Notes to Transmission of Justification and Warrant

1. For instance \(s\)’s background information should in this case include scientific assumptions—e.g., that a lethal quantity of the toxins contained in the specified mushrooms will kill an ordinary human being who has taken no antidote shortly after its absorption—and assumptions about Jones—e.g., that Jones is an ordinary individual who has taken no antidote.

2. \(\rE_1\) provides \(s\) with justification for \(\rP_1\) only given some background information. For instance, \(s\)’s background information should include assumptions about the toadstools in the risotto—e.g., that a large risotto of Boletus Satana is sufficiently rich in lethal toxins.

3. It is standard practice to distinguish propositional justification from doxastic justification. Roughly, a subject \(s\) has propositional justification for believing a proposition \(p\) just in case, whether or not \(s\) actually believes \(p\), it would be epistemically appropriate for \(s\) to believe \(p\). On the other hand, \(s\) is doxastically justified in believing \(p\) just in case \(s\) has propositional justification for believing \(p\) and \(s\) actually believes \(p\) in virtue of that justification.

4. Consider for instance Toadstool. Suppose that \(s\) acquires no justification from \(\rE_1\) for \(\rP_1\) because \(s\) ignores \(\rE_1\) or has a defeater of the justification from \(\rE_1\) for \(\rP_1\), or that \(s\) ignores that \(\rP_1\) entails \(\rQ_1\). In these cases, whether or not \(\rQ_1\) is justified for \(s, s\) has no justification for \(\rQ_1\) in virtue of \(s\)’s justification from \(\rE_1\) for \(\rP_1\) and \(s\)’s knowledge that \(\rP_1\) entails \(\rQ_1\). Yet if \(\rE_1\) had been known by \(s\) or if \(s\) had no defeater of the justification from \(\rE_1\) for \(\rP_1\), and \(s\) had known that \(\rP_1\) entails \(\rQ_1, s\) would have acquired some justification for \(\rQ_1\) in virtue of her justification for \(\rP_1\) from \(\rE_1\) and her knowledge of the entailment from \(\rP_1\) to \(\rQ_1\).

5. This is presumably what Wright actually means. For instance, Wright resumes the information dependence template by saying that the justification from \(e\) for \(p\) cannot transmit to \(p\)’s consequence \(q\)

if the justification for \(p\) supplied by \(e\) depends in the first place on prior and independent justification for \(q\). (Wright 2002: 336, edited)

Elsewhere, much in the same spirit, Wright observes that transmission may fail in

cases where there is justification for the premises in the first place only because the conclusion is antecedently justified. (2003: 57–58, edited)

As we explain in Sect. 4.1, Wright contends that we sometimes have justification to accept background propositions. Wright’s notion of acceptance is clarified in note 13.

6. Wright (2011) describes this type of justification as second order justification or as involving second order justification. We find these characterizations a bit misleading.

7. Brown (2004) has criticized an earlier refinement of (D3) in Wright (2003) and proposed an alternative amendment of the disjunctive template, criticized in turn by Wright (2011).

8. Lockhart (2019) questions the suitability of Wright’s characterization of the notion of a presupposition (or authenticity condition) of a cognitive project and proposes an improvement.

9. Smith (2009) also delivers an account of non-transmissivity of knowledge across valid inference criticized by Tucker (2012). A discussion of this account is beyond the aims of this entry.

10. Precisely, with ‘warrant’ Wright refers to a disjunctive notion of justification that encompasses both evidential/earned justification and non-evidential/unearned justification (cf. Wright 2004: 178 and 209).

11. Or, more controversially, in the sense that Moore is incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion (see mainly Davies 1998, 2000, 2003, 2004 and 2009). This explanation is more controversial because, as noted at the end of Sect. 2, there is wide agreement that the property of being a transmissive argument is different from the property of being an argument capable of resolving doubt about its conclusion.

12. For example, Wright believes that a cornerstone for the region of discourse about other people’s mental states is the proposition that other people do have minds. If one had no independent justification for believing this proposition, one’s observation that another person’s behavior and physical conditions are in all respects as if she were in a given mental state could supply one with no justification for believing that that person is actually in that mental state (cf. Wright 2004).

13. Entitlements are, for Wright, unearned in the sense that they depend on no a priori or a posteriori evidence. Furthermore, acceptance is to be understood, for Wright, as a more general attitude than belief that includes belief as a subcase. Acceptance of \(p\) also includes attitudes like acting under the assumption that \(p\) or taking \(p\) for granted (cf. Wright 2004).

14. Pryor’s dogmatism takes perceptions to be mental states different from beliefs (though likewise provided with representational or propositional content); perceptual justification is thus taken to be non-inferential. Pryor’s (2000, 2004) notion of perceptual justification is clearly internalist in character. Pryor’s recent characterizations of dogmatism allow for externalist notions of perceptual justification (see for instance the manuscript by Pryor in Other Internet Resources and Pryor 2013).

15. A similar diagnosis of the ineffectiveness of Moore’s proof has been offered by Burge (2003) and Markie (2005).

16. This is White’s argument in more detail. White models acquisition of justification as a boost in rational credence, to the effect that \(s\) acquires justification for \(x\) from \(y\) only if

\[\Pr(x\mid y) \gt \Pr(x)\]

i.e., \(y\) confirms \(x\). It is plausible that

\[\Pr (\rE_8\mid \rP_8) \cong \Pr(\rE_8\mid \notQ_8^*) \cong 1\]

i.e., \(s\)’s credence in \(\rE_8\) should be close to certainty if the truth of \(\rP_8\) or the truth of \(\notQ_8^*\) were given to her. Furthermore, since \(s\) shouldn’t in general expect to have an experience of a hand,

\[\Pr(\rE_8) \ll 1\]

i.e., \(s\)’s prior credence in \(\rE_8\) should be far from certainty. Thus

\[\Pr(\rE_8\mid \rP_8) \gt \Pr(\rE_8)\]


\[\Pr(\rE_8\mid \notQ_8^*) \gt \Pr(\rE_8).\]

The first inequality entails that

\[\Pr(\rP_8\mid \rE_8) \gt \Pr(\rP_8),\]

and the second that

\[\Pr(\notQ_8^*\mid \rE_8) \gt \Pr(\notQ_8^*).\]

So \(\rE_8\) confirms both \(\rP_8\) and \(\notQ_8^*\). This indicates that when \(s\) learns \(\rE_8\), \(s\) acquires some justification for both \(\rP_8\) and \(\notQ_8^*\). It can be shown that

\[\Pr(\notQ_8^*\mid \rE_8) \gt \Pr(\notQ_8^*)\]

entails that

\[\Pr(\rQ_8^*\mid \rE_8) \lt \Pr(\rQ_8^*).\]

This indicates that when \(s\) learns \(\rE_8, s\)’s justification for \(\rQ_8^*\) decreases. Thus, it seems that when \(s\) experiences as if there is a hand before her face, \(s\) cannot acquire justification for \(\rQ_8^*\). White concludes from this that if \(s\) has perceptual justification for \(\rP_8\), this justification cannot transmit from \(\rP_8\) to its logical consequence \(\rQ_8\). (For a more complete explanation of the formalism see the supplement on Bayesian Formalizations of the Information-Dependence Template.)

17. One of White’s (2006) Bayesian arguments against dogmatism would seem to attest that the information-dependence template is satisfied by Moore*. White argues that since

\[\Pr(\notQ_8^*\mid \rE_8) \gt \Pr(\notQ_8^*)\]

i.e., \(\rE_8\) confirms \(\notQ_8^*\)—it necessarily follows that

\[\Pr(\rQ_8^*\mid \rE_8) \lt \Pr(\rQ_8^*)\]

i.e., \(\rE_8\) disconfirms \(\rQ_8^*\) (see note 16 above). Furthermore, since \(\rP_8\) entails \(\rQ_8^*\), it necessarily follows that

\[\Pr(\rP_8\mid \rE_8) \le \Pr(\rQ_8^*\mid \rE_8).\]

The last two inequalities trivially imply by transitivity that

\[\Pr(\rP_8\mid \rE_8) \lt \Pr(\rQ_8^*).\]

As White suggests, if we model epistemic justification as sufficiently high rational credence, the last inequality says that \(\rE_8\) can justify \(\rP_8\) only if there is prior justification for \(\rQ_8^*\). In fact suppose \(j\) is the justification threshold. The inequality implies that

\[\Pr(\rP_8\mid \rE_8) \gt j\]

only if

\[\Pr(\rQ_8^*) \gt j.\]

For responses to White, see for instance Silins (2007), Weatherson (2007), Kung (2010) and Moretti (2015). (For a more complete explanation of the formalism see the supplement on Bayesian Formalizations of the Information-Dependence Template.)

18. Although Pryor (2000 and 2004) is not explicit on this point, he seems to implicitly accept that \(s\)’s experience as if \(p\) can provide \(s\) with prima facie justification for \(p\) whether or not \(s\) assumes any cornerstone.

19. Davies (1998, 2000, 2003 and 2009) proposes an independent diagnosis of non-transmissivity of McKinsey’s argument that exploits Davies’ controversial notion of transmissivity as ability to resolve doubt.

20. Things get worse as one considers Wright’s (2011) reformulation of (D4) as (D4\(^{*}\)): not-q entails \(r\). In this case it is clear that Water does not instantiate the (so reformulated) disjunctive template. For it seems possible that \(s\) (or \(s\)’s community) has failed to be embedded in an environment that contains water—so that \(\notQ_{10}\) is true—but ‘water’ nonetheless refers to a natural kind (the watery substance abounding on Twin Earth)—so that \(\rR_{\textit{water}}\) is false.

21. Endorsed more hesitantly in Wright (2011).

Copyright © 2023 by
Luca Moretti <>
Tommaso Piazza <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free