Notes to Kazimierz Twardowski

1.The ELV-AKT project based at the IHPST Paris is a Franco-Polish cooperation involving among others digitalizations, editions and translations in XML/TEI of manuscripts of both Twardowski and the philosophers of his School which will be hosted on The original manuscripts are located at the Library of the Institute of Philosophy and Sociology of the University of Warsaw and at the Polish Academy of Sciences (see Likus 2000). Manuscripts recently edited are the German lectures Logik 1894/5 (by Arianna Betti and Venanzio Raspa, see Twardowski 1894/5), and Die Unsterblichkeitsfrage (1895) (by Michał Sepioło, see Twardowski 1895). The first set of notes of Twardowski's lectures in logic in Polish given in Lvov is contained in Logik 1895/6. Of these notes there exist an unpublished draft edition and an English summary by Arianna Betti (Twardowski 1895/6). See bibliography of primary works below. See also the operations on the ELV-AKT site.

2. On method as unifying factor among Twardowski's students, Dąmbska wrote:

The philosophers of the Lvov group were not united by any common doctrine, by a uniform world-view. Not the content of philosophy but rather the method of philosophizing and the common language were the factors which formed the foundation of the spiritual community of these people. This is why the School could produce spiritualists and materialists, nominalists and realists, logicians and psychologists, natural philosophers and art theorists (Dąmbska 1948, 17).

3. To be sure, Twardowski splits phenomena of love and hate into two classes: feelings and manifestations of the will, see Twardowski 1897b, 143–144.

4. That Twardowski's position is original can be seen from the fact that in Höfler and Meinong 1890—a text Twardowski quotes as providing a distinction between object and content—objectless presentations are still accepted. On this point Brentano held a position similar to Höfler and Meinong's (see Rollinger 2009), but since that position was only known through Brentano's unpublished lectures, it seems safe to conjecture that Twardowski treated Höfler and Meinong as proxy for Brentano himself or at least to refer to the state of the art of Brentanian research. See for more Betti 2013.

5. Twardowski will come back to the difference between modifying and attributive adjectives also in 1923, in a talk published a few years later (see 1927b). For a systematic treatment developing Twardowski's analyses, and a history of the notion of modifying terms, see Schaar 2015, chapter 2.4.

6. This is due to the fact that whereas an act, as a mental event, is a real object, which, in Brentanian terms, means that it can cause something or be caused by something, the content, instead, is a non-real object—it does not cause anything and is not caused by anything. It is not the case that the act causes the content: it is the act that can be caused—by some other event in the mind.

7. The point is in particular directed against the position that accepts presentations whose objects are possible (such as the presentation of a golden mountain), but not those whose objects are impossible, such as the round square.

8. The formal parts are in any case inseparable parts of the object of presentation: they are merely distinguishable in it.

9. Although Twardowski does not quote Bolzano's name, once we keep in mind that Twardowski's truthbearers are Brentanian judgments instead of Bolzanian propositions in themselves, his debts to Bolzano are apparent, as he even uses some of Bolzano's examples in the Wissenschaftslehre. The idea that a sentence can express different judgments and the consideration that sometimes we just do not know which judgment is expressed by the sentence, is, mutatis mutandis, also to be found in Bolzano.

10. “The early Twardowski endorses a form of psychologism in the sense that psychology is to provide the basic concepts of philosophy, that the method of inner perception plays a central role, and that the question what a concept means is not clearly separated from the question concerning the concept’s origin” (Schaar 2015, 23).

11. This has made Ingarden date Twardowski's antipsychologistic turn to 1902 (Ingarden 1948). There is however evidence that the discussion of Husserl's Prolegomena in Poland around 1904, especially Łukasiewicz's strong anti-psychologistic attitude, played a role in Twardowski's change of heart. A safer dating is perhaps 1908/9, when, in the manuscript ‘Psychology of Thinking,’ Twardowski explicitly says that the position that logic depends on psychology is untenable.

12. Note however that what gets preserved is, strictly speaking, not the judgment, but the spoken sentence p.

Copyright © 2016 by
Arianna Betti <>

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