Supplement to Truth Values

Suszko’s Thesis

In order to justify his claim that true and false are the only logical values, Suszko (1977) observes that every structural Tarskian many-valued propositional logic can be provided with a bivalent semantics.

1. Suszko’s reduction

Suszko considers structural Tarskian consequence relations and the notion of an \(n\)-valued matrix (i.e., \(n\)-valued valuation system and the corresponding \(n\)-valued logic). It is standard terminology to call a pair \(\mathfrak{L} = (\mathcal{L}, \vdash)\) a Tarskian (structural Tarskian) logic iff \(\vdash\) is Tarskian (structural and Tarskian). Using the above definition of an \(n\)-valued model and the notion of characterization of a logic by a valuation system, \(\mathfrak{L}\) is said to be characterized by an \(n\)-valued model \(\mathcal{M}\) iff \(\vdash_{\mathfrak{L}} = \vDash_{\mathcal{M}}\). The logic \(\mathfrak{L}\) is characterized by a class \(\mathfrak{M}\) of \(n\)-valued models iff \(\vdash_{\mathfrak{L}} = \cap \{\vDash_{\mathcal{M} } \mid \mathcal{M} \in \mathfrak{M}\)}.

Ryszard Wójcicki (1970) showed that every structural Tarskian logic is characterized by its so-called Lindenbaum bundle, which is a certain class of matrices syntactically defined using the formulas of the language as values:

\(\{\langle \langle \mathcal{L}, \{A \in \mathcal{L} \mid \Delta \vdash A\}, \mathcal{C}\rangle , v\rangle \mid \Delta \subseteq \mathcal{L}, v\) is a uniform substitution on \(\mathcal{L}\}\).

Wójcicki proved:

Theorem 1. Every structural Tarskian logic is characterized by a class of \(n\)-valued models, for some at most countably infinite \(n\).

Based on this result Suszko’s reduction can be formulated as follows (Suszko 1977, Malinowski 1993):

Theorem 2. Every structural Tarskian logic is characterized by a class of two-valued models.

The idea of the proof is quite simple. Given an \(n\)-valued model, an equivalent two-valued model can be defined by evaluating a formula as 1 if it receives a designated value in the \(n\)-valued model; otherwise as 0.

Proof. Let \(\Lambda = (\mathcal{L}, \vdash)\) be a structural Tarskian logic. By Theorem 1, the logic \(\Lambda\) is characterized by a class \(\mathfrak{C}_{\Lambda}\) of \(n\)-valued models. For \(\langle \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle , v\rangle \in \mathfrak{C}_{\Lambda}\), the function t\(_v\) from \(\mathcal{L}\) into \(\{0, 1\}\) is defined as follows:

\[ t_v(A) = \left\{ \begin{array}{l} 1 \textrm{ if } v(A) \in \mathcal{D}\\ 0 \textrm{ if }v(A) \not\in \mathcal{D} \end{array}\right. \]

The class \[\{\langle \langle \{0, 1\}, \{1\}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle, t_v \rangle \mid \langle \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle , v\rangle \in \mathfrak{C}_{\Lambda}\}\] of 2-valued models characterizes \(\Lambda\).

Malinowski (1994: 79) points out that Suszko’s reduction does not establish the existence of a characterizing class of structural two-valued models. It has been noted by da Costa et al. (1996) and Caleiro et al. (2005), however, that the condition of structurality can be given up in Wójcicki’s Theorem and hence in Theorem 1.

2. Malinowski’s analysis of Suszko’s Thesis

Malinowski (1994: 80 f.) emphasizes that logical bivalence in Suszko’s sense is related to the bi-partition of the set of values into the set of designated values and its complement and raises the question “whether logical many-valuedness is possible at all”. He obtains a positive answer to this question by

invoking a formal framework for reasoning admitting rules of inference which lead from non-rejected assumptions to accepted conclusions (Malinowski 1994).

This approach may be viewed as taking ‘true’ and ‘false’ to be expressions that give rise to contrary instead of contradictory pairs of sentence. The pair ‘true’ versus ‘false’ is associated with the contrary pairs ‘designated’ versus ‘antidesignated’ and ‘accepted’ versus ‘rejected’. Admitting algebraic values that are neither designated nor antidesignated amounts to admitting in addition to the logical values true and false the third logical value neither true nor false, so that being false is distinguished from not being true. Whereas the algebraic values that are not designated are already given with the set of designated values \(\mathcal{D}\) as its set-theoretical complement, the treatment of true and false as values that are independent of each other leads to distinguishing between the set \(\mathcal{D}^+\) of designated values and the set \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus}\) of anti-designated values.

Let \(\mathcal{L}\) be as above. An \(n\)-valued \(q\)-matrix (quasi-matrix) based on \(\mathcal{L}\) is defined by Malinowski as a structure \(\mathfrak{M} = \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}^+, \mathcal{D}^{\minus}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle\), where \(\mathcal{V}\) is a non-empty set of cardinality \(n\ge 2, \mathcal{D}^+\) and \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus}\) are subsets of \(\mathcal{V}\) such that \(\mathcal{D}^+ \cap \mathcal{D}^{\minus} = \varnothing\), and every \(f_c\) is a function on \(\mathcal{V}\) with the same arity as \(c\). A valuation function \(v\) in \(\mathfrak{M}\) is a function from \(\mathcal{L}\) into the set of truth values \(\mathcal{V}\), and Malinowski considers only valuations which satisfy conditions (1) and (2).

To obtain a kind of entailment relation that does not admit of a reduction to a bivalent semantics, Malinowski defines \(q\)-entailment as depending on both sets \(\mathcal{D}^+\) and \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus}\). A \(q\)-matrix \[\mathfrak{M} = \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}^+, \mathcal{D}^{\minus}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle\] determines a \(q\)-entailment relation \(\vDash_{ \mathfrak{M} } \subseteq \mathcal{P}(\mathcal{L})\times \mathcal{L}\) by defining \(\Delta \vDash_{ \mathfrak{M} } A\) iff for every valuation \(v\) in \(\mathfrak{M}\) satisfying conditions (1) and (2), \(v(\Delta)\cap \mathcal{D}^{\minus} = \varnothing\) implies \(v(A) \in \mathcal{D}^+\). A pair \[\mathcal{M} = \langle \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}^+, \mathcal{D}^{\minus}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle , v\rangle,\] where \(\mathfrak{M} = \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}^+, \mathcal{D}^{\minus}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle\) is an \(n\)-valued \(q\)-matrix and \(v\) a valuation in \(\mathfrak{M}\), may be called an \(n\)-valued \(q\)-model based on \(\mathfrak{M}\). The relation \(\vDash_{\mathcal{M} } \subseteq \mathcal{P}(\mathcal{L}) \times \mathcal{L}\) determined by such a model is defined by the following equivalence: \(\Delta \vDash_{\mathcal{M} } A\) iff \(v(\Delta) \cap \mathcal{D}^{\minus} = \varnothing\) implies \(v(A) \in \mathcal{D}^+\). If \(\mathfrak{M} = \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}^+, \mathcal{D}^{\minus}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle\) is a \(q\)-matrix and \(\mathcal{D}^+\) is not the complement of \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus}\), there is no class of functions \(v\) from \(\mathcal{L}\) into \(\{1, 0\}\) such that \(\Delta \vDash_{ \mathfrak{M} } A\) iff for every function from that class, \(v(\Delta) \subseteq \{1\}\) implies \(v(A) = 1\). Let \(\mathcal{M} = \langle \langle \mathcal{V} , \mathcal{D}^+, \mathcal{D}^{\minus}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle , v\rangle\) be an \(n\)-valued \(q\)-model. Malinowski pointed out that an equivalent three-valued \(q\)-model \(\mathcal{M}' = \langle \langle \{0, \frac{1}{2}, 1\}, \{1\}, \{0\}, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle, t_v\rangle\) can be defined as follows:

\[ t_v(A) = \left\{ \begin{array}{l} 1 \textrm{ if } v(A) \in \mathcal{D}^+\\ \frac{1}{2} \textrm{ iff } v(A) \in \mathcal{V} \backslash (\mathcal{D}^+\cup \mathcal{D}^{\minus})\\ 0 \textrm{ if } v(A) \not\in \mathcal{D}^{\minus} \end{array}\right. \]

A \(q\)-entailment relation \(\vDash _{ \mathfrak{M} }\) is a special case of what Malinowski calls a \(q\)-consequence relation. A \(q\)-consequence relation on \(\mathcal{L}\) is a relation \(\Vdash \subseteq \mathcal{P}(\mathcal{L}) \times \mathcal{L}\) such that for every \(A \in \mathcal{L}\) and every \(\Delta , \Gamma \subseteq \mathcal{L}\):

\[ \begin{align} \textrm{If }\Delta \Vdash A \textrm{ then } \Delta \cup \Gamma \Vdash A &&\textrm{Monotonicity} \tag{9}\\ \Delta \cup \{B \mid \Delta \Vdash B\} \Vdash A \textrm{ iff } \Delta \Vdash A &&\textrm{Quasi-closure} \tag{10} \end{align} \]

A pair \((\mathcal{L}, \Vdash)\) is said to be a \(q\)-logic; it is structural iff \(\Vdash\) is structural. A \(q\)-logic \((\mathcal{L}, \Vdash)\) is said to be characterized by an \(n\)-valued \(q\)-matrix \(\mathfrak{M}\) iff \(\Vdash = \vDash _{ \mathfrak{M} }, (\mathcal{L}, \Vdash)\) is characterized by an \(n\)-valued \(q\)-model \(\mathcal{M}\) iff \(\Vdash = \vDash_{\mathcal{M} }, (\mathcal{L}, \Vdash)\) is characterized by a class \(\mathfrak{K}\) of \(n\)-valued \(q\)-matrices \((q\)-models) iff \(\Vdash = \cap \{\vDash_{ \mathfrak{M} } \mid \mathfrak{M} \in \mathfrak{K}\} (\Vdash = \cap \{\vDash_{\mathcal{M} } \mid \mathcal{M} \in \mathfrak{K}\})\).

If \(\Delta \subseteq \mathcal{L}\), let \[\mathcal{D}^{+}_{\Delta} = \{A \in \mathcal{L} \mid \Delta \Vdash A\}\] and \[\mathcal{D}^{\minus}_{\Delta} = \mathcal{L} \backslash (\Delta \cup \{A \in \mathcal{L} \mid \Delta \Vdash A\}).\] Malinowski (1990) showed that every structural \(q\)-logic is characterized by the following Lindenbaum bundle:

\(\{\langle \langle \mathcal{L}, \mathcal{D}^{+}_{\Delta}, \mathcal{D}^{\minus}_{\Delta}, \mathcal{C}\rangle , v\rangle \mid \Delta \subseteq \mathcal{L}, v\) is a uniform substitution on \(\mathcal{L}\}\).

Malinowski proved:

Theorem 3. Every structural \(q\)-logic is characterized by a class of \(n\)-valued \(q\)-models, for some at most countably infinite \(n\).

By the above definition of three-valued \(q\)-models \(\mathcal{M}'\) and by the Suszko Reduction for the case that \(\mathcal{V} \backslash (\mathcal{D}^+ \cup \mathcal{D}^{\minus} ) = \varnothing\), it follows that \(q\)-logics are logically two-valued (if \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus}\) is the complement of \(\mathcal{D}^+)\) or three-valued (if \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus}\) is distinct from the complement of \(\mathcal{D}^+)\).

Malinowski also proved:

Theorem 4. Every structural q-logic is characterized by a class of two-valued \(q\)-models or by a class of three-valued \(q\)-models.

3. Inferential many-valuedness and generalized valuation systems

Suszko does not define the notion of a logical value except for stating that true and false are the only logical values, but he claims that “any multiplication of logical values is a mad idea” (Suszko 1977: 378). This latter pronouncement, however, might be resisted. One may ask by virtue of which properties true and false are to be considered as logical values. Truth is preserved in a valid inference from the premises to the conclusion (or the conclusions in a multiple-conclusion setting). In the matrix semantics, the logical value true is given with a subset \(\mathcal{D}\) of the set of algebraic values and with the corresponding notion of entailment, understood as the preservation of membership in \(\mathcal{D}\) from the premises to the conclusion(s). This notion of entailment can be referred to as \(t\)-entailment. A formula \(A\) is logically true iff \(A\) is \(t\)-entailed by the empty set (iff for every assignment \(v\) of algebraic values to the formulas of the language under consideration, \(v(A)\) is designated), and \(A\) is logically false iff \(A\ t\)-entails the empty set (iff for every assignment \(v, v(A)\) is not designated). If the set of algebraic values is bi-partitioned, falsity is identified with the complement of \(\mathcal{D}\). Now, it is characteristic for falsity understood as non-truth to be preserved in the reverse direction, i.e., from the conclusion(s) to at least one of the premises. One might wish to consider a notion of \(f\)-entailment understood as the backward preservation of values associated with falsity. Obviously, membership in the complement of \(\mathcal{D}\) is preserved from the conclusion(s) to the premises, but this gives the very same relation as \(t\)-entailment. Since \(\mathcal{D}\) is uniquely determined by its complement, and vice versa, logical two-valuedness is, in fact, reduced to logical mono-valuedness if there is just one entailment relation defined as truth preservation form the premises to the conclusion. Thus, classical propositional logic is not logically two-valued in this sense.

Malinowski’s notion of a \(q\)-matrix can serve as a starting point for developing the notion of logical or inferential many-valuedness. One obtains a generalized \(q\)-matrix by giving up the condition that \(\mathcal{D}^+ \cap \mathcal{D}^{\minus} = \varnothing\). If the set of truth values is not dichotomized, but at least trisected, this may have a significant impact on the very concept of logical entailment. Indeed, since truth \((\mathcal{D}^+)\) does not generally coincide with non-falsity (the complement of \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus})\) any more, and falsity \((\mathcal{D}^{\minus})\) may differ from non-truth (the complement of \(\mathcal{D}^+)\), the expressions ‘\(B\) is true whenever \(A\) is true’ and ‘\(B\) is not false whenever \(A\) is not false’ need no longer mean the same. Moreover, the other usual characterizations of entailment (e.g., for single premises and conclusions): “in any case either \(A\) is false or \(B\) is true” and “it is impossible that \(A\) is true and \(B\) false”, also become non-equivalent. Hence, the relations determined by these conditions may also be different. That is, in addition to the simple preservation of truth from the premises to the conclusion(s) and the simple preservation of falsity in the backward direction, there come to mind at least two other notions of entailment based on an obvious interplay between \(\mathcal{D}^+\) and \(\mathcal{D}^{\minus}\) which have a clear intuitive appeal. In this way the framework of generalized \(q\)-matrices allows the following four basic entailment relations \((t\)-entailment, \(f\)-entailment, \(q\)-entailment and \(p\)-entailment) defined as follows:

\[ \begin{align} \tag{11} \Delta \vDash _t B\textrm{ iff }\forall v[(\forall A \in \Delta: v(A) \in \mathcal{D}^+) \Rightarrow v(B) \in \mathcal{D}^+]\\ \tag{12} \Delta \vDash _f B\textrm{ iff }\forall v[(\forall A \in \Delta: v(A) \not\in \mathcal{D}^{\minus}) \Rightarrow v(B) \not\in \mathcal{D}^{\minus}]\\ \tag{13} \Delta \vDash _q B\textrm{ iff }\forall v[(\forall A \in \Delta: v(A) \not\in \mathcal{D}^{\minus}) \Rightarrow v(B) \in \mathcal{D}^+]\\ \tag{14} \Delta \vDash _p B\textrm{ iff }\forall v[(\forall A \in \Delta: v(A) \in \mathcal{D}^+) \Rightarrow v(B) \not\in \mathcal{D}^{\minus}]\\ \end{align} \]

Whereas \(t\)-entailment is a generalization of the standard truth-preserving relation, \(f\)-entailment incorporates the idea of non-falsity preservation (cf. Dunn 2000: 10). Malinowski’s relation of \(q\)-entailment qualifies derivations of true sentences from non-refuted premises (understood as hypotheses) as valid, and \(p\)-entailment \((p\) for “plausibility”) has been studied by Frankowski, who tried to explicate “reasonings wherein the degree of strength of the conclusion (i.e. the conviction it is true) is smaller th[a]n that of the premisses” (Frankowski 2004: 41).

This approach can be developed further. By a canonical definition of entailment one may understand a definition of entailment as a relation that preserves membership in a certain set of algebraic values either from the premises to the conclusion(s) of inferences, or from the conclusion(s) to the premises. Every such set may be associated with some logical value, and the corresponding entailment relations will be Tarskian: since preservation of a logical value from the conclusion(s) to the premises means that if the (every) conclusion possesses the value, then so does at least one of the premises, whereas preservation from the premises to the conclusion(s) means that if every premise possesses the value, then so does (at least one of) the conclusion(s). The relations of \(q\)-entailment and \(p\)-entailment, for example, are not canonical as opposed to \(t\)-entailment and \(f\)-entailment. Two logical values are independent of each other iff the canonically defined entailment relations determined by these values are distinct.

This idea of multiple logical truth values has been developed in Wansing and Shramko 2008. Although it is neither Malinowski’s nor Suszko’s understanding of logical truth values, it may quite appropriately be expressed by using Malinowski’s term “inferential many-valuedness”. One may consider the notion of a generalized valuation system (an \(n\)-valued \(k\)-dimensional matrix, or just \(k\)-matrix) which is a structure \(\mathfrak{M} = \langle \mathcal{V}, \mathcal{D}_1 ,\ldots ,\mathcal{D}_k, \{f_c: c \in \mathcal{C}\}\rangle\), where \(\mathcal{V}\) is a non-empty set of cardinality \(n\) \( (2 \le n), 2 \le k\), every \(\mathcal{D}_i (1 \le i \le k)\) is a subset of \(\mathcal{V}\), the sets \(\mathcal{D}_i\) are pairwise distinct, and every f\(_c\) is a function on \(\mathcal{V}\) with the same arity as \(c\) (cf. Wójcicki 1988: 189; Czelakowski 2001: 410 ff.). A logic may then be said to be logically (or inferentially) \(k\)-valued if it is a language together with \(k\) canonically defined and pairwise distinct entailment relations on (the set of formulas of) this language. Each of these \(k\) entailment relations is Tarskian.

Generally, Malinowski’s approach put forward the idea of what can be called a mixed consequence, “allowing the notion of a designated value to vary between the premises and the conclusions of an argument” (Chemla and Égré 2019: 736). As Pablo Cobreros et al. (2012: 367) explain, a mixed notion of consequence lays down different “standards for truth” in premises and conclusions. In this sense, Malinowski’s \(q\)-entailment set a weaker standard for premises than for conclusions, whereas Frankowski’s \(p\)-entailment does just the opposite. This idea of “standards differentiation” gives rise to an interesting recent development of strict-tolerant (and, dually, tolerant-strict) logics dealing with various mixed consequence relations (see, e.g. Barrio et al. 2015, Barrio et al. 2020, Chemla and Égré 2019, Cobreros et al. 2012). It turns out that strict-tolerant logic has the same consequence relation as classical logic, but differs from it in some meta-properties, in particular it is non-transitive. Remarkably Cobreros et al. (2012) are directly motivated by discussions around the Sorites Paradox, and applications of the proposed semantic framework to the pragmatics and psycholinguistics of vague predicates. A two-dimensional generalization of \(q\)- and \(p\)-entailment, called B-entailment, has been introduced in (Blasio et al., 2017). There it is shown that any B-consequence relation is, in general, inferentially four-valued.

Note that interpretations of distinguished sets of algebraic values need not appeal to truth or falsity. In a series of papers, Jennings, Schotch, and Brown, for example, have argued that paraconsistent logic can be developed as a logic that preserves a degree of incoherence from the premises to the conclusion of a valid inference, see Brown and Schotch 1999, Jennings and Schotch 1984, and the references given there.

The above considerations on inferential many-valuedness are of interest also because they affect the definition of the notion of a logical system. Even if one is not committed to the idea of entailment as preservation of semantical values from the premises to the conclusion(s) of an inference (or vice versa), it may still be quite natural to conceive of a logical system as comprising more than only one entailment relation.

Copyright © 2020 by
Yaroslav Shramko <>
Heinrich Wansing <>

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