Supplement to Transmission of Justification and Warrant

Transmission of Propositional Justification versus Transmission of Doxastic Justification

A few philosophers—mainly Silins (2005) and Tucker (2010a, 2010b)—have argued that transmission and failure of transmission of justification should primarily be conceived of as phenomena pertaining to doxastic rather than propositional justification, and that non-transmissive arguments of propositional justification can still make an important epistemic contribution precisely when they are able to transmit doxastic justification. A consequence would be that some puzzling philosophical arguments found defective as non-transmissive of propositional justification can be re-evaluated as transmissive of doxastic justification.

Transmission of doxastic justification presumably obeys conditions that parallel those delineated in Sect. 2 for transmission of propositional justification. A subject \(s\)’s doxastic justification for \(p\) transmits to \(p\)’s consequence \(q\) if and only if:

\(s\) justifiably believes \(p\),
\(s\) competently deduces \(q\) from \(p\), and
\(s\) justifiably believes \(q\) such that at least part of her justification for \(q\) has been acquired by her in virtue of the satisfaction of (C1\(^{\land}\)) and (C2\(^{\land}\)).

(\(s\)’s competent deduction of \(q\) from \(p\) requires \(s\) to retain justified belief in \(p\) throughout the deduction, not to have relevant defeaters, and so on. See for instance Tucker 2010a.) It follows that failure of transmission of doxastic justification is instantiated—if this phenomenon is ever instantiated—if and only if (C1\(^{\land}\)), (C2\(^{\land}\)), or (C3\(^{+\land}\)) are not satisfied and, in interesting case, when (C3\(^{+\land}\)) is not satisfied while (C1\(^{\land}\)) and (C2\(^{\land}\)) are satisfied.

Why should the phenomenon of epistemic transmission principally concern doxastic justification? In response it can be observed that epistemic transmission is valuable primarily because it is a means to attain the goal of forming doxastically justified beliefs through inference. To pursue this goal, we need our inferences to transmit doxastic, rather than just propositional, justification. This is one reason why we should be primarily interested in transmission of doxastic justification (cf. Silins 2005 and Tucker 2010a). It should also be noted that by characterizing transmission as a phenomenon principally concerning propositional justification, one would endorse a commitment to regarding many intuitively transmissive arguments as non-transmissive. Consider the following inference:

This object is red.


This object is colored.

Color seems to instantiate indirectness (see Sect. 3.2 of this entry) so that it is non-transmissive of propositional justification. However, it also seems plain that Color is a transmissive argument. An effective means for retaining this intuition is to locate epistemic transmission at the doxastic level. If \(s\) justifiably believes P but \(s\) does not yet justifiably believe Q, by competently deducing Q from P, \(s\) can form the justified belief that Q, thereby satisfying condition (C3\(^{+\land}\)). Color shows that non-transmissive arguments of propositional justification instantiating indirectness can transmit doxastic justification. The same seems to be true of arguments instantiating the information-dependence template. Consider a deductively valid argument from \(p\) to \(q\) non-transmissive of propositional justification that satisfies that template. If \(s\) has justification for believing \(q\) but \(s\) does not bother, initially, to form the belief that \(q, s\) can arguably acquire doxastic justification for believing \(q\) by acquiring evidence \(e\) justifying \(p\) and by competently deducing \(q\) from \(p\) (cf. Silins 2005 and Tucker 2010a).

As said, the theses just illustrated interestingly apply to philosophically controversial arguments that many find defective as non-transmissive of propositional justification, and support the more favorable assessment that these arguments are at the service of improving \(s\)’s epistemic standing towards their conclusion by transmitting doxastic justification. Among these philosophically controversial arguments there are Moore’s proof of an external world (considered below in Sect. 4.1) and Dretske’s Zebra-argument (cf. Silins 2005 and Tucker 2010a).

Much in the same spirit, Pérez Otero (2018) suggests that the alleged inability of Moore’s proof to transmit propositional justification doesn’t prevent it from being a cogent argument, at least when the argument is addressed to an audience that doesn’t already deny or doubt its conclusion. In the relevant sense, an argument is cogent when those who recognize that they are justified in believing its premises and that the premises support the conclusion can somehow enhance their rational standing toward the conclusion. According to Pérez Otero, this doesn’t necessarily involve gaining a first-time justification for the conclusion, improving on an antecedent justification for it, or actually coming to justifiably believe the conclusion based on the premises. In the case of Moore’s proof, in particular, an important epistemic improvement resulting from running it would be that one’s belief system would be teased out and that one could come to recognize for the first time that one already had an appropriate justification for accepting the proof’s conclusion.

Copyright © 2023 by
Luca Moretti <>
Tommaso Piazza <>

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