Notes to Hermann Weyl

1. Husserl was a professor at Göttingen during Weyl’s student days there, and Weyl attended his lectures. But it was his wife Helene, who later came to Göttingen to study with Husserl, who seems to have sparked Weyl’s interest in phenomenology.

2. In particular, while there is compelling evidence that the continued existence of the Ego (one’s consciousness) is dependent on facts about the external world, for instance, the continuing biochemical activity of one’s brain, that dependency cannot be taken as a primary datum for the Ego.

3. As Weyl observed in 1925,

If phenomenal insight is referred to as knowledge, then the theoretical one is based on belief—the belief in the reality of the own I and that of others, or belief in reality of the external world, or belief in the reality of God. If the organ of the former is “seeing” in the widest sense, so the organ of theory is “creativity” (Weyl 1925, 140).

4. In a late paper Weyl offers the natural numbers “by which we count objects” as “the simplest, and in a certain sense most profound, example of symbolic construction.” He continues:

The most natural symbols for them are strokes, one put after the other, |, ||, |||, … . The objects may disperse, “melt, thaw and resolve themselves into dew,” but we thus can keep the record of their number. What is more, we can by a constructive process decide for two numbers represented through symbols which one is the larger, namely by checking one symbol against the other, stroke by stroke. This process reveals differences not manifest in direct observation, which in most cases is incapable of distinguishing even between such low numbers as 21 and 22. We are so familiar with these miracles which the number symbols perform that we no longer wonder at them. But this is only the prelude to the mathematical step proper. We do not leave it to chance which numbers we actually meet by counting this or that concrete set of objects, but we generate the open sequence of all possible numbers which starts with 1 (or 0 = nothing) and proceeds by adding to any number symbol \(n\) one more stroke, whereby it changes into the following number \(n + 1\). Being is thus projected onto the background of the possible, more precisely onto a manifold of possibilities which unfolds by iterating the same step again and again and remains open into infinity. (Weyl 1985, 12–13.)

5. It is perhaps for this reason that, unlike Einstein, for example, Weyl does not seem to have been especially troubled by the highly counterintuitive nature of quantum theory. Indeed, the conviction of numerous physicists that the quantum microworld is accessible to us only through abstract mathematical description serves as an excellent illustration of Weyl’s thesis that objective reality cannot be grasped directly, but only through the use of symbols.

For Weyl the link between mathematics and natural science established through symbolic construction was certainly very strong, as is attested by his observations in his [1985] on G. H. Hardy’s A Mathematician’s Apology (Hardy 1967). Introducing it as a “charming little book”, he continues:

For us today the idea that the Gods from whom we wrestled the secret of knowledge by symbolic construction will revenge our hubris has taken on a quite concrete form. For who can close his eyes against the menace of our own self-destruction by science? The alarming fact is that the rapid progress of scientific knowledge is not paralleled by a corresponding growth of man’s moral strength and responsibility, which have hardly changed since historical times. I think it is futile to claim with Hardy for mathematics an exceptional and relatively innocent position in this regard. He maintains that mathematics is a useless science, and this means, he says, that it can contribute directly neither to the exploitation of our fellow-men nor to their extermination. However the power of science rests on the combination of experiment, i.e., observation under freely chosen conditions and symbolic construction, and the latter is its mathematical aspect. Thus if science is found guilty, mathematics cannot evade the verdict.

6. In Insight and Reflection (also in Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science) Weyl uses a geometric analogy to illustrate his metaphysical scheme. In this analogy, objects, subjects, and the appearance of an object to a subject are correlated respectively with points on a plane, (barycentric) coordinate systems in the plane, and coordinates of a point with respect to a such a coordinate system. Here a coordinate system \(S\) consists of the vertices of a fixed nondegenerate triangle \(T\); each point \(p\) in the plane determined by \(T\) is assigned a triple of numbers summing to 1—its barycentric coordinates relative to \(S\)—representing the magnitudes of masses of total weight 1 which, placed at the vertices of \(T\), have centre of gravity at \(p\). Thus objects, i.e. points, and subjects i.e., coordinate systems or triples of points belong to the same “sphere of reality.” On the other hand, the appearances of an object to a subject, i.e., triples of numbers, lie, Weyl asserts, in a different sphere, that of numbers. These number-appearances, as Weyl calls them, correspond to the experiences of a subject, or of pure consciousness.

From the standpoint of naïve realism the points (objects) simply exist as such, but Weyl indicates the possibility of constructing geometry (which under the analogy corresponds to external reality) solely in terms of number-appearances, so representing the world in terms of the experiences of pure consciousness, that is, from the standpoint of idealism. Thus suppose that we are given a coordinate system \(S\). Regarded as a subject or “consciousness”, from its perspective a point or object now corresponds to what was originally an appearance of an object, that is, a triple of numbers summing to 1; and, analogously, any coordinate system \(S'\) (that is, another subject or “consciousness”) corresponds to three such triples determined by the vertices of a nondegenerate triangle. Each point or object \(p\) may now be identified with its coordinates relative to \(S\). The coordinates of \(p\) relative to any other coordinate system \(S'\) can be determined by a straightforward algebraic transformation: these coordinates represent the appearance of the object corresponding to \(p\) to the subject represented by \(S'\). Now these coordinates will, in general, differ from those assigned to \(p\) by our given coordinate system \(S\), and will in fact coincide for all \(p\) if and only if \(S'\) is what is termed by Weyl the absolute coordinate system consisting of the three triples \((1,0,0)\), \((0,1,0)\), \((0,0,1)\), that is, the coordinate system which corresponds to \(S\) itself. Thus, for this coordinate system, “object” and “appearance” coincide, which leads Weyl to term it the Absolute I.

Weyl points out that this argument takes place entirely within the realm of numbers, that is, for the purposes of the analogy, the immanent consciousness. In order to do justice to the claim of objectivity that all “I”s are equivalent, he suggests that only such numerical relations are to be declared of interest as remain unchanged under passage from an “absolute” to an arbitrary coordinate system, that is, those which are invariant under arbitrary linear coordinate transformations. According to Weyl, “this analogy makes it understandable why the unique sense-giving I, when viewed objectively, i.e., from the standpoint of invariance, can appear as just one subject among many of its kind.”

At this point Weyl adds an intriguing parenthetical observation:

Incidentally, a number of Husserl’s theses become demonstrably false when translated into the context of the analogy—something which, it appears to me, gives serious cause for suspecting them.

Unfortunately, we are not told precisely which of Husserl’s theses are the “suspect” ones.

Weyl goes on to emphasize:

Beyond this, it is expected of me that I recognize the other I—the you—not only by observing in my thought the abstract norm of invariance or objectivity, but absolutely: you are for you, once again, what I am for myself: not just an existing but a conscious carrier of the world of appearances.

This recognition of the Thou, according to Weyl, can be presented within his geometric analogy only if it is furnished with a purely axiomatic formulation. In taking this step Weyl sees a third viewpoint emerging in addition to that of realism and idealism, namely, a transcendentalism which “postulates a transcendental reality but is satisfied with modelling it in symbols.”

7. The others, in order, are: understanding and expression; thinking the possible; and finally, in science, the construction of symbols or measuring devices.

8. See also the section on Weyl and Hilbert below.

9. It is also worth quoting one of Weyl’s last, bittersweet observations on mathematics, from his (1985):

Mathematics has been called the science of the infinite. Indeed, the mathematician invents finite constructions by which questions are decided that by their very nature refer to the infinite. That is his glory. Kierkegaard once said religion deals with what concerns man unconditionally. In contrast (but with equal exaggeration) one may say that mathematics deals with the things which are of no concern to man at all. Mathematics has the inhuman quality of starlight, brilliant and sharp, but cold. But it seems an irony of creation that man’s mind knows how to handle things the better the farther removed they are from the center of his existence. Thus we are cleverest where knowledge matters least.

10. Nevertheless, Weyl seems to have been initially attracted to set theory—at least in the axiomatic formulation Zermelo provided for it in 1908. As emphasized by Feferman [2000], Weyl [1910] anticipates Fraenkel’s and Skolem’s later identification of Zermelo’s “definite property” with “property definable within the language of set theory”.

11. In this respect Weyl’s views were close to those of Poincaré, and also, to some extent, those of Russell.

12. In this connection it is of interest to note that on 9 February 1918 Weyl and George Pólya made a bet in Zürich in the presence of twelve witnesses (all of whom were mathematicians) that “within 20 years, Pólya, or a majority of leading mathematicians, will come to recognize the falsity of the least upper bound property.” When the bet was eventually called, everyone—with the single exception of Gödel—agreed that Pólya had won.

13. Weyl shared with many mathematicians the conviction that the concept of natural number is the fons et origo of mathematics. For example, in [1921] we read:

The starting point of mathematics is the sequence of natural numbers, that is, the law… which from nothing generates the first number, and from every generated number generates the next following one; a process never returning to a number that has already occurred. If we want to capture numbers for our intuition, we must distinguish them symbolically by means of qualitative signs…. One can say that, in a mathematical examination of Reality, an attempt is made to represent the world—which is given to consciousness in its more general form of a penetration of Being and Essence (of the “this” and “so”)—in the absoluteness of pure Being. That is why there is a profound truth in the Pythagorean doctrine that any being as such is based on number.

14. It is worth pointing out that Brentano, in his On What is Continuous of 1914, had drawn the similar conclusion that the continuum concept is derived from primitive sensible intuition and indeed that “all our sensible intuitions present us with that which is continuous.” This led him to regard the constructions of the continuum of Dedekind, Cantor, and their successors as “fictions”.

15. The connection between mathematics and physics was of course of paramount importance for Weyl. His seminal work on relativity theory, Space-Time-Matter, was published in the same year (1918) as Das Kontinuum; the two works reveal subtle affinities.

16. This fact would seem to indicate that in Weyl’s theory the domain of definition of a function is not unambiguously determined by the function, so that the continuity of such a “function” may vary with its domain of definition. (This would be a natural consequence of Weyl’s definition of a function as a certain kind of relation.) A simple but striking example of this phenomenon is provided in classical analysis by the function \(f\) which takes value 1 at each rational number, and at each irrational number. Considered as a function defined on the rational numbers, \(f\) is constant and so continuous; as a function defined on the real numbers, \(f\) fails to be continuous anywhere.

17. E.g. in Weyl [1950], 8 and [1949], 123

18. However there were marked differences between Weyl’s and Brouwer’s philosophical attitudes. Brouwer’s philosophy amounted virtually to solipsism, while Weyl still seems to have cleaved to phenomenology, at least up to 1928. And from what Weyl reveals about his later philosophical development, it is clear that it carried him even further away from Brouwer. (For an analysis of the relationship between intuitionism and phenomenology in Weyl’s thought, see Mancosu and Ryckman [2002].)

19. Nevertheless, there is reason to think that Weyl continued to regard the predicative approach underlying Das Kontinuum as being of genuine value. If indeed this is the case, then Weyl’s belief was correct, since Das Kontinuum is now viewed as the initial stage in the emergence of predicative mathematics, which has undergone a rapid development since the 1960s (see Feferman [1988], [2000]).

20. Weyl’s contention is strikingly similar to (and may have had an influence on) Hilbert’s later assertion that “contentual” statements are, from the finitist standpoint, incapable of being negated. See, e.g., Hilbert [1926], 378.

21. For my remarks on Weyl’s relationship with Intuitionism I have drawn on the illuminating paper van Dalen [1995].

22. Here is Weyl enlarging on the issue in 1921:

…if we pick out a specific point, say, \(x = 0\), on the number line \(C\) (i.e., on the variable range of a real variable \(x)\), then one cannot, under any circumstance, claim that every point either coincides with it or is disjoint from it. The point \(x = 0\) thus does not at all split the continuum \(C\) into two parts \(C^{-}: x \lt 0\) and C\(^{+}: x \gt 0\), in the sense that C would consist of the union of C\(^{- }\), C\(^{+}\) and the one point 0 …. If this appears offensive to present-day mathematicians with their atomistic thought habits, it was in earlier times a self-evident view held by everyone: Within a continuum, one can very well generate subcontinua by introducing boundaries; yet it is irrational to claim that the total continuum is made up of the boundaries and the subcontinua. The point is, a genuine continuum is something connected in itself, and it cannot be divided into separate fragments; this conflicts with its nature. (Weyl 1921, 111.)

23. Brouwer established the continuity of functions fully defined on a continuum in 1904, but did not publish a definitive account until 1927. In that account he also considers the possibility of partially defined functions.

24. Quoted in Reid [1986], 72. And over Hilbert’s grave in Göttingen is inscribed: Wir müssen wissen / Wir werden wissen (“We must know / We shall know.”) (Ibid., 220.)

25. In 1922, Hilbert declared:

What Weyl and Brouwer do comes to the same thing as following in the footsteps of Kronecker! They seek to save mathematics by throwing overboard all which is troublesome… They would chop up and mangle the science. If we would follow such a reform as the one they suggest, we would run the risk of losing a great part of our valuable treasures! (Reid 1986, 155).

I believe that, just as little as Kronecker was unable to get rid of the irrational numbers…just as little will Weyl and Brouwer be able to succeed. Brouwer is not, as Weyl believes, the Revolution—only the repetition of an attempted Putsch, in its day, more sharply undertaken yet failing utterly, and now, with the State armed and strengthened, doomed from the start! (Ibid., 157.)

26. It is this aspect of Hilbert’s program which led, somewhat inappropriately, to its becoming termed “formalism”. It should be emphasized that Hilbert was not claiming that (classical) mathematics itself was meaningless, only that the formal system representing it was to be so regarded.

27. This is borne out by the following quotation from Hilbert [1927]:

No more than any other science can mathematics be founded on logic alone; rather, as a condition for the use of logical inferences and the performance of logical operations, something must already be given to us in our faculty of representation, certain extralogical concrete objects that are intuitively present as immediate experience prior to all thought. If logical inference is to be reliable, it must be possible to survey these objects completely in all their parts, and the fact that they occur, that they differ from one another, and that they follow each other, or are concatenated, is immediately given intuitively, together with the objects, as something that can neither be reduced to anything else, nor requires reduction. This is the basic philosophical position that I regard as requisite for mathematics and, in general, for all scientific thinking, understanding, and communication. And in mathematics, in particular, what we consider is the concrete signs themselves, whose shape, according to the conception we have adopted, is immediately clear and recognizable. This is the very least that must be presupposed, no scientific thinker can dispense with it, and therefore everyone must maintain it, consciously or not.

28. Underlying this guarantee, of course, is the further assumption that there are no “contradictions in nature”.

29. Weyl [1927], 483. Indeed, in his [1946], Weyl remarks that had it not been for Gödel’s demonstration in 1931 that Hilbert’s program could not be successfully carried out, “it is likely that mathematicians would have accepted Hilbert’s approach.”

30. Weyl [1925], 140. Weyl [1949] contains a similar observation:

A truly realistic mathematics should be conceived, in line with physics, as a branch of the construction of the one real world, and should adopt the same sober and cautious attitude toward hypothetic extensions of its foundations as is exhibited by physics.(231).

31. Weyl [1927], 484. Mancosu and Ryckman (2002) show that Weyl had already begun to retreat from intuitionism because of what he saw as its incapability of supporting natural science, in particular the theoretical physics which was of paramount importance for him.

32. Weyl also observes (ibid., 61):

But whatever the ultimate value of Hilbert’s program, his bold enterprise can claim one merit: it has disclosed to us the highly complicated and ticklish logical structure of mathematics, its maze of back-connections, which result in circles of which it cannot be gathered at a first glance whether they might not lead to blatant contradictions.

33. If one is interested in the entire extension of an \(n\)-dimensional Riemannian space, then a finite or infinite number of partially overlapping coordinate patches are needed to cover the \(n\)-dimensional Riemannian manifold in its entirety. However, this is of little concern if the focus is on infinitesimal neighbourhoods of points.

34. The Einstein summation convention says: whenever a lower (upper) index is repeated as an upper (lower) index, it is understood to imply summation over the index from 1 to \(n\), the dimension of the manifold or space. The index \(k\) in equations (1) and (2) is said to be free and in the current context takes on any value from 1 to \(n\). The repeated indices \(i\) and \(j\) are bound or dummy indices because they can be replaced by any other index not already in use as a bound index.

35. The German term for ‘close-action’ is ‘Nahewirkung’.

36. For a detailed analysis of Weyl’s concept of ‘neighbourhood’ (Umgebung) and his different employment of it in mathematics, physics, and discussions of the subjective-intersubjective, continues-discrete distinctions, see Sieroka (2010, 2019).

37. The electric action in Faraday’s interaction model is not regarded as somehow reaching across the finite spatial separation of two charged particles. Rather, one understands the interaction as an infinitesimal interaction between the charged body and its surrounding field. A charged body “feels” a force because it is in contact with its surrounding field; that is, each charged body “feels” the field of the other as a local force. Just as Faraday’s field interpretation of electric phenomena may be contrasted with action-at-a-distance interpretations, so Riemann’s infinitesimal geometric standpoint may be contrasted with distance-geometry, such as, Euclidean and ordinary non-Euclidean geometry.

Hermann von Helmholtz considered the homogeneity postulate required for the free mobility of rigid body motion to be a necessary pre-condition for the very possibility of geometrical knowledge. Abstracting from our experience of the movement of rigid bodies, Helmholtz was able to mathematically derive Riemann’s distance formula (2). The difference between Euclidean and ordinary non-Euclidean geometry “in the large” consists only in the discarding of the axiom of parallelism. By requiring the homogeneity postulate underlying the free mobility of ideal rigid bodies, Helmholtz thereby limited his considerations to Euclidean and ordinary non-Euclidean geometries.

Riemann thought that Helmholtz’s homogeneity postulate for rigid body motion, and the Euclidean and ordinary non-Euclidean geometries entailed by it, may not hold strictly but only approximately. With remarkable foresight, Riemann considered the possibility that rigid body motion may break down, and approached the problem of physical geometry from a much more general basis, which includes Euclidean and ordinary non-Euclidean geometry as a limiting case. Indeed from the standpoint of modern physics the existence of rigid bodies and rigid body motion is not a fundamental self-evident requirement anymore, but only a special property that obtains in a definite limiting case of the physics of classical mechanics and geometry. Helmholtz’s reasoning only shows that the possibility of this limiting case entails the Riemannian metric. Riemann adopted the same principles in geometry as did Faraday and Maxwell before him in electromagnetism, namely, to understand the world from its behavior in the infinitely small. Riemann thereby introduced into the study of geometry the notion of geometric fields and foresaw the possibility of a dynamical geometry which not only acts on matter but is in turn affected by matter. See Scholz (1992) on Riemann’s vision of a new approach to Geometry.

38. Any vector space with a metric tensor has an orthonormal basis in which the metric has the canonical form

\[ \diag(- 1, \ldots ,- 1, 1, \ldots , 1). \]

The sum of these diagonal elements, that is, the trace of the canonical form, is called the signature of the metric. If the metric is positive-definite, then its canonical form is \(\diag(1, 1, \ldots , 1)\). A metric that is not positive-definite, is called indefinite. The metric of Einstein’s theory of special relativity is indefinite and has signature \(+2\) or \(- 2\) corresponding respectively to the traces of the canonical form \(\diag(- 1, 1, 1, 1)\) or \(\diag(- 1,- 1,- 1, 1)\). Positive-definite metrics are called Riemannian, whereas the indefinite metric of relativity theory is called Lorentzian or Pseudo-Riemannian.

39. The concept of infinitesimal parallel vector displacement is essential for doing calculus on manifolds. In an unstructured smooth continuum or manifold, in Weyl’s words “a completely formless four-dimensional continuum in the sense of analysis situs,” there are very few calculus-based operations available. Apart from the limited application of the exterior derivative of a differential form, such an amorphous manifold does not have enough structure with which to define a general notion of differentiation. To be able to differentiate vector or tensor fields in order to determine how such fields change as they move from point to point over the manifold, requires some means by which to compare the geometric relations or objects at different infinitesimally nearby points on the manifold. That is, a general notion of the “derivative” is required which is defined independently of any particular coordinate choice that labels the points of the manifold in some local coordinate neighbourhood.

This problem is relatively simple in a Euclidean space because such a space satisfies two conditions: it admits global Cartesian coordinates and a path-independent distant parallelism of vectors. Because of the latter condition a Euclidean space is an affine space; it is a vector space in which no point is singled out as the origin. If in a Euclidean space a set of basis vectors is attached to a point \(O\) as origin, then it is possible to describe the space with respect to any other point \(O'\) as the origin, by taking as a basis at \(O'\) those vectors which are parallel to the basis vectors at \(O\). Consequently, in the \(n\)-dimensional Euclidean space \(\mathbb{R}^{n}\) the notion of a derivative is readily available. Let \(v\) be a vector field in \(\mathbb{R}^{n}\) defined along a curve \(x = x(t)\). The derivative of this vector field is another vector field \(dv\,/\,dt\) along the curve, defined, as usual by

\[\tag{63} v\,'(t) = \frac{dv(t)}{dt} = \lim_{h \rightarrow 0} \frac{[v(t+h)-v(t)]}{h}. \]

It is clear that one is comparing a vector at one point, \(x(t)\), with another vector at the second point, \(x(t + h)\). This comparison is possible because \(\mathbb{R}^{n}\), being an affine space, allows us to parallel translate a vector at a given point to any other point in \(\mathbb{R}^{n}\). But this definition of the derivative cannot be carried over directly to a vector or tensor field defined over a general manifold. In such a situation, tangent vectors, or more generally, tensors at two different points \(x^{i}\) and \(x^{i} + dx^{i}\), obey different transformation laws; consequently, their difference is not a tensor. Tensorial quantities, such as vectors and other entities, can be algebraically combined and manipulated only when they are located at the same point on the manifold. If it is possible, however, to compare two tangent vectors which are located at two infinitesimally nearby points, at one of the two points, by means of an appropriate notion of infinitesimal parallel displacement of one tangent vector to the location of the other, then we can determine their difference; and their difference will itself be a vector, and therefore a tensorial quantity, provided the process of infinitesimal parallel transport employed, is coordinate independent. See for example (Frankel, 1997, 236).

40. Let \(M\) and \(N\) be manifolds. If \(f : M \rightarrow N\) is \(C^{\infty}\), one-to-one, onto, and has \(C^{\infty}\) inverse, then \(f\) is called a diffeomorphism and \(M\) and \(N\) are said to be diffeomorphic. Diffeomorphic manifolds have identical manifold structures. In the current context, \(M\) and \(N\) are replaced by \(\mathbb{R}\). For further discussion of the notion of a diffeomorphism, see §4.4.2.

41. This approach was taken mainly in the United States under the leadership of Thomas (1925), Veblen and Thomas (1926).

42. Weyl then proved the following theorem:

A transformation \(\Gamma \rightarrow \overline{\Gamma}\) is a projective transformation if and only if

\[ \Gamma^{i}_{jk} \rightarrow \overline{\Gamma}^{i}_{jk} = \Gamma^{i}_{jk} + \delta^{i}_{j}\varphi_{k} + \delta^{i}_{k}\varphi_{j} \]

where \(\varphi_{k}\) is some covariant vector field.

43. The projective coefficients satisfy \(\Pi^{\,j}_{jk}(x^{i}(p)) = 0\) and \(\Pi^{i}_{jk}(x^{i}(p)) = \Pi^{i}_{kj}(x^{i}(p))\).

44. Weyl’s notion of the Führungsfeld is extensively discussed in §§4.3.2–4.4.4.

45. When quantum mechanics emerged around middle of the 1920’s and quantum field theory took center stage shortly thereafter, new particles and forces were discovered.

46. One of the distinguishing features of long-range forces is that their magnitudinal increases or decreases is inversely proportional to the square of the distance between the interacting bodies. Short-range forces, on the other hand, increase or decrease exponentially.

47. Many commentators – eg., Ryckman (2005, chapter 6, and 2020) – have argued and emphasized that Husserl’s phenomenology was a decisive factor that led Weyl to his construction of a pure infinitesimal geometry. Other commentators disagree. Drawing on Scholz (2001, 97), McCoy (2022) argues that it was the Göttingen mathematical—physics tradition, in particular Riemann — its key figure, which played a central role in Weyl’s construction of a pure infinitesimal geometry. Afriat (2009, 2019) argues that Weyl’s theory of gravitation and electricity derives from ‘mathematical justice’, namely, the equal rights of direction and length. As Weyl observes (see above citation), if it is not reasonable to assume integrability for the transfer of direction, then it is likewise not reasonable, aside from historical considerations, to make the integrability assumption in the case of length–transfer.

One might in this context also recur to Hans Reichenbach’s (1938, 1968) (see also Schickore and Steinle (2006)) important distinction between “the context of discovery ” and “the context of justification.” While Husserl’s phenomenology may well have played a role in Weyl’s discovery of a pure infinitesimal geometry and gauge invariance, it does not follow that it also played a role in Weyl’s justification of them. In subsequent scientific publications, including his reply to Einstein’s critique, Weyl’s justification of his unification attempt adduces only mathematical and physical, and not phenomenological reasons. It is not unreasonable to suggest, therefore, that Weyl, or for that matter any other competent mathematician or physicist, would have discovered a pure infinitesimal geometry and gauge theory, without any knowledge of or exposure to Husserl’s phenmenology.

It is interesting to note that aesthetic reasons also played a justificatory role for Weyl. In his obituary of Weyl, Freeman Dyson (1956) says that Weyl once said to him, half jokingly, “My work always tried to unite the true with the beautiful; but when I had to choose one or the other, I usually chose the beautiful.” Subrahmanyan Chandrasekhar (1987, 66) tells us that he once inquired of Dyson

whether Weyl had given an example of his having sacrificed truth for beauty. I learned that the example which Weyl gave was his gauge theory of gravitation … Apparently, Weyl became convinced that this theory was not true as a theory of gravitation; but still it was so beautiful that he did not wish to abandon it and so he kept it alive for the sake of its beauty. But much later, it did turn out that Weyl’s instinct was right after all, when the formalism of gauge invariance was incorporated into quantum electrodynamics.

Another example which Weyl did not mention, but to which Dyson drew attention, is Weyl’s two-component relativistic wave equation of the neutrino. Weyl discovered this equation and the physicists ignored it for some thirty years because it violated parity invariance. And again, it turned out that Weyl’s instincts were right.

48. Note the structural similarity between this analysis and Weyl’s analysis of the notion of an affine connection and parallel displacement.

49. Weyl’s proof is quite elementary involving appropriate substitutions and index manipulations.

50. In 1921, at the age of 21 years, Pauli wrote a review of the whole literature on relativity, which was published in the Encyklopädie der mathematischen Wissenschaften.

51. Note that Pauli (and also Weyl (see below)) denotes the electromagnetic four potential as \(\varphi_{i}\), instead of \(A_{j}\).

52. It is useful in this context to recall Einstein’s (1954) distinction between principle theories and constructive theories. The aim of a constructive theory, such as, for example, the kinetic theory of gases, is to reduce a wide class of diverse complex physical processes to simpler ones. On the other hand, a principle theories, such as, for example, the special and the general theories of relativity, postulate abstract structural constraints which events are held to satisfy. In order to exhibit the physical basis for the structural constraints, which a principle theory postulates certain events must satisfy, such structures contained in the mathematical model of the theory should have a link to physical experience. It must therefore be possible, at least in principle, to relate those structural constraints to experience in a way that is consistent with the theory. As Bohr and Rosenfeld (1933, 1950) suggest, any principle theory should satisfy the basic requirement of a proper or complete theory. According to Marzke and Wheeler (1964), Bohr and Rosenfeld “have stressed that every proper theory should provide in and by itself its own means for defining the quantities with which it deals. According to this principle, classical general relativity should admit to calibrations of space and time that are altogether free of any reference to the quantum of action.” That is, completeness requires that there is a link to physical experience of the various structures inherent in the mathematical model of a principle theory of spacetime, and that this link is realizable, by means of relatively simple physical probative systems which are themselves well defined within the classical spacetime theory, and which therefore can provide within the classical framework, at least in principle, epistemic access to the relevant structures postulated by the spacetime theory.

53. For a discussion of some of the methodological/epistemological issues in this context see Ryckman (1994, 1996, 2003). See also Kerszberg (2007).

54. For more information on Weyl’s unified field theory and the history of gauge theory see Brading (2002), Cao (1997), Jackson and Okun (2001), Mielke and Hehl (1988), O’Raifeartaigh and Straumann (2000), O’Raifeartaigh (1997), Ryckman (2005, 2009), Scholz (1999a, 2001, 2004), Straumann (2001), Vizgin (1994).

55. An interesting brief account of this is given in Kragh (1990, 239–241).

56. For an informative discussion of Weyl's evolving views on the Problem of Space see Scholz (2001, 2004, 2019). Also see Biagioli (2019)’s informative historical discussion of Weyl’s Problem of Space by relating it to the views of Hermann von Helmholtz, Felix Klein and Moritz Schlick.

57. In a Finsler geometry the general definition of the length of a vector is not necessarily given in the form of the square root of a quadratic form (symmetric bilinear form) as in the Riemannian case. That is, a Finsler geometry is a Riemannian geometry without this quadratic restriction. As we saw earlier, Riemann had already implicitly introduced a Finsler metric structure by introducing a metric structure in a general space based on the arc element

\[\begin{align} ds &= F[x^{1}(p),\ldots,x^{n}(p); dx^{1}(p), \ldots, dx^{n}(p)] \\ &=_{def} F[x(p); dx(p)] \\ &=_{def} F_{p}(dx), \end{align}\]

where \(ds = F[x(p);dx(p)] = F_{p}(dx)\), known as the Finsler function or Finsler metric field, is a smooth, non-negative function in the 2n variables, and is zero only when \(dx(p) = 0\). Moreover, Riemann also required \(ds = F[x(p); dx(p)] = F_{p}(dx)\) to be homogeneous of degree 1 in the \(dx(p)\)s, that is,

\[\begin{align} \lvert \lambda \rvert ds &= \lvert \lambda \rvert F[x(p); dx(p)] \\ &= F[x(p); \lambda dx(p)] \\ &= F_p(\lambda dx), \lambda \in \mathbb{R}. \end{align}\]

For the case of positive-definite Finsler metrics, it is customary to work with the function \(F_{p}\) that determines the infinitesimal length interval \(ds\); however, for some purposes, it is more natural to work with the Finsler function \(F^{2}_{p}\) that determines \(ds^{2}\), particularly in the case of indefinite metrics.

58. It should be noted that this characterization of Weyl’s problem of space is based on Coleman and Korté (2001), which differs radically from the commonly held view that can be found in, for example, Scheibe (1957, 1988), Laugwitz (1958) and Scholz (1999b, 2001). Coleman and Korté (2001) have argued that the commonly held view of Weyl’s problem of space had its origin in the work of Cartan, who got his understanding of what Weyl was doing from the French translation of the fourth edition of Weyl’s book Raum-Zeit-Materie. A detailed account of the commonly held view, together with an argument in favour of the view that Weyl’s problem of space was really concerned only with Finsler metrics, and that Cartan invented a different problem of space, which was concerned with \(G\)-structures instead, is given in §4.6, and §4.7 of Coleman and Korté (2001).

It is interesting to note in this context that according to a recent article by Chern (1996), virtually all of the important theorems pertaining to Riemannian geometry have been extended to the setting of general Finsler metrics, and that Riemannian geometry, therefore, should be regarded merely as a special case of Finsler geometry.

See also the discussion by Ryckman (2005, 154–158) on Weyl’s Raumproblem.

59. See §4.1.1.

60. See §4.1.3, equation (9).

61. The lectures were published in (Weyl (1923a)) together with a long appendix in which Weyl gave the details of an improved proof. For a discussion of the development of one of Weyl’s major texts and the local and international political and social background to Weyl’s lectures, see Roca-Rosell (2019).

62. See also Eckes (2018) and Stemeroff (2024) on Weyl’s epistemology and his use of the apriori-aposteriori distinction.

63. See §4.5.2.

64. The ‘a priori’ here does not refer to the Kantian a priori (subjective) form of experience. For a clarification of this see §4.5.8.

65. For an informative discussion of the concepts of automorphism, similarity, and congruence in Weyl, see Scholz (2017, 2018), and other commentaries in Weyl (2017), such as Volkert (2017, 2017a) on the history of mathematical symmetry, and a commentary on Weyl’s text on symmetry; and Giulini (2017) on the meaning and aspects of the physical notion of symmetry.

Weyl (2017) also includes an hitherto unpublished essay by Weyl (2017a), entitled “Similarity and congruence: a chapter in the epistemology of science.”

66. See however §4.4.5.

67. For example a vector field on \(M\) is characterized by a cross section \(\sigma\) of the tangent space \(T(M)\); that is, \(\sigma: M \rightarrow T(M)\), such that \(\pi \circ \sigma = id_{M}\), where \(\pi : T(M) \rightarrow M\) is the projection.

68. Using the jet and jet-bundle formalism of Ehresmann (1951a,b,c, 1952a,b, 1983), they first formulate quite general path structures which are not defined at the outset in terms of geodesic paths and which require for their description only the local differential topological structure. They then prove a number of theorems, which generalizes a result proved by Ehlers and Köhler (1977). The theorems serve as necessary and sufficient criteria for singling out free (fall) motion and involve only local differential topological concepts and are coordinate and frame independent. They also show that the theorems are epistemically effective in that they can be employed as empirical criteria for singling out free (fall) motion at a level of testing that requires no more structure than is needed for introducing arbitrary physical local coordinates (local differential topology). Coleman and Korté argue that their results establish that the projective axioms concerning free (fall) motion in Ehlers, Pirani and Schild’s constructive axiomatics is epistemically decidable in a non-circular, non-conventional way.

69. Weyl’s Hypothesis is also referred to in the literature as ‘Weyl’s Postulate’ or ‘Weyl’s Principle’.

70. Einstein’s field equations for the metric tensor in matter-free regions are not linear. That is, the linear combination of two solutions to the field equations is not necessarily a solution. The gravitational field of a body can do work and therefore contains energy, and since it contains energy it must possess mass, which in turn creates an additional gravitational field. Consequently, the gravitational field itself contributes to its own source. This means that the gravitational field produced by two bodies is not simply the sum of the separate fields but also involves contributions from their interaction. Thus in providing solutions to linearized field equations the gravitational effects are simply considered as additive, thereby ignoring the effects which the gravitational field has on its own source.

71. Weyl discusses the problem of motion in many other places, especially (Weyl, 1923b, 5 edn).

72. Emphasis added.

73. It would seem that Weyl intends a relativised or conditional ‘a priori’ in this context: if certain features or principles of the general theory of relativity are true, then Mach’s principle can be rejected on logical grounds alone.

74. Bernard (2019) suggests that there exist different formulations of the plasticine example in Weyl’s writings that reflect his evolving views concerning the relationship between the metric and matter.

75. Among the many discussions of the problem of motion and the meaning of Mach’s Principle the reader may wish to consult (Barbour and Pfister (1995), Barbour (2001), Brown (2005), DiSalle (2006)).

76. Sklar (1974, 229–233) has suggested that the problem of absolute acceleration arises because we tend to think of acceleration as a dyadic relation: something accelerates either with respect to some observable or unobservable entity. Sklar suggests that there is an alternative way to think of absolute acceleration, which, if adopted by the relationalist, will avoid the traditional relationalist difficulties concerning absolute acceleration. He proposes that we think of acceleration as a monadic relation so that “the expression ‘\(A\) is absolutely accelerated’ is a complete assertion, as is, for example, ‘\(A\) is red’….” It should be clear from the foregoing, however, that Sklar’s suggestion is incoherent within the context of GTR. The inhomogeneity of the transformation law of the 3-acceleration entails that an acceleration that is zero with respect to one coordinate system is not zero with respect to another coordinate system. Consequently, absolute nonacceleration conceived of as a monadic property is not a well defined concept because it is not a coordinate independent notion. A monadic property which can be transformed away by means of a passive coordinate transformation can hardly represent a brute, inexplicable fact about the world. However, the difference \(\xi^{\alpha}_{2} - \Pi^{\alpha}_{2}(x^{i}, \xi^{\alpha}_{1})\) transforms linearly and homogeneously; consequently, the vanishing or non-vanishing of these field-body relations is coordinate independent.

77. Thus formulated, the law of inertia is an empirical law. It is falsifiable, for if there exist at least two sets of particles each of which is governed by a distinct geodesic directing field \(\Pi_{2}\) and \(\Pi'_{2}\), then particles belonging to the two distinct directing-field sets may be identified and in turn may be used to measure in any chosen local neighbourhood of spacetime the two distinct projective structures. This discovery procedure is a non-circular, coordinate and frame independent epistemically effective procedure which makes use of a purely local differential topological criterion for geodesicity. (See Coleman and Korté (1980, 1982, 1984, 1987, 1989, 1990))

78. See, (Scholz, 2001, 83) and (Sigurdsson, 1991, 204).

79. See also Sieroka (2006) who looks in this context at the influence of Fichte on Weyl.

80. See Sigurdsson (1991, 2001).

81. Einstein later came down on the side of field theory “as a program”. See for example Einstein’s discussion of the field/matter dualism in Einstein and Infeld (1938, 255–59) and Einstein (1949).

82. Since Einstein’s nonlinear field equations are partial differential equations, the ten potentials of the metric \(g_{ij}\) are not determined by the field equations without a specification of the boundary conditions at infinity.

83. The density of matter was uniform, its random velocities zero.

84. Accounts of the historical and technical developments of cosmology are provided by (Bondi (1960), Fock (1964), Kerszberg (1989), Kragh (1996), Misner et al. (1973), Narlikar (2002), North (1965), Weinberg (1972)).

85. Like the Einstein universe, de Sitter’s universe was assumed to be static. However, unlike Einstein’s universe, it contained no matter. It is tempting to reject de Sitter’s solution on the grounds that de Sitter’s universe is empty. Consequently, the initial interest in de Sitter’s solution focused primarily on Einstein’s mistaken claim that his field equations do not permit vacuum solutions. However, de Sitter’s universe has some other interesting properties which subsequently came to be appreciated because of new astronomical discoveries in the early 1920’s that suggested that the universe is not static, but expanding. This engendered an interest to find a cosmological model of such a universe. Because de Sitter’s relativistic model provided the only alternative to Einstein’s model, it aroused new interest and was reexamined in light of these astronomical discoveries. It was realized that mathematically placing hypothetical particles into de Sitter’s empty spacetime—particles that have no mass and do not influence the spacetime geometry—they accelerate away from each other. This means that while de Sitter’s universe is empty from a dynamic point of view, kinematically it is non-static, it is expanding. Moreover, although de Sitter’s specific coordinate representation of the metric of his solution might lead one to think that his universe is static, there exists another set of coordinates with respect to which the metric of de Sitter’s universe assumes an explicitly dynamical form. According to Eddington (1933, 46): “The situation has been summed up in the statement that Einstein’s universe contains matter but no motion and de Sitter’s contains motion but no matter.”

86. A very detailed discussion of Weyl’s contributions to cosmology is provided by Kerszberg (1989).

87. Except at a singular point in the infinitely remote past and possibly in the distant future.

88. Known as smooth-fluid approximation this procedure is often used to go from a discrete distribution to a continuum-density distribution of particles.

89. As reported by Weyl (1924c) in footnote 1 of the cited work.

90. Although Weyl did mention the incident again much later in an article Weyl (1949b) concerning Relativity as a Stimulus in Mathematical Research, he was probably not too perturbed by Study’s rebuke since Study was in the habit of attacking just about everybody. Nevertheless, there is no doubt that his attention was drawn to the theory of invariants of groups, the full analysis of which requires the theory of group representations.

91. See also Goodman (2008).

92. As was mentioned in (§4.2), Cartan obtained his understanding of Weyl’s Raumproblem from the French translation of the fourth edition of Weyl’s (1923b) book. Thus Cartan did not have before him Weyl’s simplified and improved proof which Weyl (1923a, Appendix 12) published in the spring of 1923. Soon after, Cartan (1922, 1923b) wrote two papers on the subject. It is clear from these papers that Cartan adopted a \(G\)-structure (metric) view of Weyl’s analysis; that is, Cartan analyzed Weyl’s space problem on the basis moving frames and differential forms. Cartan formulated the crucial theorem in this context for any volume-preserving subgroup of \(GL(n)\). Weyl (1923a, Appendix 12, 88) said, referring to (Cartan (1922)):

A quite different proof has been given by E. Cartan …; it rests on the earlier, general and deep investigations by Cartan on the theory of continuous groups in which he succeeded in solving quite generally the problem of the presentation of all abstract groups … and of their realization by means of infinitesimal, linear operations. … He needs only to select from the groups presented by him those which satisfy my requirements.

Weyl then points out that his own proof is more direct and elementary than Cartan’s proof, which, according to Weyl, required an extensive detour involving the theory of semisimple Lie algebras.

In contrast to Cartan’s proof mine does not take the detour of the investigation of abstract groups. It is based on the classical theory of the individual linear mapping which goes back to Weierstrass.

93. Weyl’s deep and wide ranging contributions to group theory and analysis — including his subsequent group theoretical application to quantum mechanics (Weyl 1928a) — and their influences on modern developments, are discussed in Tent, Katrin ed. (2008). The volume also contains an interesting paper entitled “Emmy Noether and Hermann Weyl.”

94. See Sharpe (1997, iv).

95. As cited by Norton (1999).

96. Cartan’s generalization of Klein geometries thereby founded the theory of group or \(G\)-structures.

97. For a discussion of Schrödinger’s paper see Yang (1987). For an interesting observation concerning the historical context of Schrödinger’s paper see Raman and Forman (1969).

98. On Weyl’s reaction to any of these proposals to reinterpret his 1918 gauge invariance see (Scholz, 2004, 185). A good discussion of the history of Weyl’s new gauge principle can be found in Jackson and Okun (2001).

99. It should be noted, however, that there were other prominent scientists such as, for example, Sommerfeld, Eddington, and Plank whose initial reaction to Weyl’s unified field theory was very positive.

100. Ryckman (2003, 61) correctly points out, “Weyl did not start out with the objective of unifying graviation and electromagentism, but sought to remedy a perceived blemish in Riemannian ‘infinitesimal’ geometry. The resulting ‘unification’ was, as it were, serendipitous.”

101. The inconsistency Weyl is referring to concerns that fact that ordinary Riemannian geometry is not a genuine infinitesimal geometry because while directions of vectors can be compared only locally, the lengths of vectors can be compared non-locally, that is, globally.

102. The addendum was written for Selecta Hermann Weyl dedicated to Weyl on his 70th birthday and is also reprinted in the collected works with the original paper Gravitation und Elektrizität.

103. For an interesting discussion of Weyl’s empirical turn in his methodological approach to gauge theory, see Scholz (2005).

104. As Kragh (1990, 64) describes it:

Dirac’s theory of the electron had a revolutionary effect on quantum physics. It was as though the relativistic equation had a life of its own, full of surprises and subtleties undreamed of by Dirac when he worked it out. During the next couple of years, these aspects were uncovered. The mathematics of the equation was explored by von Neumann, Van der Waerden, Fock, Weyl, and others, and the most important result of this work was the spinor analysis, which built upon a generalization of the properties of the Dirac matrices. Dirac had not worried about the mathematical nature of his four-component quantities; at first, it took the mathematical physicists by surprise to learn that the quantities were neither four-vectors nor tensors.

105. One may think of spinors as two-component vectors that change sign under a \(2\pi\) rotation. Thus to get back to the initial state requires a \(4\pi\) rotation. Misner et al. (1973, 1148–49) provide a vivid illustration of a spinorial transformation. See also Penrose (2004).

106. Much later in collaboration with R. Brauer, Brauer and Weyl (1935) developed the theory of spinors for \(n\)-dimensions.

107. Noether (1918) published a paper that is now famously associated with ‘Noether’s theorem’. Brading (2002) has drawn attention to the fact that the so-called Noether theorem is one of two theorems proved in the 1918 paper and concerns global symmetries, whereas the lesser known second theorem pertains to local symmetries. Brading also shows that Weyl pioneered the use of Noether’s second theorem already in the third and later editions of Raum-Zeit-Materie and in Weyl (1918a), by connecting conservation of electric charge with local gauge symmetry. Moreover, Brading points out that “[i]n his 1929 paper ‘Electron and Gravitation’ Weyl follows exactly the same general strategy as in his 1918 work, applying it to his new unified theory of matter and electromagnetism (as opposed to the 1918 unified theory of gravity and electromagnetism)”. See also Brading and Brown (2003).

108. Noting Weyl’s strong association of gauge invariance with relativity theory in Weyl’s 1929 paper, Yang (1986) remarks: “Twenty years later, when Mills and I worked on non-Abelian gauge fields, our motivation was completely divorced from general relativity and we did not appreciate that gauge fields and general relativity are somehow related. Only in the late 1960’s did I recognize the structural similarity mathematically of non-Abelian gauge fields with general relativity and understand that they both were connections mathematically.”

109. For an elementary account of gauge theory and its history, including a discussion of the Aharonov-Bohm effect in this context, see (Moriyasu, 1983, 18, 55).

110. See also a 2020 collection of papers entitled One Hundred Years of Gauge Theory, edited by Silvia De Bianchi and Claus Kiefer. The papers “Hermann Weyl’s Space-Time Geometry and the Origin of Gauge Theory 100 Years Ago” by Norbert Straumann, and “Gauging the Spacetime Metric—Looking Back and Forth a Century Later” by Erhard Scholz, are particularly noteworthy in this context.

111. There is now some evidence that most, if not all, neutrinos have mass. However, since their mass is small enough setting \(m = 0\) provides a reasonable approximation in describing their behaviour.

112. For an interesting recent discussion of some of the historical developments surrounding Weyl’s neutrino theory, see De Bianchi, Silvia (2018).

For more details on Dirac’s equation, spinor’s and parity, see Zee (2003).

113. The first part of the paper deals with the physical interpretation of the representation of physical magnitudes by Hermitean forms on Hilbert space. The second part of the paper is a group-theoretical analysis of quantum kinematics and deals with the nature and interpretation of canonical variables. In the third and final part of the paper, Weyl treats the dynamical problem from the viewpoint of a one parameter group of unitary transformations in system space generated by the Hamiltonian operator of the system. Weyl then notes that the formalism of quantum mechanics that he has just presented is not compatible with the special theory of relativity and that a general solution of this problem is not at hand.

114. Authoritative discussions of Weyl’s seminal work may be found in (Mackey (1988), Schwinger (1988), Speiser (1988). See also Scholz (2006) for a penetrating historical analysis group theory played in the development of quantum mechanics.

115. Weyl (1928, 1931b, 1949a) suggested that Pauli’s Exclusion Principle vindicates the contingent truth of Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles for fermions. Roughly speaking, since no two electrons, or more generally, no two fermions may occupy the same quantum state, they cannot have all the same monadic state-dependent properties. Therefore, although numerically distinct, they are not indescernibles. The reader my wish to consult a recent review article on this topic by Muller and Saunders (2008) and its many references to the literature concerning the problem of identical particles.

116. How did the theory of relativity force us to recognize that in physics in general, and in general relativity in particular, space and time “must be replaced by a four-dimensional continuum in the abstract arithmetical sense”? To clarify this, it helps to distinguish between three types of coordinate systems: formal, theoretic and physical . See Coleman and Korté (1994a, 1995, 1995a) and Korté (2006).

Formal coordinates are purely abstract, mathematical coordinates that are used by the theorist to model the contents of the world, the dynamics and interactions of the various physical entities of the world and the physical procedures used to measure and survey the world. Typically, it is stated that an \(n\)-dimensional, differentiable manifold \(M\) is a Hausdorff, topological space equipped with an atlas, that is, a family \(\{(U_{\alpha},x_{\alpha})\}\) of charts, such that the open neighbourhoods \(U_{\alpha}\) cover \(M\). The maps \(x_{\alpha} : U_{\alpha} \rightarrow x_{\alpha\vdash}(U_{\alpha}) \subseteq \mathbb{R}^{n}\) are homeomorphisms, and whenever \(U_{\alpha} \cap U_{\beta}\ne\varnothing\), the coordinate transformation maps

\[ x_{\beta} \circ x^{- 1}_{\alpha}: x_{\alpha\vdash}(U_{\alpha} \cap U_{\beta}) \rightarrow x_{\beta\vdash}(U_{\alpha} \cap U_{\beta}) \]

are \(C^{k}\) for \(1 \lt k \lt \infty,\) \(C^{\infty}\) or \(C^{\omega}\). The coordinate charts \((U_{\alpha},x_{\alpha})\) are formal.

Theoretical coordinates, also called, adapted coordinates, are determined by some fundamental entity, typically the geometric structure of the world that is postulated by the theory. For example, in Galilean models of spacetime, the spatial geometry is typically introduced by stipulating the existence of a system of spatial coordinates \((x, y, z)\) with respect to which the metric is given by \(ds^{2} = dx^{2} + dy^{2} + dz^{2}\). These coordinates are determined up to a Euclidean transformation by a fundamental element of the theory, the spatial metric, and are hence linked to the metrical structure postulated by the theory. Similarly in the special theory of relativity, it is assumed that a system of coordinates \((t,x,y,z)\) exists with respect to which the spacetime metric is given by \(ds^{2} = -dt^{2} + d\overline{r} \cdot d\overline{r}\). These coordinates are likewise theoretic and are determined up to a Poincaré transformation by the fact that they are adapted to a fundamental element of the theory, the spacetime metric.

A physical coordinate system is one that makes use of various physical entities, bodies and fields, to assign coordinates to physical events. It is this kind of coordinate system that is used by a physical observer to track material bodies and to measure various physical fields such as the electromagnetic field and the spacetime-metric field. An example of a physical coordinate chart is the radar tracking system that may be found at every major airport. A physical atlas for a region surrounding the earth is provided by the Global Positioning System.

In the context of the theory of general relativity the metric is not an absolute structure with convenient global symmetries; rather, the metric is a dynamical entity that is coupled to the energy-momentum density of matter and other fields. The best we can do is to adapt to a micro-neighborhood by employing a normal coordinate system at a given point. In the absence of symmetry, extended bodies adapted to the geometry cannot exist. Therefore, neither theoretic nor physical coordinate systems can be introduced early in the presentation of the theory of general relativity, that is, prior to the introduction of purely formal coordinates, even with the aid of ad hoc assumptions; because the circumstances that permitted ad hoc assumptions in earlier spacetime theories are simply not available in the case of the theory of general relativity. Since the geometric structure in the general theory of relativity is part of the dynamical problem, the theoretic and physical coordinate systems are also part of the dynamical problem. The relation between the physical coordinates and the geometric structure in general relativity is described by a complicated system of functions \(g_{ij}(x^{i})\). The corresponding relationship in classical mechanics is described by a small number of constants; for example, \(g_{\alpha \beta}(x^{\alpha}) = \delta_{\alpha \beta}\) for the spatial metric. In particular, the description of physical coordinate systems in the theory of general relativity requires that many other physical entities, including the spacetime metric, the electromagnetic field, the world lines of material bodies and their equation-of-motion structures, have to be introduced and analyzed first. Clearly, such a description and analysis of these physical entities must be carried out with respect to a purely mathematical or formal system of coordinates, because theoretic and physical coordinates are not yet part of the model.

The use of purely formal coordinates was not seen as necessary in early spacetime theories because one assumed that the geometric structures were flat and/or homogeneous. These assumptions then permitted the use of theoretic and physical coordinates that are adapted to the geometric structures. Nevertheless, and this is Weyl’s point, in the absence of such ad hoc assumptions, such as for example, Newtons absolute space and time, neither theoretic nor physical coordinate systems can be introduced prior to the introduction of purely formal coordinates, even in spacetime theories preceding the theory of general relativity.

117. Emphasis added. Weyl emphasized throughout his writings the importance of non-metrical coordinates. It is interesting to cite a remark by Einstein (1949, 67) in this context:

Why were another seven years required for the construction of the general theory of relativity? The main reason lies in the fact that it is not so easy to free oneself from the idea that co-ordinates must have an immediate metrical meaning.

118. A similar construction occurs in Weyl’s theoretical derivation of Hubble’s redshift law. See §4.4.7.

119. For more details see the discussion by Ehlers (1988) on Weyl’s contributions to the theory of measurement in general relativity and cosmology. Referring to earlier and even some later literature on general relativity, Ehlers remarks,

one finds a great deal of uncertainty concerning the question of how the “mathematical formalism” of the theory is to be related to observations and measurements. In particular, it was often maintained that special coordinate systems are necessary in order to describe measurements. This unsatisfactory state of affairs was in essence overcome by Weyl. In several typical cases he explained that the interpretation of Einstein’s theory is, in fact, unambiguous, and he showed how measurable quantities can and should be expressed as invariants. To obtain such expressions, Weyl always constructs an idealized spacetime model of the physical process constituting the measurements, thus extending to the general theory Minkowski’s point of view that (classical) physics is spacetime geometry.

120. (Weyl, 1949a, 116). In his intellectual autobiography Carnap (1963, 37–38) recalls that Einstein was seriously worried about the problem of the Now.

He [Einstein] explained that the experience of the Now means something special for man, something essentially different from the past and the future, but that this important difference does not and cannot occur within physics. That this experience cannot be grasped by science seemed to him a matter of painful but inevitable resignation. I remarked that all that occurs objectively can be described in science; on the one hand the temporal sequence of events is described in physics; and, on the other hand, the peculiarities of man’s experiences with respect to time, including his different attitude towards past, present and future, can be described and (in principle) explained in psychology. But Einstein thought that these scientific descriptions cannot possibly satisfy our human needs; that there is something essential about the Now which is just outside of the realm of science. We both agreed that this was not a question of a defect for which science could be blamed, as Bergson thought. … I definitely had the impression that Einstein’s thinking on this point involved a lack of distinction between experience and knowledge. Since science in principle can say all that can be said, there is no unanswerable question left. But though there is no theoretical question left, there is still the common human emotional experience, which is sometimes disturbing for special psychological reasons.

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