Supplement to Two-Dimensional Semantics

Objections to the Metasemantic Interpretation

The metasemantic interpretation uses the 2D possible worlds framework in an ad hoc, context-sensitive way to isolate certain aspects of a subject’s understanding that are not captured by standard possible worlds semantics. This metasemantic project can be challenged on a number of different fronts.

First, one might object to the account of how metasemantic diagonal propositions are generated for particular assertions. The account developed in ‘Assertion’ relies on Gricean norms for felicitous communication to identify an empirical proposition expressed by a necessary sentence. However, Gricean mechanisms may not determine the intuitively correct semantic assignments (e.g., Brehany 2006). Indeed, some critics argue the diagonalization strategy may fail to determine any semantic assignment at all, because of its commitment to transparent mutual knowledge of the context (Hawthorne and Madigor 2009; see Stalnaker 2009 for a reply). More generally, Stalnaker emphasizes that his primary commitment is not to specific Gricean mechanisms for assigning diagonal intensions to assertions, but rather to the idea that possible worlds semantics can fully capture the content of thought and talk and how it evolves through conversation and inquiry (Stalnaker 2014).

Second, one might challenge the background assumption that one-dimensional possible world semantics, with its coarse-grained representation of truth-conditions as functions mapping possible worlds to truth-values, is the best way to characterize the content of language and thought. Stalnaker introduces the 2D framework in order to address cases that are problematic for standard possible world semantics: the assertion of necessary truths and certain types of attitude reports. But many theorists contend that functions from worlds to truth-values cannot fully capture the content of thought and talk. For instance, we may need to invoke finer-grained syntactic or conceptual structures (i) to explain what is said when we report the content of a person’s words or thoughts (e.g., Crimmins 1992; Richard 1990), (ii) to capture apparent differences in content between logically equivalent claims (“the problem of logical omniscience”), (iii) to account for our ability to think de re thoughts about particular objects (Soames 2005, ch. 5; 2006a; 2006b), (iv) to capture the subject’s understanding of her own location within the world (“the problem of the essential indexical”) (Perry 1979, 2006), or (v) to capture the subject’s perspective on sameness of subject matter (Perry, 1980; Kaplan 1990; Fine 2007). Even if the metasemantic approach has the resources to describe these phenomena, critics may question whether it provides the best, most perspicuous explanation of mental and linguistic content.[29] [See the entries on structured propositions, situation semantics, and propositional attitude reports.] The addition of multi-centered possible worlds for keeping track of conversational dynamics and thought content may help address some of these worries (Stalnaker 2008, 2014; Torre 2010; Ninan 2013).

Third, proponents of generalized 2D semantics challenge the idea that there is a principled distinction between semantic theories and metasemantic theories. Perhaps the distinction is merely a verbal dispute over whether the 2D matrices assigned to a person’s words and thoughts deserve the name ‘semantic’ (Chalmers 1996, ch.2 §4; Jackson 2006; Lewis 1981). Stalnaker himself holds that the distinction is a theoretically important one that has implications for compositional semantic theory and apriori knowledge of truth-conditions. This dispute between 2D metasemantics and generalized 2D semantics may ultimately turn on whether one accepts an externalist or an internalist account of metasemantics—i.e., whether the subject’s purely internal states fully determine how the extension of her words and thoughts is fixed. Proponents of generalized 2D semantics hold that the individual’s own cognitive dispositions suffice to fix the propositional content of her words and thoughts. In contrast, Stalnaker holds that the propositional content of language and thought depends in part on external facts to which subjects have no privileged apriori access and it varies according to contingent explanatory interests.

In his book, Context (2014), Stalnaker focuses on the nature of common ground, context, the dynamics of conversation – issues that are central to his metasemantic interpretation of the two-dimensional framework. For a helpful author-meets-critics discussion of his current views and the prospects for extending them, see Camp (2017), Greene (2017), Szabó (2017), and Stalnaker (2017).

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