Supplement to Truthlikeness

Why Popper’s definition of truthlikeness fails: the Tichý-Miller theorem

The so called Tichý-Miller theorem proved that Popper’s original definition of truthlikeness in terms of truth and falsity contents was technically untenable. It also launched the post-Popperian research program on truthlikeness, leading to a couple of new, refined definitions eschewing the problems of Popper’s one. It is instructive to see how this negative result works against Popper’s definition.

Let us suppose that \(A\) and \(B\) are both false, and that \(A\)’s truth content exceeds \(B\)’s. Let \(a\) be a true sentence entailed by \(A\) but not by \(B\). Let \(f\) be any falsehood entailed by A. Since \(A\) entails both \(a\) and \(f\) the conjunction, \(a \amp f\) is a falsehood entailed by \(A\), and so part of \(A\)’s falsity content. If \(a \amp f\) were also part of \(B\)’s falsity content \(B\) would entail both \(a\) and \(f\). But then it would entail \(a\) contrary to the assumption. Hence \(a \amp f\) is in \(A\)’s falsity content and not in \(B\)’s. So \(A\)’s truth content cannot exceeds \(B\)’s without \(A\)’s falsity content also exceeding \(B\)’s.

Suppose now that \(B\)’s falsity content exceeds \(A\)’s. Let \(g\) be some falsehood entailed by \(B\) but not by \(A\), and let \(f\), as before, be some falsehood entailed by \(A\). The sentence \(f\rightarrow g\) is a truth, and since it is entailed by \(g\), is in \(B\)’s truth content. If it were also in \(A\)’s then both \(f\) and \(f\rightarrow g\) would be consequences of \(A\) and hence so would \(g\), contrary to the assumption. Thus \(A\)’s truth content lacks a sentence, \(f\rightarrow g\), which is in \(B\)’s. So \(B\)’s falsity content cannot exceeds \(A\)’s without \(B\)’s truth content also exceeding \(A\)’s. The relationship depicted in Diagram 4 simply cannot obtain: in this sense, that picture is an “impossible” one, like those in Escher’s famous drawings.

Copyright © 2022 by
Graham Oddie <>
Gustavo Cevolani <>

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