Notes to The Theory of Two Truths in Tibet

1. Among them some schools—Sakya (sa skya pa), Jonang (jo nang pa), Shang-pa (shangs pa), Drikung (‘bri gung pa)—are named after some places of significance, whereas Karma pa (kar ma pa) and Buluk pa (bu lugs pa) are named after their masters, Kadam (bka’ gdams pa) Dzogchen (rdzogs chen pa), Chagchen (phyag chen pa), Zhibyed (zhi byed pa) are named after the primary oral instructions each emphasises.

2. Modern interpreters of Madhyamaka's theory of the two truths, including T. R. V. Murti, (1985: xxiv–xxvi), La Vallée Poussin (1985: 152–53), Jaideva Singh (1989: 30), and Huntington (1994: 39, 40, 231) also endorse a similar interpretation. Guy Newland (1992: 47) confirms that “Many Western scholars hold that the two truths are not two types of object, but rather two viewpoints, perspectives, or types of consciousnesses.”

3. In like fashion, the definitions offered by modern interpreters such as Murti (1985: 244), Singh (1989: 51–52), Poussin (1985: 152–153), Huntington (1994: 231–232), and Williams (1989: 71) all ground the two truths in these two contradictory viewpoints.

4. His followers unanimously accept the objects of knowledge as the basis of the division of the two truths. For example, Khedrub Jé (1992: 357–60), Changkya Rölpai Dorje (1989: 317–18), and Jamyang Shepai Dorje, (1992: 849–52) et al.

5. “The Tathāgata understands both the conventional (kun rdzob) and the ultimate (don dam), for the objects of knowledge exhaustively comprise conventional and ultimate truths. Besides, the Bhagavān perfectly sees, perfectly understands, and thoroughly actualizes emptiness. Because of this, he is described as all-knower.” (Dkon brtsegs nga 62b, cited in Tsongkhapa, 1984b: 176; Khedrub Jé (1992: 357) It also says: “The knower of the universe taught these two truths without hearing from others. There is the conventional and likewise the ultimate. There can never be a third truth.” (Dkon brtsegs nga 61b, Cited in Tsongkhapa, 1984b: 178)

6. In the Cūlaviyūha Sutta, the Buddha states: “The truth is one, there is no second about which a person who knows it would argue with one who knows. Contemplatives promote their various personal truths, that is why they do not say one thing and the same” (Sn 4.12). In the Yuktiṣaṣṭikāvṛtti (35), Candrakırti similarly raises the same question: “When the victorious (jīnas) have stated that nirvāṇa alone is true, what learned person will then imagine that the rest is not false? How would you interpret that nirvāṇa alone is true and others are untrue?” (cited in Tsongkhapa 1992: 412).

Copyright © 2022 by
Sonam Thakchoe <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free