Metaph. 2, c. 7)
The relation of doctrines of the transcendentals to the science of metaphysics rests on the recognition that the transcendentals are properties of being qua being, i.e. the basic features of reality. However, the epistemological aspect of doctrines of the transcendentals, i.e. their status as the first, primitive conceptions of the intellect, implicitly compromises the real character of the transcendental properties of being, given that what can be conceived exceeds the realm of what is real. Since the identity of the subject of first philosophy with the first object of the intellect was foundational for the medieval conception of metaphysics, a basic instability underlies the medieval conception of metaphysics and hence the doctrines of the transcendentals: being as the first object of the intellect goes beyond the extension of real being as the subject of metaphysics. (See Goris 2008 & 2011) This instability is witnessed by the work of two Scotists in the early 14th century: Nicolas Bonetus and Francis of Marchia.
Nicolas Bonetus places the doctrine of the formalities at the center of a new, and systematically elaborated, science of metaphysics, which focuses on the doctrine of the transcendentals and reserves the consideration of the divine to natural theology. Bonetus considers the concept of being, insofar as it is univocal to real being and being in the mind, as the subject of metaphysics. From this univocal concept of being, which signifies some determinate intelligible content distinct from other intelligible contents, he distinguishes an all-encompassing notion of being which signifies “everything positive which is outside of nothing, whether it is real being, or being in the mind, whether categorical, reducible to categories, or outside of all categories.” The consequence is that ‘being’ as the subject of metaphysics, as a determinate formality distinct from other quiddities, is dissociated from the first object of the intellect, and convertible with the transcendental properties ‘one’, ‘true’, and ‘good’ only according to a diminished degree of transcendentality. A comparable tendency can be witnessed in the thought of Francis of Marchia. In answering the question concerning the first intention of a thing, Francis distinguishes between a material and formal priority of concepts. The concept of ‘thing’ (res) is the first concept in the sense of material priority, which is related to the priority of the subject of metaphysics. The concept of ‘something’ (aliquid) is the first concept in the sense of formal priority, which is related to the priority of the object of the intellect. The dissociation of the subject of metaphysics and the first object of the intellect is squared with the dissociation of a general metaphysics, which deals with the transcendentals and builds the road toward a special metaphysics, which deals with the divine. (See Folger-Fonfara 2008.)
In the light of these and later divisions of the science of metaphysics, Suarez’ project in the Disputationes metaphysicae is to be considered a defense of the unity of metaphysics, which nevertheless prolongs the dissociation that caused these divisions. (See Darge 2004). Suarez distinguishes between being as the first object of the intellect and being as the proper subject of metaphysics: “being insofar as it is real being.” This makes it clear, finally, that the characteristic foundation of medieval metaphysics, i.e. the identity of the subject of first philosophy with the first object of the intellect, did not lead, despite its basic instability, to a ‘super-transcendental’ metaphysics; instead of sacrificing the realist understanding of metaphysics, the medieval theoreticians of the doctrine of the transcendentals attacked the identity of the subject of first philosophy with the first object of the intellect. Underlying the medieval doctrines of the transcendentals from Aquinas to Suárez, therefore, is the realist understanding of metaphysics as a ‘science of the real’ (scientia realis).
7. The Transcendental ‘One’
The place of the concept of unity in the doctrine of the transcendentals is determined by two defining moments in particular: (i.) the relation between transcendental and categorical unity, or metaphysical and mathematical unity, i.e. the one as the principle of number; (ii.) the integration of the (Neo-)Platonic and Aristotelian traditions of thought on unity.
Already in Aristotle, the assertion of the transgeneric character of the one, that runs through the categories in the same way as the concept of ‘being’, and hence is convertible with it, is linked with the designation of ‘indivisibility’ as the proper meaning of unity, and is connected with the categorical one: it is “the first measure of a kind, and above all of quantity; for it is from this that it has been extended to the other categories.” (Aristotle, Metaph. X, c. 1, 1052 b 18–19.) In his most influential, yet highly controversial elaboration on the concept of unity, Ibn Sina agrees with Aristotle that ‘one’ is co-extensional with ‘being’ and differs from it in its concept; he adds, however, that just like being, unity is not part of the substance of a thing, and hence accidental in the sense of extra-essential, a feature that he combines with its being accidental in the sense of being the principle of number in the category of quantity. Already Ibn Rushd criticized Ibn Sina for this confusion of the metaphysical ‘one’ with the mathematical ‘one’. The different reactions in the Latin medieval doctrines of the transcendentals reflect the differences in their internal systematics. Aquinas accuses Ibn Sina of being deceived by the equivocity of the one, confusing the one that is convertible with being and the one that is the principle of number. The point for Aquinas is that the one that is convertible with being adds only something conceptual to being, i.e. the negation of division; whereas the one that is the principle of number adds something real, i.e. the relation to a measure, as a consequence of which the extension of the concept of being is narrowed down to the category of quantity. Duns Scotus, however, agrees with the position that he ascribes to Ibn Sina, namely that being and the one are not essentially convertible, and therewith expresses the major divergence of his doctrine of the transcendentals, in which the transcendentals do not add merely something conceptual to ‘being’, but something really distinct, in the sense in which a property is really distinct from the subject. The argument, however, that Duns Scotus provides for his position, namely the observation that if ‘being’ and ‘one’ were essentially convertible, then multitude would be devoid of reality, is loyal to a major inspiration of Aquinas’ reflection on transcendental unity. Aquinas is also concerned to grant a positive meaning to multitude and even accords a transcendental dimension to multitude.
Although the positive appreciation of multitude in medieval doctrines of the transcendentals stands in clear contrast to the Neoplatonic reflection on the ‘One’, these doctrines tried to synthesize the Platonic and the Aristotelian traditions of speculation on unity, the so-called henological and ontological traditions, by integrating the transcendental and the transcendent dimensions of the ‘one’. This integration becomes evident in the doctrines of the transcendentals formulated by Aquinas and Meister Eckhart, and in Renaissance-Platonism, e.g. the treatise De ente et uno by Giovanni Pico della Mirandola. This same Neoplatonic tradition also inspired, however, a major critique of the doctrine of the transcendentals, as formulated in the commentary of Berthold of Moosburg on the Elementatio theologica of Proclus and in the works of Nicolas of Cusa.
8. The Transcendental ‘True’
In the same way as the reflection on the concept of unity in medieval doctrines of the transcendentals envisaged to articulate a more fundamental feature of unity underneath the mathematical conception of unity, their investigation into the transcendental notion of truth uncovered a basic feature of reality, prior to and explicative of its logical dimension as a property of propositions.
What is a basic tension in Aristotle’s affirmations concerning the relation between being and the true, i.e. the tension between the assertion that each thing is related to truth in the same way as it is to being and the assertion that being-as-true (ens ut verum) is a kind of intramental being that falls outside the science of metaphysics, is part of a synthesizing program in Anselm’s treatise De veritate, where the propositional truth, ontological truth, and moral truth are all explained, in an integrative effort, under the aegis of the basic concept of ‘rightness’ (rectitudo). Anselm’s definition was important in early attempts in the medieval doctrines of the transcendentals to relate the true that is convertible with being with the truth of the proposition. Gradually, the definition of truth as the ‘conformity of the thing with the intellect’ (adaequatio rei et intellectus) rose to hegemony, which has the advantage of making explicit the constitutive relation with the intellect, but threatens to make transcendental truth depend upon actual cognition.
In De ver. 1.1, Aquinas presents his analysis of the concept of truth in a threefold scheme, according to which there is a moment of conformity of intellect and thing, right between the thing as the foundation of truth and knowledge as its result; this conformity, in which the meaning of the true is formally accomplished, is transcendental truth. In contrast to this, in the Summa theol. Aquinas uses a twofold scheme, according to which the intellect is true in a primary sense, the thing only in a secondary sense, namely in relation to the intellect; the aptness of the ‘adaequatio’-formula is that it comprises both senses. In the development of Aquinas’ reflection on truth between De ver. and the Summa theol., therefore, an elimination of the intermediary moment occurs, a merging of transcendental truth with the truth of cognition, which has been interpreted as a dissolution of transcendental truth. (See Dewan 2004.)
The fundamental dimension of transcendental truth as an openness of being in its intelligibility to cognition, which Aquinas had identified in De ver., is also clearly expressed in Duns Scotus’ reflection on truth in his commentary on the sixth book of the Metaphysics. After having declared that all truth related to the divine intellect is studied by metaphysics, he continues to distinguish three senses in which the human mind is related to truth, of which only the first is studied by metaphysics: namely when a thing is said to be true because it is able to manifest itself to an intellect capable of perceiving it, of which Scotus explicitly says that it is convertible with being. The other senses, according to which a thing is true because it is assimilated to or known by the human intellect, fall outside the scope of metaphysics and belong to logic.
In response to the same tension that motivated Aquinas to give more emphasis to the intellect in the definition of transcendental truth, the transcendental true was advanced to claim conceptual precedence before and hence challenge the conceptual priority of the concept of being. Potencies are specified by the formal aspect under which they conceive things and the intellect is distinguished from the will, since the formal object of the former is the true, the formal object of the latter is the good. On account of ‘the objective turn’, the identification of the first known with the proper object, it is clear, therefore, that the true is in a sense the first known, as the formal aspect under which everything is understood by the intellect. Henry of Ghent is the main representative of this much-discussed position. He distinguishes between the true as what is ‘dispositively’ first known, in the sense of what is conditional for knowledge, and being as what is ‘objectively’ first known. This distinction respects the difference between direct and reflective cognition, but also shows the vulnerability of the medieval foundation of the priority of the concept of being. It might be taken as another example of the basic instability that underlies the doctrines of the transcendentals: the non-identity of the first object of the intellect and the subject of metaphysics.
9. The Transcendental ‘Good’
Whereas the transcendental ‘true’ imposes its difficulties to qualify as a property of being as being, the indication of which was Aristotle’s exclusion of being of reason from metaphysics, the transcendental ‘good’ raises the suspicion of a naturalistic fallacy, by making the ethical good depend upon the good as a property convertible with being. In a sense, the same difficulty presents itself with all the transcendental properties: the metaphysical explication of the concept of ‘being’ (ens) in the ‘most common notions’ (communissima), ‘one’ (unum), ‘true’ (verum), and ‘good’ (bonum), competes with the consideration of these notions in another science, in which they are principal: the one in mathematics, the true in logic, and the good in ethics.
The metaphysics of the good, as it is conceived in the thesis of the convertibility of the good and being in the medieval doctrines of the transcendentals, was central in the early elaboration of the doctrine. Its central inspiration was Aristotle’s critique on Plato’s Idea of the Good in the first book of the Nicomachean Ethics, which proclaimed the transgeneric and analogical character of the good and opened with an authoritative definition: “the good is that which all desire.” (Arist., Eth. Nic. I, c. 1, 1094a2–3) Medieval authors could rely on Boethius’ De hebdomadibus for an explanation of the goodness of reality, which builds basically on its being created by what is essentially good; the treatise is an exemplary harmonization of the Platonic and Aristotelian traditions, which assert the transcendence resp. the transcendentality of the good. Another important argument to account for the convertibility of being and good is found in Aquinas, who connects the actuality of being with the proper character of the good as that which is desirable – since a thing is desirable only insofar as it is perfect, and is only perfect insofar as it is in act, the goodness of a thing depends on the actuality of its being. Aquinas’ doctrine of the transcendentals also provides a major model to think of the relation between the metaphysical and the moral good, insofar as it is foundational not only for the realm of theoretical reason, but also for the realm of practical reason. In the same way as the first principle in theoretical reason, the principle of non-contradiction, is founded on the concept of ‘being’ as first known in the theoretical realm, the first principle in practical reason, the first precept of natural law: “Good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided,” is founded on the concept of ‘good’ as first known in the practical realm. (See Kluxen 1964, 93–100, & Aertsen 1996, 326–330.)
Interestingly, the metaphysics of the good, which had been central in the early elaboration of the doctrine of the transcendentals, seems to have lost some of its appeal in the wake of a new concept of being. Although Henry of Ghent organizes his treatise on the good in Summa 41.1 in accordance with Aquinas’ discussion of the good in De ver. 21.1, the essentialist interpretation of the concept of being that he established had only limited possibilities, and even less impulse, to account for the fundamental difference between the transcendental good and moral perfections. In Duns Scotus, the good is an absolute property formally distinct from being; in Suarez, ‘the good’ primarily signifies the perfection of a thing, while adding the aspect of suitability (convenientia), i.e. it connotes a nature having a natural inclination, capacity, or conjunction with such perfection.
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