John Wyclif’s Political Philosophy
The central idea of Wyclif's political philosophy is that the dominium defining God's primary relation to creation justifies all human dominium, whether it be the mastery of a king, a lesser civil lord, or a priest. But unlike predecessors who were content to define God's mastery as foundational to human lordship in non-metaphysical terms, Wyclif made ready use of his realist ontology to argue that God's dominium functions as a universal by causality for all instances of just human dominium. For medieval political theorists, this was not common practice; some, like Aquinas, can be argued to present unified systems of metaphysics, political thought, and ecclesiology, but many others, including Ockham, Marsilius of Padua, John of Paris, and Giles of Rome, did not. If, like Ockham or Giles, they had metaphysical positions, it is impossible to argue persuasively that their ontologies affected their politics. This makes Wyclif's political and ecclesiological thought notable, for it is one of the few cases where a distinguished metaphysician used his ontology as a foundation for a detailed examination of the just arrangement of authority in church and state. An immediate corrollary to Wyclif's axiomatic position that all just human dominium derives from God is that no private property relations, which serve as the underpinnings for all human mastery, are just without grace. Because, following Augustine, private property is a direct result of the Fall of man, the ideal state is one of communal ownership. Since the Church is the re-established ideal state, grace does not provide for its just ownership of any property whatsoever. Because Wyclif saw the fourteenth-century church enjoying the lion's share of property ownership in England, he argued that the king was bound by God to relieve the church of its property, and to rule over it as a divinely appointed steward. The substance of this argument was realized by Henry VIII, and so Wyclif has been associated, if only as prophetic forerunner, with Tudor reformation. The form of Wyclif's arguments are in no way comparable to modern arguments, though, and are more directly associated with earlier Franciscan positions, like those of Ockham, than they are with later political theory. In this essay, the Latin term dominium will be used to distinguish Wyclif's theologically medieval view from its modern English correlate 'dominion', which connotes absolute mastery.
- 1. Wyclif's Later Works
- 2. Dominium in Political Thought Before Wyclif
- 3. Divine Dominium: Creating, Lending, and Grace
- 4. Types of Human Dominium
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1. Wyclif's Later Works
Government and the relation of divine justice to human law, both secular and ecclesiastical, figure as occasional themes throughout the treatises of the Summa de Ente. After receiving his doctorate in theology in 1373, his attention began to focus more completely on these topics, and his realism continued to undergird his thought at least through 1381, during which period he wrote the treatises that make up the second of his great Summae, the Summa Theologie. In late 1373, he began De Dominio Divino, which serves as bridge from the later, formal theological treatises of the Summa de Ente to the political, social, and ecclesiological subject matter of the Summa Theologie. He began royal service during this period, participating in an embassy to Bruges for negotiations with papal envoys in 1374. Wyclif remained in the service of John of Gaunt for the rest of his life; the Duke protected him from the formal prosecution prompted by five bulls of papal condemnation in 1377. After being condemned for his views on the Eucharist at Oxford in 1381, Wyclif withdrew to Lutterworth, where he remained until his death in December 1384. Though still protected by John of Gaunt, he was no longer in active service after 1379. During these tumultuous years, Wyclif wrote the ten treatises of the Summa Theologie: four on just human government, two on the structure and government of the church, one on scriptural hermeneutics, and three on specific problems afflicting the Church. Our interest lies in De Mandatis Divinis (1375–76), De Statu Innocencie (1376), and De Civili Dominio (1375–76), where he provides the theological foundation for the radical transformation of the church he prescribes in De Ecclesia (1378–79) De Potestate Pape (1379), and De Officio Regis (1379). Towards the end of his life, Wyclif summarized his entire theological vision in Trialogus (1382–83), reiterating the connections between his earlier philosophical works and later political treatises in a three-way dialogue written in language that would appeal to members of the royal court.
2. Dominium in Political Thought Before Wyclif
Dominium and its generally accepted translation, 'lordship', suggest the sovereignty exercised by one individual over another, but Roman law allowed for complexity in distinguishing between property ownership, its primary referent, and jurisdiction, governance, and political power. When twelfth-century canon lawyers resurrected Roman law as the foundation for the ascendant papal monarchy, it was common to distinguish between jurisdictive authority, secular power, and the use and possession of private property. By the beginning of the fourteenth century, dominium largely connoted property ownership, though this usually entailed jurisdictive authority. Most political theorists agreed with Thomas Aquinas in saying that a civil lord who supposed that his jurisdictive authority arose from property ownership rather than from a constitution would be a tyrant (Summa Theologiae IaIIae, Q.56, a.5; Q.58, a.2). Given that the legal use of dominium referred to property ownership and not to the authority to govern, it seems odd that Wyclif used the term to do so much more. The reason may be found in the connection of Augustinian theology to theories of the justice of property ownership. As the papal monarchy developed, its theorists, such as Giles of Rome, found it useful to identify all earthly justice, including just property ownership, with the source of justice in creation.
Augustine's De Civitate Dei was the basis for relating property ownership and secular justice to divine authority. Here the division between two classes of men is clear: some are members of the City of Man, motivated by love of self, while others are motivated by the love of God and a contempt for self, placing them in the City of God. There is really only one true Lord in creation. Mastery of one man over another is the result of Original Sin and is therefore unnatural except in the case of paternity, which is founded on parental love for a child. Among members of the City of God, the relation of prince and subject is not political and does not entail the sort of mastery we see in the City of Man, but rather involves service and sacrifice, as exemplified by the parent/child relationship.
Property ownership has been united to mastery in the City of Man because of Original Sin, whereby man turned away from God in the mistaken belief that he could make claims of exclusive ownership on created beings. This is not to say that Augustine thought that all private property relations are wrong; indeed, he is famous for having argued that all things belong to the just (De Civitate Dei 14, ch. 28). But people who own things are not de facto just. Those for whom ownership is not an end in itself but a means by which to do God's will are freed from the bondage of selfishness imposed by the Fall. They easily recognize the truth of the dictum that one should abstain from the possession of private things, or if one cannot do so, then at least from the love of property (Enarratio in Psalmam 132, ch.4).
Augustine's thought on the relation of ownership to political authority is open to interpretation. One can easily read him as arguing that the Church, as the Body of Christ and earthly instantiation of the City of God, can best exemplify loving lord/subject relations through its ecclesiastical structure, thereby justifying a top-down papal monarchy. Likewise, one can read him as having so separated secular political authority from the rule of love as to make political and ecclesiastical jurisdictive authority utterly distinct. Again, one could interpret Augustine's 'all things belong to the just' as meaning that the Church is the arbiter of all property ownership in virtue of being the Body of Christ and seat of all created justice, or one could argue that the Church should abandon all claims to property ownership, just as the Apostles abstained from the possession of private property. This ambiguity in interpretation was the source of some of the competing theories that influenced Wyclif's position.
2.2 Giles of Rome
During the conflict between Philip IV of France and Pope Boniface VIII in 1301, Giles of Rome wrote De Ecclesiastica Potestate, establishing the absolute secular superiority of the papacy. Giles' master Boniface VIII was responsible for the two famous Bulls, Clericos laicos (1296), which forbade clergy to give up property without papal approval, and Unam sanctam (1302), which declared that secular power is in the service of, and subject to, papal authority. De Ecclesiastica Potestate is an articulation of the concept of power underlying these two Bulls and arising from one of the two interpretations of Augustine described above. In it, Giles describes all power “spiritual and secular” as rooted in the papacy, likening its structure to a papal river from which smaller, secular streams branch out. The source of this river, he continues, is the sea, which is God: “God is a kind of font and a kind of sea of force and power, from which sea all forces and all powers are derived like streams.” Not only is secular power reliant on papal authority; all property ownership, insofar as it is just, is similarly dependent on an ecclesiastical foundation. The key element in just secular power and property ownership, he continues, is grace: without God's will directly moving in creation through the sacraments of the Church, power and ownership are empty claims, devoid of justice. Although Giles did not explicitly call the combination of ownership and temporal power dominium, his uniting the two in a consistent, Augustinian fashion was sufficient for the next generation of Augustinian theorists.
2.3 The Franciscans and Their Opponents
Thirty years earlier, in Bonaventure's Apologia pauperum of 1269, the Franciscans had defined any property ownership, communal or individual, as inimical to the ideals of their Order. The Fall from paradise and the introduction of selfishness to human nature makes property ownership of any type, private or communal, an abberation. For the Franciscans, “all things belong to the just” only in the sense that “belonging” entails non-exclusive sharing (usus pauper), not ownership. Within three decades, the Franciscans were divided on this issue: one party, the Spirituals, demanded that the friars adopt usus pauper as their ideal of spiritual perfection, while the other, the Conventuals, argued for a more lenient interpretation of the Rule. The Spirituals, under the guidance of the philosopher John Peter Olivi and his follower Ubertino de Casale, outnumbered the Conventuals by century's end, and had become sufficiently vocal to attract the attention of the pope. John XXII was deeply suspicious of the Spiritual Franciscans' arguments, perhaps fearing a reappearance of the communitarian Waldensian heresy. Private ownership, John argued, was not the result of Original Sin, but a gift from God that Adam enjoyed in Paradise and which the blessed still can enjoy, secure in the knowledge that their ownership is sanctioned by God's dominium. This argument was to have notable consequences. John's eventual controversy with the Spiritual's champion, William Ockham, led to the first important use of the concept of natural right. But for our analysis, the important thing is that iurisdictio and proprietas were united in the concept of dominium. Wyclif would make use of the Franciscans' arguments for apostolic poverty, as well as of John XXII's idea that divine dominium provides the basis for all human dominium, though in a way that would certainly have displeased both parties.
By the 1350s, opponents of the Franciscans had broadened their range of criticism to question the legitimacy of the Order itself. Richard Fitzralph, (d. 1360) wrote De Pauperie Salvatoris, a sustained examination of the Franciscans' claim to function without supervision by diocesan bishop in which he argues that if the friars rely on the justice of the owners of what they use, they are bound by the same laws that bind the owners. Thus, if the owners of what the friars use are ecclesiastical, it follows that the friars must obey ecclesiastical authority. Fitzralph's position is important here because it argues that grace alone is the justification for any instance of dominium in creation, and that all just dominium ultimately relies on God's dominium. Both serve as cornerstones of Wyclif's position. God's dominium is a natural consequence of the act of creating, and with it comes divine governance and conservation of created being. The rational beings in creation, angels and human beings, enjoy the loan of elements of God's created universe, but this is not a divine abdication of ultimate authority since everything is still directly subject to divine dominium.
When the nature of the dominium lent to Adam changed with the Fall, the love defining our natural dominium was affected, but not eradicated. Men devised political dominium to regulate property relations, and although sin keeps them from recognizing the borrowed nature of any dominium, it does not preclude there being grace-justified property ownership. In some cases, God infuses the artificial property-relations that we call dominium with sufficient grace to make them generally equivalent to prelapsarian dominium. These grace-favored cases of human dominium do not replicate the authority of God's dominium, but can exhibit the love that characterizes it. Fitzralph's expression of the Augustinian papal position makes grace the deciding factor in ownership relations and ultimately in political authority, both of which had become nested in the term dominium. Wyclif's interpretation of the Augustinian position would stretch past arguments about papal authority and the friars, even past arguments between popes and kings, to stir the very nature of the church as Christ's earthly body. All of this begins, he would argue, with an understanding of God's dominium as the causal exemplar of created lordship.
3. Divine Dominium: Creating, Lending, and Grace
The relation of universal to particular defines Wyclif's conception of how God's dominium causes all instances of dominium in creation. Divine dominium is “the standard prior to and presupposition of all other dominium; if a creature has dominium over anything, God already has dominium over it, so any created dominium follows upon divine dominium” (De Dominio Divino I, ch. 3, p.16.18–22). This relation exceeds mere exemplarity, where human dominium only imitates God's dominium without divine causal determination. God's dominium has causal efficacy over all instances of human mastery such that no true created dominium is possible without direct participation in and constant reliance upon God's dominium. The instrument through which divine dominium moves is grace, which instills in human rulers an essential love defining their every ruling action. Thus, every case of just human dominium entails a constant reliance upon grace as the hallmark of its being an instantiation of God's universal dominium.
God's dominium has six aspects, three identifiable with lordship's ruling element (creation, sustenance, and governance), and three that define lordship's proprietary nature (giving, receiving, and lending) (De Dominio Divino III, ch. 1, p.198.9).7 The necessary precondition for an act of dominium is creation, of which no created being is capable. This makes God's dominium the only true instance of dominium and the source of all created instances of dominium. Because the Divine Ideas and their created correlates, the universals, are ontologically prior to particular created beings, God's dominium over universals is prior to His dominium over particulars. This means that God creates, sustains, and governs the human species prior to ruling over — and knowing — individual people. This led to questions about determinism that served as a starting point for many refutations of Wyclif's theology.
The second set of acts that define dominium — giving, receiving, and lending — provides the foundation for Wyclif's argument that all created dominium necessarily requires grace. God's giving of the divine essence in creating is the truest form of giving because God is giving of Himself through Himself, which no created being can do. Nor can any created being receive as God receives; God truly receives only from Himself through His giving. God gives up nothing in His giving, and acquires nothing in His receiving; creation is God's self-expression, an act in which the divine essence is neither decreased nor increased. The crucial act from the created standpoint is God's lending, for here there is real interaction between Lord and subjects. What human beings as conscious participants in God's lending relation can claim as their own is lent to them by divine authority, which they enjoy through grace.
It is easy to confuse giving with lending because a lord who has only been “lent” a gift of God for use during his lifetime appears to have been “given” that gift. God's giving is communicative, not translative. For us, most giving is translative in that it involves the giver's surrender of every connection to the gift, making it natural for us to suppose that God renounces His authority over what He gives us. In fact, God's giving is communicative, which does not involve surrender of the gift. Because all that God gives to creation will ultimately return to Him, it makes more sense to speak of God's giving as lending.
With any instance of lending, Wyclif explains, the lender seeks assurance that the borrower truly deserves what is to be lent. Human desert of the dominium they are lent is a matter of some complexity involving examination of the theological concept of grace. When a temporal lord lends his subject according to the subject's worthiness, the subject's merit is commensurable with the lord's, and the mutual agreement defining the loan can be made according to the respective merit of each party. The merit that allows the subject desert of consideration for the loan is “condigna”, i.e., grounded in the dignitas shared by lender and subject. Condign merit implies that the meritorious truly deserve the reward, requiring the giver to give it to the merited as something due, as when an olympic athelete earns a gold medal by besting all her opponents. Such a loan is impossible between Creator and creature, because there is no way of placing a creature's merit on the same scale as God's perfect nature; all the creature has, including its worth, is from God, whereas God's perfection is per se. There is no way in which a creature can be considered to deserve anything from God in such a relation. Congruent merit obtains when the meritorious does not have the power to require anything of the giver. In instances of congruent merit, the goodness of the act does not require the giver to reward the agent, though it does provide sufficient cause for the reward to be given, as when one receives an Academy Award: although many of the audience members may deserve an Oscar, the winner receives it because something about her performance is somehow pleasing to the Academy. Still, Wyclif holds that “It is the invariable law of God that nobody is awarded blessedness unless they first deserve it” (De Dominio Divino III, ch. 4, p.229.18). We can move our wills to the good, and from this, Wyclif says, grace may — but need not — follow. Thus, we merit congruently thanks to God's generosity towards a will in accord with His own. In effect, God lends merit.
Wyclif's theology of grace is the key to understanding how his theory of human dominium relates to divine dominium, its causal paradigm. Man's lordship is at once ownership and jurisdictive mastery, but when a human lord governs, or gives, or receives, or lends, these acts are only just insofar as the lord recognizes that his authority is that of a steward: “Any rational creature is only improperly called a lord, and is rather a minister or steward of the supreme Lord, and whatever he has to distribute, he has purely by grace” ([De Dominio Divino III, ch. 6, p.250.25–29). The essential characteristic of every instance of human dominium is the grace God lends to the individual lord, which itself is grounded in the grace of the Holy Spirit. The human lord appears to have proprietary and juristictive authority by virtue of his own excellence, but this is really only an instantiation of divine dominium, a grace-realized agent of God's lordship. This makes the human lord both master and servant; from the divine perspective, the lord is God's servant, but from the viewpoint of the subject, he is master. Wyclif is tireless in his emphasis on the illusory nature of this mastery; grace allows the human lord to recognize that he is, in fact, the servant of his subjects, ministering to them as a nurturing steward, not lording over them as would a powerful sovereign.
3.1 Natural Dominium
De Civili Dominio begins with the motto, “Civil justice presupposes divine justice; civil dominium presupposes natural dominium.” Man's dominium is threefold — natural, civil, and evangelical — but comprehensible as an instantiation of the justice of God's dominium. As he moved into his general analysis of human dominium, Wyclif's thoughts turned to the most fundamental instance of God's loving governance, the Scriptural commandments. The foundation of all that is right (ius) in creation, he explains, is divine justice (iustitia), so we cannot begin to understand right and wrong in creation without understanding God's uncreated right. This was a significant departure from the Aristotelian position that unaided human reason is capable of justice, and Wyclif explicitly rejects any conception of justice that does not rely on uncreated right. The laws of Scripture are the purest expression of uncreated right available to human eyes, he explains, and are most clearly expressed in the Ten Commandments of Exodus 20, and again in the two greatest commandments of Matthew 22: 37–40. Wyclif's analysis of Christ's law of love and of the Ten Commandments proceeds directly from his disquisition on the relation of earthly justice to eternal right in De Mandatis Divinis. That Wyclif uses the same title Robert Grosseteste had used in his analysis of the decalogue is no accident; Wyclif's debt to Grosseteste's conceptions of sin, love of God, idolatry, and the substance of true faith is obvious throughout the treatise. In De Statu Innocencie, the innocence into which we were created before the Fall, he says, is the optimal condition for any rational being. In our prelapsarian state, our wills would have been in perfect concord with the divine will, so that all human action would be just, effortlessly aligned with the natural order of creation. In this condition, there would be no need for civil or criminal law, since we understood what is right naturally.
This denial of the need for human law is of special import, for Wyclif later argues that the evangelical lord, or priest, as heir of Christ's restoration of the possibility of natural dominium, should never be concerned with such matters. In such a state, private property ownership was unknown. The natural dominium described in Genesis 1:26 is characterized by lack of selfishness, ownership, or any distinction between 'mine' and 'thine'. The true sense of Augustine's “All things belong to the just” is most fully apparent in the prelapsarian natural disposition to share in the use of creation while acting as faithful steward to its perfect lord. The Fall was brought about by the first sin, which Wyclif characterizes as a privation of God's right in man's soul. We are left with wills prone to value the physical, material world above spiritual concerns, and the unavoidable result is private property ownership. We no longer understand a given created good as a gift on loan from God, but can only see it in terms of our own self-interest, and the unfortunate result is civil dominium, an enslavement to material goods.
4. Types of Human Dominium
Wyclif's definition of civil dominium as “proprietary lordship in a viator over the goods of fortune fully according to human law” is centered not on legislative authority, but on the private property ownership enjoyed by the viator, or wayfarer, along life's path (De Civili Dominio III ch. 11, p.178.9–17). This is because all civil dominium is based on the use of goods owned, which is the basis for all postlapsarian conceptions of justice (recall that for Wyclif, only God truly owns created things because creating a thing is necessary for owning it; hence, human beings are only lent created things and can use them justly, or unjustly in case they appropriate them for themselves). Before the Fall, our use of created goods was communal, unencumbered by the complexity that follows upon selfishness. But now, Wyclif explains, there are three types of use: that directly consequent upon civil ownership, civil use without ownership, and evangelical use. The first two are natural results of the Fall, and the third is the result of Christ's Incarnation. Before the Incarnation, civil ownership and civil use were grounded in man-made laws designed primarily to regulate property ownership. These legal systems tended to have two general structures: they were either monarchies, as in most cases, or else they were aristocratic polities. The harmony of the aristocratic polity is certainly preferable because it most resembles the state enjoyed before the Fall; the benevolent aristocracy, as evidenced in the time of the Biblical judges, would foster the contemplative life, communalism, and an absence of corruptible governmental apparatus.
The most common species of civil dominium is monarchy, in which a chief executive power holds ultimate legislative authority. This centralized authority in one man is necessary to implement order; there is no real possibility that the many are capable of ruling on behalf of the many, given the prevalence of sin. The point of civil dominium is not, as with Aristotle, the sustenance of individual virtuous activity. Civil dominium is a phenomenon based on Original Sin, and is therefore unlikely to produce justice per se. If the government of Caesar is occasionally just, it is because it has accidentally realized divine justice. But if civil dominium that is not grounded directly in divine dominium is incapable of sustained just governance, and if natural dominium is the instantiation of divine dominium for which man was created, how can any talk of just civil dominium be possible? To return to the opening dictum of De Civili Dominio, if natural dominium is free from private property ownership, how can civil dominium rely upon it in any way?
Before resolving this problem, we will need to address evangelical dominium as yet another factor in Wyclif's conception of man's postlapsarian state.
4.1 Evangelical Dominium
Christ restores the possibility of gaining our lost natural dominium both through His apostolic poverty and His redemptive sacrifice as described in Holy Scripture. Because of Christ's sinless nature, He was the first man since Adam capable of exhibiting the purity of natural dominium. This Christ shared with His disciples, who were able to renounce all exclusive claims to created goods in a recreation of the communal caritas lost in the Fall (De Civili Dominio III, 4, p. 51.17–24). This poverty is not simply the state of not owning things; one can live sinfully as easily in squalor as one can in luxury. The apostolic poverty of the early Church is a spiritual state, not an economic rejection of civil dominium. The similarity between Wyclif's conception of spiritual poverty as the ideal state for Christians and the Franciscan ideal is noteworthy. Wyclif seems to make a case similar to the Spiritual Franciscans: Christ's life was exemplary for all Christians and Christ lived in apostolic poverty; therefore, all Christians ought follow His example, or at the least have that option open to them. Wyclif's consonance with the Franciscan tradition is also suggested in his use of Bonaventure's definition of apostolic poverty in the third book of De Civili Dominio, but Wyclif's motives are distinctly different from the Friars' (De Civili Dominio III, 8, pp. 119–120). While the Franciscans argued that their rule allowed them to regain the ownership-free purity enjoyed by the early Apostolic church, Wyclif contended that Christ's redemptive sacrifice enabled all Christians to regain natural dominium itself, not just its purity. This suggested that the Franciscan life was a pale imitation of true Christianity, which Wyclif's Franciscan colleagues were quick to point out. One of the first critics of Wyclif's dominium thought was William Woodford, O.F.M., who argued that Wyclif had gone too far in equating apostolic, spiritual poverty with prelapsarian purity. The extensive third book of De Civili Dominio is Wyclif's response to Franciscan critics like Woodford, and in which lie the seeds of the antifraternalism that would characterize his later writings.
Wyclif describes apostolic poverty as a mode of having with love, comprehensible in terms of the individual's use of a thing for the greatest spiritual benefit. God alone can bring about the love instantiating divine dominium, making grace necessary for apostolic poverty. Because the church is founded not on the materially-based laws of man, but on the spiritually-grounded lex Christi, it must be absolutely free of property ownership, the better to realize the spiritual purity required by apostolic poverty. Any material riches that the church comes upon as “goods of fortune” must be distributed as alms for the poor, following the practice of Christ and the disciples, and the apostolic church. This is the ideal to which the Church must aspire through the example of Christ, and some of the harshest invective in Wyclif's prose is directed against the Church's refusal to return to this apostolic state. The turning point in Church history was the Donation of Constantine, on the basis of which the Church claimed to have the civil dominium of a Caesar. Wyclif was vigorous in his condemnation of the Donation, and would likely have been pleased had he lived into the early fifteenth century, when Nicholas of Cusa argued persuasively that the document was a ninth-century forgery.
4.2 Civil Dominium
Given the deleterious influence civil dominium has had on the evangelical dominium of Christ's law, it is difficult to imagine how Wyclif would set aside some civil lords as capable of instantiating divine justice. But apostolic poverty is not identical with an absence of property ownership; it is having with love. While the clergy as spiritual lords ought to follow Christ's example of material poverty, it does not follow that all ownership precludes love. God can certainly bestow grace on those whom He wills to be stewards of created goods. Wyclif envisions the just civil lord or king as the means by which the Church is relieved of its accumulated burden of property ownership. So long as the Church exists in postlapsarian society, it must be protected from thieves, heresy, and infidels. Certainly no evangelical lord ought to be concerned with such matters, given their higher responsibility for the welfare of Christian souls. As a result, the Church needs a guardian to ward off enemies while caring for its own weel-being and administering alms to the poor. This allows Wyclif to describe just, grace-favored civil dominium as different in kind from the civil lordship predicated on materialistic human concerns: “It is right for God to have two vicars in His church, namely a king in temporal affairs, and a priest in spiritual. The king should strongly check rebellion, as did God in the Old Testament, while priests ought minister the precepts mildly, as did Christ, who was at once priest and king.” When he raises conventional topics in political thought, like the particulars of just rule, the responsibilities of royal councillors to their king, the nature of just war, and royal jurisdiction in commerce, his advice is priestly: “[A] lord ought not treat his subjects in a way other than he would rationally wish to be treated in similar circumstances; the Christian lord should not desire subjects for love of dominating, but for the correction and spiritual improvement of his subjects, and so to the efficacy of the church” (De Officio Regis ch. 1, p. 13.4–8). The king ought provide few and just laws wisely and accurately administered, and live subject to these laws, since just law is more necessary for the community than the king. Also, the king should strive to protect the lower classes' claims on temporal goods in the interests of social order, for “nothing is more destructive in a kingdom in its political life than immoderately to deprive the lower classes of the goods of fortune” (De Officio Regis ch. 5, p. 96.9–27). On occasion he discusses the king's need of reliable councillors, generally when discussing the king's need for sacerdotal advice in directing church reform, but he never mentions Parliament as a significant aspect of civil rule.
The most immediate concern of a civil lord living in an age when the Church is being poisoned by avarice should be the radical divestment of all ecclesiastical ownership. Wyclif is tireless in arguing for the king's right to take all land and goods, and indeed, even the buildings themselves, away from the Church. Should the clergy protest against royal divestment, threatening the king with excommunication or interdict, the king should proceed as a physician applies his lancet to an infected boil. No grace-favored civil lord will be disposed to save up the divested goods of the Church for his own enrichment, despite the obvious temptation. He will distribute the Church's ill-gotten lands and goods to the people. This, Wyclif explains, will be his continued responsibility even after the Church has been purged, for he is the Church's custodian as well as its protector.
The hereditary succession by which civil lordship passes from father to son is a problem for Wyclif. People cannot inherit the grace needed to ensure just ownership and jurisdiction. Primogeniture imperils grace-founded civil lordship, making lords prone to rule on behalf of their own familial interests rather than in the interests of their subjects. The only means by which Wyclif can envision hereditary succession operating is through spiritual filiation, in which a civil lord instructs a worthy successor. He suggests adoption as the basis for the spiritual primogeniture by which lordship is passed on, which would be preferable to general election, for Wyclif is clear about the impossibility of widespread recognition of grace in a potential civil lord: “It does not follow, if all the people want Peter to be their civil lord, that therefore it is just” (De Civili Dominio I, 18, p. 130.6). Central to his ecclesiology is the impossibility of determining the presence of grace in another's soul, which militates against identifying members of the elect with certainty, and therefore against excommunicating any of them from the Church, as well as ruling out popular election as a means of instituting just civil dominium. Grants in perpetuity, commonly employed by civil lords to guarantee the ongoing obligation of subjects in return for a gift of land or political authority, are as impossible as hereditary inheritance. A lord might reward someone with a grant while acting as God's steward, but he certainly cannot thereby make his subject's progeny deserve the gift.
History is rich with examples of kings who, wittingly or unwittingly, lose sight of their ministerial position and wield secular authority in their own interests, cruelly using the land and church for their own gain. Such tyrants cause Wyclif some problems, for in many cases it is difficult for the subjects to determine whether their lord is acting viciously as a crowned brigand, or sternly, as a physician purging a patient. For the same reason that Wyclif denies the suitability of popular elections, he is cautious regarding tyranny: it is impossible for human minds to gauge the absence of grace in another. What may look like cruel persecution of a subject may in fact be just punishment, while what may appear to be benign, permissive rule may in fact be the lassitude of misrule. Certainly no priest is in a position to assess the justice of a civil lord, given his dedication to apostolic ideals foreign to civil dominium. In some cases, Wyclif advises that one must suffer tyrannical rule as a divine punishment, particularly when a king deprives His subjects of material wealth. In other cases, especially when a civil lord fosters ecclesiastical decay by not persecuting heretics or regulating the Church's goods, Wyclif suggests that resistance to tyranny may be justifiable: better to focus on the greater danger of priestly tyranny; after all, a tyrannical civil lord can only do damage to one's material well-being, but a tyrannical priest can endanger one's eternal soul. The guardian against priestly tyranny must be the civil lord, whose responsibility to the Church requires him to monitor the clergy's execution of its spiritual duties. Those who argue that a civil lord has no business interfering with spiritual concerns overlook the fundamental relation holding between just civil law and divine law: because the civil lord's responsibility is to God, his first concern must be to ensure that nothing will impede obedience to divine law. The canon law that has built up over the centuries like barnacles on a ship's hull is held up as the means by which the Church regulates spiritual affairs, but this, Wyclif explains, is a superfluous creation of priests, ultimately hindering the Church by introducing material structure to what should be a purely spiritual enterprise.
The king uses bishops, an office justly instituted by the early church, to monitor the spiritual offices of priests to counteract problems like simony, pluralism, absenteeism, and heresy. These bishops ought also to act as royal theological advisors, helping the civil lord to understand how Christ's law is best implemented in his own legislation. Just as a civil lord is God's steward and a servant to his subjects, a bishop is not superior to the laity or the priests, but a steward whose responsibility is to God and the divine law, which ordains subservience to the grace-favored civil lord. Wyclif continued to argue for the centrality of episcopal office throughout his life, despite his own troubles with the Bishop of London and the Archbishop of Canterbury.
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Other Internet Resources
- John Wyclif, De Civili Dominio, Chs. 1–10: Collation, edited by R.J. Kilcullen, Macquarie University.